Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Speech Acts

1. In his The A Priori Foundations of the Civil Law (1913), the Austrian jurist Adolf Reinach developed what he termed a theory of “social acts” prefiguring many of the themes of later Anglo-American work on speech acts. For an appraisal see Mulligan 1987. See also K. Schuhmann and B. Smith 1991 for a discussion of some elements of speech act theory in the thought of Thomas Reid. Smith 1990 offers a more general historical survey.

2. See Gorman 1999, however, for a detailed account of how literary theory has appropriated a distorted view of speech acts.

3. Bertolet (1994, p. 339) misses this point, which is dramatized in Hajdin 1991.

4. See the essays collected in Warnock 1973 for speculation about Austin's research plans that were tragically cut short by his early death.

5. See Humberstone 1992 for a fuller discussion of the notion of direction of fit.

6. I take it that the “certain condition” Searle refers to in the passage quoted can be specified without his claim becoming trivial.

7. This view is advocated by McDowell 1980, who disavows any aim of providing a reductive analysis.

8. This terminology is misleading because according to philosophers' usage, an act can be one of speaker meaning with no sounds uttered or even any inscriptions made. For instance two hunters with no common language might communicate with pantomime, so that when one acts out the path of attack he means, in the sense of speaker meaning, that the other is to approach the mammoth from behind. In spite of the misleading nature of the jargon of speaker meaning I shall retain it rather than introduce new nomenclature.

9. It may be that in the case imagined I am talking to myself, only making as if to talk to my daughter. This does not, however, support the contention that I am aiming to produce beliefs, or any other cognitive change, in her, myself, or anyone else. We observe here also that Armstrong 1971 quite reasonably offers an account of speaker meaning in terms of objectives rather than intentions, his reason being that the latter notion is narrower than the former. One who intends a certain result must believe that the thing aimed at is within her power, while one who has that result as an objective need not do so. Presently we shall show an affinity between Armstrong's position and that offered below. However, just replacing ‘intention’ with ‘objective’ in Grice's account will not deal with the cases we have considered. It is not part of my objective to produce an effect in my newborn daughter in uttering the last line of Spinoza's Ethics. Similarly it need be no part of the objective of the framed suspect in maintaining her innocence to produce effects on her interrogators. Instead she may say what she does in order to make public, for anyone who may be concerned with the matter, her avowal of innocence. Her objective is simply to establish a pattern of consistently maintained innocence.

10. Following a suggestion of Schiffer (1972, p. 15), Strawson (1970, p. 7), and Bennett (1976, p. 271), Avramides 1989 proposes in response to these kinds of case that the speaker is addressing himself, intending in particular to produce a certain cognitive effect in himself. While it may be that in the newborn daughter and Sleeper cases the speaker is addressing himself, it neither follows, nor does it seem true, that in those cases the speaker is intending to produce any cognitive effect in himself. Certainly we sometimes address ourselves in order to produce a cognitive effect: ‘I can do it!’ as I sprint up the steep road, or ‘945-6743, 945-6743’ as I try to internalize a phone number I just got out of the phone book. However, I already believe that all things valuable are difficult as they are rare. In fact it is a belief I have held firmly since encountering it in Spinoza two decades ago, and I actively believe it as I reflect upon the number of diapers I will have changed by the time I am forty. As a result it is quite unclear what cognitive effect I might be trying to produce in myself in saying what I do. Again, Miles Monroe does not need to produce in himself, or strengthen or activate, the belief that the chicken before him is big. His own eyes have already done that for him. Likewise it is far from clear what belief the framed suspect might be trying to produce or strengthen or activate in herself as she maintains her innocence. The suspect knows perfectly well that she has never set foot in the part of town in which the crime was committed, and that she has no idea how to use the garotte with which the victim was killed. (Avramides' discussion here is confusing because she first responds to a case, due to Harman, of a person maintaining a proposition in full knowledge that no one will believe him, with the words, ‘I think that in Harman's case the speaker is not really speaking to an audience at all’ (p. 64). But then two pages later Avramides writes, ‘The misleading thing about Harman's case is that there appears to be an audience present. The speaker, however, does not really address his utterance to those present….If this is true, why not say that in such cases the speaker intends his audience to be himself…’ (p. 66). I shall take Avramides to hold the view that in these cases the speaker does have an audience, namely himself.)

11. See the essays collected in Parrett and J. Verschueren 1992.

12. From Green 2000. An argument is illocutionarily sound just in case it is both illocutionarily valid and all its premises are such that their conditions of satisfaction are met. A fuller account of illocutionary validity would employ further distinctions. For example, two assertoric commitments may be alike save for differing in strength; these differences are usually described as differences in personal probability, and we could if we wished distinguish among differences in the strength of commitment. Again, we could distinguish among the different possible objects of commitment, since there is nothing to rule out being committed to a question or to an imperative. These distinctions within the dimension of mode, strength and object of commitment are taken into account in Green 2000. See also Harrah (1980, 1994) for a discussion of assertoric, erotetic, and projective commitment.

Observe also that the truth-preservation notion of validity may be seen as a special case of the commitment-preservation notion as follows: Treat each of the sentences in the argument counting as valid in the former sense as being put forth in assertoric mode, and treat each such sentence as declarative. Illocutionary validity is thus not a rival to the truth-preservation notion, but is instead a generalization thereof.