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Units and Levels of Selection

First published Mon Aug 22, 2005; substantive revision Fri Mar 2, 2012

The theory of evolution by natural selection is, perhaps, the crowning intellectual achievement of the biological sciences. There is, however, considerable debate about which entity or entities are selected and what it is that fits them for that role. This article aims to clarify what is at issue in these debates by identifying four distinct, though often confused, concerns and then identifying how the debates on what constitute the units of selection depend to a significant degree on which of these four questions a thinker regards as central.

1. Introduction

When we think of evolutionary theory and natural selection, we usually think of organisms, say, a herd of deer, in which some deer are faster than others at escaping their predators. These swifter deer will, all things being equal, leave more offspring, and these offspring will have a tendency to be swifter than other deer. Thus, we get a change in the average swiftness of deer over evolutionary time. In a case like this, the unit of selection, sometimes called the “target” of selection, is the single organism, the individual deer, and the property being selected, swiftness, also lies at the organismic level, in that it is exhibited by the intact and whole deer, and not by either parts of deer, such as cells, or groups of deer, such as herds. But there are other levels of biological organization that have been proposed to be units or targets of selection — levels at which selection may act to increase a given property at that level, and at which units increase or decrease as a result of selection at that specific level of biological organization.

But for over thirty years, some participants in the “units of selection” debates have argued that more than one issue is at stake. Richard Dawkins, for example, introduced “replicator” and “vehicle” to stand for different roles in the evolutionary process (1978; 1982a,b). In this case, the individual deer would be called, by Dawkins, the “vehicles” and their genes that make them tend to be swifter would be called the “replicators.” He proceeded to argue that the units of selection debates should not be about vehicles, as it formerly had been, but about replicators. David Hull, in his influential article, “Individuality and selection” (1980) suggested that Dawkins' “replicator” subsumes two distinct functional roles, and broke them up into “replicator” and “interactor.” Hull would, of course, call the individual deer the “interactors.” Robert Brandon, arguing that the force of Hull's distinction had been underappreciated, analyzed the units of selection controversies further, claiming that the question about interactors should more accurately be called the “levels of selection” debate to distinguish it from the dispute about replicators, which he allowed to keep the “units of selection debate” title (1982).[1]

The purpose of this article is to delineate further the various questions pursued under the rubric of “units and levels of selection.” These are questions addressed by a number of researchers, including Robert Brandon, Richard Dawkins, Marcus Feldman, Peter Godfrey-Smith, James Griesemer, David Hull, Ben Kerr, Philip Kitcher, Richard Lewontin, Sandra Mitchell, Samir Okasha, Alex Rosenberg, John Maynard Smith, Elliott Sober, Kim Sterelny, Michael Wade, Ken Waters, George C. Williams, David S. Wilson, William Wimsatt, Sewall Wright, and many others. Four quite distinct questions will be isolated that have, in fact, been asked in the context of considering, what is a unit of selection? In section 2, these distinct questions are described. Section 3 returns to the sites of several very confusing, occasionally heated debates about “the” unit of selection. Several leading positions on the issues are analyzed utilizing the taxonomy of distinct questions.

This analysis is not meant to resolve any of the conflicts about which research questions are most worth pursuing; moreover, there is no attempt to decide which of the questions or combinations of questions discussed ought to be considered “the” units of selection question.

2. Four Basic Questions

Four basic questions can be delineated as distinct and separable. As will be demonstrated in section 3, these questions are often used in combination to represent the units of selection problem. But let us begin by clarifying terms (see Lloyd 1992, 2001). (See the entry on the biological notion of individual for more on this topic.)

The term replicator, originally introduced by Dawkins but since modified by Hull, is used to refer to any entity of which copies are made. Dawkins classifies replicators using two orthogonal distinctions. A “germ-line” replicator, as distinct from a “dead-end” replicator, is “the potential ancestor of an indefinitely long line of descendant replicators” (1982a, p. 46). For instance, DNA in a chicken's egg is a germ-line replicator, whereas that in a chicken's wing is a dead-end replicator. Note that DNA are, but chickens are not, replicators, since the latter do not replicate themselves as wholes. An “active” replicator is “a replicator that has some causal influence on its own probability of being propagated,” whereas a “passive” replicator is never transcribed and has no phenotypic expression whatsoever (1982a, p. 47). Dawkins is especially interested in active germ-line replicators, “since adaptations ‘for’ their preservation are expected to fill the world and to characterize living organisms” (1982a, p. 47).

