Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Social Minimum

1. Doyal and Gough argue that human beings have ‘basic needs’ for physical health and ‘autonomy’, which they define as ‘the ability to make informed choices about what should be done and how to go about doing it’ (Doyal and Gough, 1991, p. 53). From these two basic needs, they then derive a range of ‘intermediate needs’ for various goods that seem essential to the satisfaction of the basic needs. However, the notion of autonomy is employed in two senses in their analysis. The first type of autonomy consists in the ability of the individual to draw on her culture to formulate and choose personal goals and then to pursue these goals in a rational way. The second type, which Doyal and Gough term ‘critical autonomy’, involves an ability to critique and move beyond the culture that the individual inherits (see Doyal and Gough, 1991, pp. 67-69, 187-190). The latter notion of autonomy is much stronger than the first, and is certainly not endorsed, even implicitly, in all societal cultures or by proponents of all ethical doctrines. For many traditionalist religious communities, for example, critical autonomy will look like a threat to the good life, not a basic human need. For an argument that the Doyal-Gough account of basic needs (nevertheless) offers a more ecumenical approach to the specification of social minima than Nussbaum's approach, see Gough (2003).

2. Not all libertarians would agree with this. Sterba (1998) provides a helpful overview. Note that within Nozick's framework, one might also conceivably defend the establishment of a social minimum policy regime as an imperfect, second-best form of ‘rectification’ for historical injustices. Nozick recognizes that the actual distribution of private property in contemporary capitalist societies reflects terrible historical rights violations such as slavery, theft of land, and so on. It can be argued that the victims of such historical rights violations are entitled to some kind of compensation for these violations and/or their knock-on effects. However, where the historical injustices are long in the past, and the pattern of resulting harm and unjust advantage is now hard to discern, it can be hard to tailor rectification in a precise fashion. Rather than making no effort at rectification at all, one might possibly argue that a society that has experienced these injustices should enact a social minimum, at least as a temporary measure, so as to ensure that nobody is very badly off as a result of past rights violations. See Nozick, 1974, pp. 152-153, 230-231.

3. If a strictly equal division of the relevant resources or their value is unfeasible, some philosophers sympathetic to left-libertarianism propose a ‘maximin’ division, one that maximizes the amount of the relevant assets/asset value held by those with the lowest share of these assets/asset values. See in particular Van Parijs (1995).

4. Bruce Ackerman and Anne Alstott, 1999, present the case for capital grant of this kind, though they do not propose that it should entirely replace conventional welfare programs. Van Parijs defends, on paternalistic grounds, a periodic income grant over a capital grant (see Van Parijs, 1995, chapter 2).

5. Strictly speaking, the difference principle applies to an index of ‘social primary goods’ that includes not only income and wealth but the ‘social bases of self-respect’ and leisure-time. See Rawls, 1999, pp. 478-479, 2001, pp. 60, 179.

6. Recall the claim I ventured in section 1.1 to the effect that our judgments about what kinds of things count as disabilities might be shaped by background intuitions we have about the importance of specific functionings and capabilities. In the context of Dworkin's hypothetical insurance market thought-experiment, these background intuitions might well be guiding our judgment as to which characteristics the average person would choose to insure him/herself against (and hence our view about which characteristics count as a kind of resource-deficit). However, as I explain in section 3.3, Dworkin's thought-experiment might also help us to get a handle on the limit-setting problem briefly noted in section 1.1, and in this respect can be seen as adding something significant to the development of our conception of the social minimum.

7. This argument can also be made within the framework of Rawls's theory of justice as briefly outlined in section 2.4.1 above. Rawls's first principle of justice requires that citizens enjoy a scheme of adequate basic liberties, which liberties include the political liberties of competing for elected office and exercising the vote. Rawls argues that justice not only requires that citizens enjoy these liberties but that the political liberties have what he terms ‘fair value’. Following the reasoning set out above in the main text, it can be argued that maintaining the fair value of the political liberties requires the enactment of a social minimum (though Rawls himself regards such an argument as superfluous in view of the fact that, in his view, the enactment of a social minimum is independently implied by the difference principle). See Rawls, 1993, pp. 327-329, 1999, pp. 198-199.

8. The distinction between negative and positive conceptions of liberty is usually attributed to Isaiah Berlin's essay ‘Two Concepts of Liberty’ (Berlin, 1958). However, the language of positive liberty long predates this essay, going back at least as far as T.H. Green's influential essay, ‘Liberal Legislation and Freedom of Contract’ delivered as a lecture in 1881 (see Miller, 1991, pp. 21-32). Moreover, the distinction that Berlin makes in his essay is not the same as the distinction made in the main text above. Berlin's conception of ‘positive liberty’ is closely related to an Idealist conception of freedom as rational self-mastery, a conception that is not necessarily implied by the way I have used the term ‘positive liberty’ above.

9. One needs to keep separate the question of whether a welfare program has a behavioral effect from that of whether any such effect, if it occurs, is morally undesirable. That a given behavioral effect, such as a reduction in work effort, is undesirable requires further argument.

