Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Sociobiology

1. Inclusive fitness is an expansion of Darwinian fitness, in which altruism to kin evolves when Hamilton’s (simplified) formula, rb > c, is satisfied (Hamilton, 1964). In that formula, the benefit of the behavior to the genetically related individual (b) is greater than the cost to the altruist (c), discounted by the coefficient of genetic relatedness (r). Inclusive fitness, to simplify the mathematics, consists in the reproductive output of the individual (the ‘personal component’ of inclusive fitness) plus the reproductive output of her kin weighted according to their genetic relatedness to her (the ‘kin component’ of inclusive fitness). When a behavior only affects personal reproductive output, we can neglect these calculations, and inclusive fitness reduces to Darwinian fitness. To maximize her inclusive fitness, an individual would favor one relative over another according to the degree of genetic relatedness to her, when costs and benefits are equal.