Dawkins also introduced the term “vehicle”, which he defines as “any relatively discrete entity…which houses replicators, and which can be regarded as a machine programmed to preserve and propagate the replicators that ride inside it” (1982b, p. 295). According to Dawkins, most replicators' phenotypic effects are represented in vehicles, which are themselves the proximate targets of natural selection (1982a, p. 62).

Hull, in his introduction of the term “interactor”, observes that Dawkins' theory has replicators interacting with their environments in two distinct ways: they produce copies of themselves, and they influence their own survival and the survival of their copies through the production of secondary products that ultimately have phenotypic expression. Hull suggests the term “interactor” for the entities that function in this second process. An interactor denotes that entity which interacts, as a cohesive whole, directly with its environment in such a way that replication is differential—in other words, an entity on which selection acts directly (Hull 1980, p. 318). The process of evolution by natural selection is “a process in which the differential extinction and proliferation of interactors cause the differential perpetuation of the replicators that produced them” (Hull 1980, p. 318; see Brandon 1982, pp. 317–318) Ernst Mayr argued against using Hull's term, “interactor,” because, he claimed, “interacting is not conspicuous during the process of elimination that results in natural selection” (1997, p. 2093). It's difficult to imagine why Mayr would say this, given Hull's description of the interactor as “an entity that directly interacts … in such a way that replication is differential. Perhaps more interestingly, Mayr rejects the “target of selection” language because he sees selection as more of an elimination process; thus, he saw it as misleading to call the “leftovers” of the elimination process the “targets” of selection. Mayr proposes the term “selecton”, which he defines as “a discrete entity and a cohesive whole, an individual or a social group, the survival and successful reproduction of which is favored by selection owing to its possession of certain properties” (1997, p. 2093). This seems remarkably similar to an interactor, with the difference that no differential reproduction, and thus no evolution, is mentioned.

Hull also introduced the concept of “evolvers,” which are the entities that evolve as a result of selection on interactors: these are usually what Hull calls lineages (Hull 1980). So far, no one has directly claimed that evolvers are units of selection. They can be seen, however, to be playing a role in considering the question of who owns an adaptation and who benefits from evolution by selection, which we will consider in Sections 2.3 and 2.4.

2.1 The Interactor Question

In its traditional guise, the interactor question is, what units are being actively selected in a process of natural selection? As such, this question is involved in the oldest forms of the units of selection debates (Darwin 1859 (1964), Haldane 1932, Wright 1945). In his classic review article, Lewontin's purpose was “to contrast the levels of selection, especially as regards their efficiency as causers of evolutionary change” (1970, p. 7). Similarly, Slobodkin and Rapaport assumed that a unit of selection is something that “responds to selective forces as a unit—whether or not this corresponds to a spatially localized deme, family, or population” (1974, p. 184).

Questions about interactors focus on the description of the selection process itself, that is, on the interaction between an entity, that entity's traits and environment, and on how this interaction produces evolution; they do not focus on the outcome of this process (see Wade 1977; Vrba and Gould 1986). The interaction between some interactor at a certain level and its environment is assumed to be mediated by “traits” that affect the interactor's expected survival and reproductive success. Here, the interactor is possibly at any level of biological organization, including a group, a kin-group, an organism, a gamete, a chromosome, or a gene. Some portion of the expected fitness of the interactor is directly correlated with the value of the trait in question. The expected fitness of the interactor is commonly expressed in terms of genotypic fitness parameters, that is, in terms of the fitness of combinations of replicators; hence, interactor success is most often reflected in and counted through, replicator success. Several methods are available for expressing such a correlation between interactor trait and (genotypic or genic) fitness, including partial regression, variances, and covariances[2].

In fact, much of the interactor debate has been played out through the construction of mathematical genetic models—with the exception of Wade and some of Wilson and Colwell's work on female-biased sex ratios (see especially Griesemer and Wade 1988). The point of building such models is to determine what kinds of selection, operating at which levels, may be effective in producing evolutionary change.