10. It may be a concern of this kind that has lead some philosophers sympathetic to left-libertarianism to explore ways in which we might extend the scope of the left-libertarian argument beyond what we conventionally think of as inherited resources to cover other kinds of assets. Philippe Van Parijs, for example, argues that citizens of a society have a right to an equal (or maximin) share of their society's ‘job assets’ exactly like the right that Roger and his fellow islanders have to their island's inherited stock of machines. He argues that we can impute a monetary value to job assets (given by the employment rents attached to jobs) and that we should add the implied sum to the fund from which we pay an unconditional stipend. If we do this, then, in the circumstances of many advanced capitalist countries today, the unconditional stipend could well be sufficient to cover most basic needs, perhaps even more than sufficient (see Van Parijs, 1995, chapter 4). Whether the traditional left-libertarian argument can be extended convincingly in this way is, however, a matter of controversy. For discussion of Van Parijs's argument, see Reeve and Williams (2003).

11. Van Donselaar argues that the left-libertarian insistence on a strict equal division of assets such as land allows some people to extract morally objectionable ‘parasitic’ rents from others. He asks us to imagine a situation with two people, Crazy and Lazy, whom we assume to have equal talents, and four units of homogeneous land. Lazy's preferences are such that, were he by himself, he would choose to occupy and work only one unit of the available land. Crazy's preferences are such that, were he by himself, he would choose to occupy and work three units of the available land. The left-libertarian, as a proponent of strict equal division, will insist on each having two units of land, and on leaving Crazy and Lazy free to trade their respective entitlements. Given their underlying preferences, Lazy will likely sell Crazy access to one unit of his land in return for a share of what Crazy produces on this land. Lazy will then be better off, and Crazy worse off, than they would respectively be in the absence of the other. According to Van Donselaar, the fair division of land would track each individual's ‘independent interest’ in the land, so that Lazy would get one unit and Crazy would get three units. The insistence on equal division, regardless of the pattern of independent interests, can create an artificial scarcity of land, which people with weak independent interests like Lazy can take advantage of to enjoy ‘the benefit of another's pains’. See Van Donselaar, 1997, pp. 104-165.

12. What if a significant section of society stands outside of a broad consensus supporting a Nussbaum-style list of central capabilities? In such a case we might face a conflict between justice and legitimacy. Justice might require that we enact a social minimum in line with the reasonable conception of human capabilities provided by the list, but the just policy will lack legitimacy for some of the citizens who are bound by the policy of enactment. How such conflicts are most appropriately resolved is a very important question, but one that I do not have space to consider here.

13. Means-testing refers to the policy of making eligibility for a welfare benefit depend on how much income and/or wealth the individual or household has; eligibility is restricted to those at or below a specified threshold of income and/or wealth, and the benefit is withdrawn as income and/or wealth increase. The main argument for means-testing is that it targets scarce public funds directly to those most in need. Worries about means-testing include the following: that it creates disincentives for individuals to increase their income/wealth through their own efforts (why bother if the government will cut the benefits it pays you by a near-equivalent amount?); that it stigmatizes the poor as recipients of special assistance, something that is bad in itself and that might lead to low take-up of the benefits so that the poor actually do not receive them; and that by limiting participation in welfare to the poor it renders welfare programs politically vulnerable to cost-cutting. For all these reasons, critics argue that means-testing might not be in the long-term interests of the most needy. For a helpful discussion, critical of means-tested welfare states, see Rothstein (1998).

14. A benefit is provided ‘in-kind’ when the government provides the individual directly with a good or service that he or she needs, or gives the individual a voucher that can be used only to purchase a specified good or service. In-kind benefits are criticized on the grounds that people will typically derive more immediate, subjective welfare if they are given a cash sum equal to the cost of the in-kind benefit and allowed to spend this sum as they like. Supporters of in-kind provision reply that in-kind provision better protects the interests of dependents, such as children; and that in some cases cash provision misses the moral point of the transfer, which is not to generate subjective welfare, but to secure a specific capability. For general discussion, see Thurow (1976); and on the latter point, see also Miller, 2000, pp. 211-212.

15. Important and helpful contributions here include Singer (1973), Shue (1980), and Pogge (2002). Singer argues on utilitarian grounds that we have a responsibility to assist famine victims in other countries. Shue argues that universal ‘basic rights’ include a right to subsistence and that citizens of one country have a responsibility to act to secure this right for citizens of another country provided that their own ‘vital interests’ are not jeopardized. Pogge challenges the tendency, exemplified in the arguments of Singer and Shue, and in the wider public discourse, to frame the issue in terms of a duty that people in affluent societies have to ‘assist’ the citizens of other countries. Pogge argues that we have a negative duty not to impose unjust terms of international economic cooperation on other countries. If, through the agency of our governments, we do not meet this duty, then we have a duty to compensate people of the unfairly disadvantaged countries (see Pogge, 2002, pp. 196-204). Applying Pogge's argument to the concern of this paper, we arguably have a duty not to harm the citizens of other countries by imposing ground-rules for international economic cooperation that prevent them from enacting a social minimum. To the extent that the ground-rules imposed through our governments do prevent the citizens of other countries from doing this, then we have a duty to compensate for the harm for which we are responsible.