It has been widely held, for instance, that the conditions under which group selection can effect evolutionary change are quite stringent and rare. Typically, group selection was seen to require small group size, low migration rate, and extinction of entire demes.[3] Some modelers, however, disagree that these stringent conditions are necessary. Matesi and Jayakar, for example, show that in the evolution of altruism by group selection, very small groups may not be necessary (1976, p. 384; contra Maynard Smith 1964). Wade and McCauley also argue that small effective deme size is not a necessary prerequisite to the operation of group selection (1980, p. 811). Similarly, Boorman shows that strong extinction pressure on demes is not necessary (1978, p. 1909). And finally, Uyenoyama develops a group selection model that violates all three of the “necessary” condition usually cited (1979).

That different researchers reach such disparate conclusions about the efficacy of group selection is partly because they are using different models with different parameter values. Wade highlighted several assumptions, routinely used in group selection models, that biased the results of these models against the efficacy of group selection (1978). For example, he noted that many group selection models use a specific mechanism of migration; it is assumed that the migrating individuals mix completely, forming a “migrant pool” from which migrants are assigned to populations randomly. All populations are assumed to contribute migrants to a common pool from which colonists are drawn at random. Under this approach, which is used in all models of group selection prior to 1978, small sample size is needed to get a large genetic variance between populations (Wade 1978, p. 110; see discusssion in Okasha 2003; 2006).

If, in contrast, migration occurs by means of large populations, higher heritability of traits and a more representative sampling of the parent population will result. Each propagate is made up of individuals derived from a single population, and there is no mixing of colonists from the different populations during propagule formation. On the basis of Slatkin and Wade's analysis, much more between-population genetic variance can be maintained with the propagule model (1978, p. 3531). They conclude that, by using propagule pools as the assumption about colonization, one can greatly expand the set of parameter values for which group selection can be effective (Slatkin and Wade 1978, cf. Craig 1982).

Another aspect of this debate that has received a great deal of consideration concerns the mathematical tools necessary for identifying when a particular level of biological organization meets the criteria for being an interactor. Examples of suggested techniques within the philosophical community include Brandon's use of Salmon's notion of screening off (1982; 1990), Lloyd on contextual analysis, and the work by Wimsatt and Lloyd on the additivity approach (Wimsatt 1980, 1981; Lloyd [1988] 1994; see Sarkar 1994 and Godfrey-Smith 1992 for criticisms of this last approach, and Wade and Griesemer 1998 and Okasha 2004a and 2006 for a partial defense of it). Biologists have also suggested a variety of statistical techniques for addressing this issue. See, for example, the work of Arnold and Fristrup, Heisler and Damuth, David Sloan Wilson, and Wade (Arnold and Fristrup 1982, Heisler and Damuth 1987, Damuth and Heisler 1988, Wilson and Colwell 1981, and Wade 1985 respectively). Overall, while many of the suggested techniques have had strengths, no one approach to this aspect of the interactor question has been generally accepted and indeed it remains the subject of debate in biological circles (Okasha 2004b,c). Recent detailed work on two of the major techniques, the Price equation and contextual analysis, has indicated that neither approach is universally applicable, on the grounds that neither provides a proper causal decomposition in all varieties of selection (Okasha 2006). Specifically, it appears that while contextual analysis may be superior in most cases of multi-level selection, the Price equation may be more useful in certain cases of genic selection (Okasha 2006).

It is important to note that, even in the midst of deciding among the various methods for representing selection processes, these choices have consequences for the empirical adequacy of the selection models. This is true even if the models are denied to have a causal interpretation, as is done by those promoting a “statisticalist” interpretation of selection theory, such as Denis Walsh et al. (2002). They claim that they have dissolved the “deeply uninteresting“ units of selection problem, whereas in fact, they have simply restricted it to the interactor question (while ignoring the other three “units” questions entirely), and do not address directly the problem of how to deliver an empirically adequate selection model (2002, p. 470–471). Instead, they help themselves to an unspecified method that “identifies classes [that] … adequately predict and explain changes in the structure of the population“ (2002, p. 471), with no acknowledgment that this involves making a commitment to one or another of the above methods of determining an interactor, whether under a causal interpretation or not. Thus, these statisticalists cannot escape the interactor problem whether or not they interpret it causally.

Note that the “interactor question” does not involve attributing adaptations or benefits to the interactors, or indeed, to any candidate unit of selection. Interaction at a particular level involves only the presence of a trait at that level with a special relation to genic or genotypic expected success that is not reducible to interactions at a lower level. A claim about interaction indicates only that there is an evolutionarily significant event occurring at the level in question; it says nothing about the existence of adaptations at that level. As we shall see, the most common error made in interpreting many of the interactor-based approaches is that the presence of an interactor at a level is taken to imply that the interactor is also a manifestor of an adaptation at that level.

2.2 The Replicator Question

The focus of discussions about replicators concerns just which organic entities actually meet the definition of replicator. Answering this question obviously turns on what one takes the definition of replicator to be. In this connection Hull's contribution turned out to be central. Starting from Dawkins' view, Hull refined and restricted the meaning of “replicator,” which he defined as “an entity that passes on its structure directly in replication” (Hull 1980, p.318). The terms replicator and interactor will be used in Hull's sense in the rest of this entry.

Hull's definition of replicator corresponds more closely than Dawkins' to a long-standing debate in genetics about how large or small a fragment of a genome ought to count as a replicating unit—something that is copied, and which can be treated separately in evolutionary theory (see especially Lewontin 1970). This debate revolves critically around the issue of linkage disequilibrium and led Lewontin, most prominently, to advocate the usage of parameters referring to the entire genome rather than to allele and genotypic frequencies in genetical models.[4] The basic point is that with much linkage disequilibrium, individual genes cannot be considered as replicators because they do not behave as separate units during reproduction. Although this debate remains pertinent to the choice of state space of genetical model, it has been eclipsed by concerns about interactors in evolutionary genetics.

This is not to suggest that the replicator question has been solved. Work on the replicator question is part of a rich and continuing research program; it is simply no longer a large part of the units debates. That this parting of ways took place is largely due to the fact that evolutionists working on the units problems tacitly adopted Dawkins' suggestion that the replicator, whatever it turned out to be, be called the ‘gene’ (see Section 3.3). This move neatly removes the replicator question from consideration. Exactly why this move should have met with near universal acceptance is to some extent historical, however the fact that the intellectual tools (largely mathematical models) of the participants in the units debates were better suited to dealing with aspects of that debate other than the replicator question which requires mainly bio-chemical investigation, surely contributed to this outcome.

There is a very important class of exceptions to this general abandonment of the replicator question. Susan Oyama, Paul Griffiths, and Russell Gray have been leading thinkers in formulating a radical alternative to the interactor/replicator dichotomy known as Developmental Systems Theory (Oyama 1985; Griffiths and Gray 1994, 1997; Oyama, Griffiths, and Gray 2001). Here the evolving unit is understood to be the developing system as a whole, privileging neither the replicator nor the interactor.

James Griesemer has originated a profound reconception of the evolution by selection process, and has rejected the role of replicator as misconceived. He proposes in its place the role of “reproducer,” which focuses on the material transference of genetic and other matter from generation to generation (Griesemer 2000a,b). For Griesemer, thinking in terms of reproducers incorporates development into heredity and the evolutionary process. It also allows for both epigenetic and genetic inheritance to be dealt with within the same framework. The reproducer plays a central role, along with a hierarchy of interactors, in his work on the units of evolutionary transition (see section 3.5; Griesemer 2000c). This topic concerns the major transitions of life from one level of complexity to the next, for example, the transition from unicellularity to multicellularity. Peter Godfrey-Smith has also since introduced a notion of a reproducer that is more broadly inclusive, in that it relaxes the material overlap requirement and focuses on an understanding of “who came from whom, and roughly where one begins and another ends.” (2009, p. 86)

2.3 The Beneficiary Question

Who benefits from a process of evolution by selection? There are two predominant interpretations of this question: Who benefits ultimately in the long term, from the evolution by selection process? And who gets the benefit of possessing adaptations as a result of a selection process? Take the first of these, the issue of the ultimate beneficiary.

There are two obvious answers to this question—two different ways of characterizing the long-term survivors and beneficiaries of the evolution by selection process. One might say that the species or lineages (Hull's evolvers) are the ultimate beneficiaries of the evolutionary process. Alternatively, one might say that the lineages characterized on the genic level, that is, the surviving alleles, are the relevant long-term beneficiaries. I have not located any authors holding the first view, but, for Dawkins, the latter interpretation is the primary fact about evolution. To arrive at this conclusion, Dawkins adds the requirement of agency to the notion of beneficiary (see Hampe and Morgan 1988). For Dawkins, a beneficiary, by definition, does not simply passively accrue credit in the long term; it must function as the initiator of a causal pathway. Under this definition, the replicator is causally responsible for all of the various effects that arise further down the biochemical or phenotypic pathway, irrespective of which entities might reap the long-term rewards.

A second and quite distinct version of the beneficiary question involves the notion of adaptation. The evolution by selection process may be said to “benefit” a particular level of entity under selection, through producing adaptations at that level (Williams 1966, Maynard Smith 1976, Eldredge 1985, Vrba 1984). On this approach, the level of entity actively selected (the interactor) benefits from evolution by selection at that level through its acquisition of adaptations.

It is crucial to distinguish the question concerning the level at which adaptations evolve from the question about the identity of the ultimate beneficiaries of that selection process. One can think—and Dawkins does—that organisms have adaptations without thinking that organisms are the “ultimate beneficiaries” of the selection process.[5] This sense of “beneficiary” that concerns adaptations will be treated as a separate issue, discussed in the next section.

2.4 The Manifestor of Adaptation Question

At what level do adaptations occur? Or, as Sober puts this question, “When a population evolves by natural selection, what, if anything, is the entity that does the adapting?” (1984, p. 204).

As mentioned previously, the presence of adaptations at a given level of entity is sometimes taken to be a requirement for something to be a unit of selection.[6] Wright, in an absolutely crucial observation, distinguished group selection for “group advantage” from group selection per se (1980); in other words, he claimed that the combination of the interactor question with the question of what entity had adaptations had created a great deal of confusion in the units of selection debates in general.

Some, if not most, of this confusion is a result of a very important but neglected duality in the meaning of “adaptation” (in spite of useful discussions in Brandon 1978, Burian 1983, Krimbas 1984, Sober 1984). Sometimes “adaptation” is taken to signify any trait at all that is a direct result of a selection process at that level. In this view, any trait that arises directly from a selection process is claimed to be, by definition, an adaptation (e.g. Sober 1984; Brandon 1985, 1990; Arnold and Fristrup 1982). Sometimes, on the other hand, the term “adaptation” is reserved for traits that are “good for” their owners, that is, those that provide a “better fit” with the environment, and that intuitively satisfy some notion of “good engineering.”[7] These two meanings of adaptation, the selection-product and engineering definitions respectively, are distinct, and in some cases, incompatible.

Consider the peppered moth case: natural selection is acting on the color of the moths over time, and the population evolves, but no “engineering” adaptation emerges. Rather, the proportion of dark moths simply increases over time, relative to the industrial environmental conditions, a clear case of evolution by natural selection. The dark moths are a “selection-product” adaptation. Contrast the moth case to the case of Darwin's finches, in which different species evolved distinct beak shapes specially adapted to their diet of particular seeds and foods (Grant and Grant 1989; Grant 1999). Natural selection here occurred against constantly changing genetic and phenotypic backgrounds in which accumulated selection processes had changed the shapes of the beaks, thus producing “engineering” adaptations when natural selection occurred. The finches now possess evolved traits that especially “fit” them to their environmental demands; their newly shaped beaks are beyond the original range of variation in the ancestral population.

Williams, in his extremely influential book, Adaptation and Natural Selection, for example, advocated an engineering definition of adaptation (1966). He believed that it was possible to have evolutionary change result from direct selection favoring a trait without having to consider that changed trait as an adaptation. Consider, for example, his discussion of Waddington's (1956) genetic assimilation experiments. Williams interprets the results of Waddington's experiments in which latent genetic variability was made to express itself phenotypically because of an environmental pressure (1966, pp. 70–81; see the lucid discussion in Sober 1984, pp. 199–201). Williams considers the question of whether the bithorax condition (resulting from direct artificial selection on that trait) should be seen as an adaptive trait, and his answer is that it should not. Williams instead sees the bithorax condition as “a disruption…of development,” a failure of the organism to respond (1966, pp. 75–78). Hence, Williams drives a wedge between the notion of a trait that is a direct product of a selection process and a trait that fits his stronger engineering definition of an adaptation (see Gould and Lewontin 1979; Sober 1984, p. 201; cf. Dobzhansky 1956).[8]

In sum, when asking whether a given level of entity possesses adaptations, it is necessary to state not only the level of selection in question but also which notion of adaptation—either selection-product or engineering—is being used. This distinction between the two meanings of adaptation also turns out to be pivotal in the debates about the efficacy of higher levels of selection, as we will see in sections 3.1 and 3.2.

2.5 Summary

In this section, four distinct questions have been described that appear under the rubric of “the units of selection” problem, What is the interactor? What is the replicator? What is the beneficiary? And what entity manifests any adaptations resulting from evolution by selection? There is a serious ambiguity in the meaning of “adaptation”; which meaning is in play has had deep consequences for both the group selection debates and the species selection debates (Lloyd 2001). Commenting on this analysis, John Maynard Smith wrote in Evolution: “ [Lloyd 2001] argues, correctly I believe, that much of the confusion has arisen because the same terms have been used with different meanings by different authors … [but] I fear that the confusions she mentions will not easily be ended” (Maynard Smith 2001, p. 1497). In Section 3, this taxonomy of questions is used to sort out some of the most influential positions in four debates: group selection (3.1), species selection (3.2), genic selection (3.3), and genic pluralism (3.4).

3. An Anatomy of the Debates

3.1 Group Selection

George Williams' famous near-deathblow to group panselectionism was, oddly enough, about benefit. He was interested in cases in which there was selection among groups and the groups as a whole benefited from organism-level traits (including behaviors) that seemed disadvantageous to the organism. (Similarly for Maynard Smith 1964). Williams argued that the presence of a benefit to the group was not sufficient to establish the presence of group selection. He did this by showing that a group benefit was not necessarily a group adaptation. (Hence, Williams is here using the term benefit to signify the manifestation of an adaptation at the group level.) His assumption was that a genuine group selection process results in the evolution of a group-level trait—a real adaptation—that serves a design purpose for the group. The mere existence however, of traits that benefit the group is not enough to show that they are adaptations; in order to be an adaptation, under Williams' view, the trait must be an engineering adaptation that evolved by natural selection. Williams argued that group benefits do not, in general, exist because they benefit the group; that is, they do not have the appropriate causal history (see Brandon 1981, 1985, p. 81; Sober 1984, p. 262 ff.; Sober and Wilson 1998).

Implicit in Williams' discussion is the assumption that being a unit of selection at the group level requires two things: (1) having the group as an interactor, and (2) having a group-level engineering-type adaptation. That is, Williams combines two different questions, the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation question, and calls this combined set the unit of selection question. These requirements for “group selection” make perfect sense given that Williams' prime target was Vero Wynne-Edwards, who promoted a view of group selection that incorporated this same two-pronged definition of a unit of selection (see Borrello 2010 for a philosophically-oriented history of Wynne-Edwards and his views on group selection).

This combined requirement of engineering group-level adaptation in addition to the existence of an interactor at the group level is a very popular version of the necessary conditions for being a unit of selection within the group selection debates. David Hull claims that the group selection issue hinges on “whether entities more inclusive than organisms exhibit adaptations” (1980, p. 325). John Cassidy states that the unit of selection is determined by “Who or what is best understood as the possessor and beneficiary of the trait” (1978, p. 582). Similarly, Eldredge requires adaptations for an entity to count as a unit of selection, as does Vrba (Eldredge 1985, p. 108; Vrba 1983, 1984).

Maynard Smith (1976) also ties the engineering notion of adaptation into the version of the units of selection question he would like to consider. In an argument separating group and kin selection, Maynard Smith concludes that group selection is favored by small group size, low migration rates, and rapid extinction of groups infected with a selfish allele and that “the ultimate test of the group selection hypothesis will be whether populations having these characteristics tend to show ‘self-sacrificing’ or ‘prudent’ behavior more commonly than those which do not” (1976, p. 282). This means that the presence of group selection or the effectiveness of group selection is to be measured by the existence of nonadaptive behavior on the part of individual organisms along with the presence of a corresponding group-level adaptation. Therefore, Maynard Smith does require a group-level adaptation from groups to count as units of selection. As with Williams, it is significant that he assumes the engineering notion of adaptation rather than the weaker selection-product notion. As Maynard Smith puts it, “an explanation in terms of group advantage should always be explicit, and always calls for some justification in terms of the frequency of group extinction” (1976, p. 278; cf. Wade 1978; Wright 1980).

In contrast to the preceding authors, Sewall Wright separated the interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation questions in his group selection models (see Lewontin 1978; Gould and Lewontin 1979). Wright distinguishes between what he calls “intergroup selection,” that is, interdemic selection in his shifting balance process, and “group selection for group advantage” (1980, p. 840; see Wright 1929, 1931). He cites Haldane (1932) as the originator of the term “altruist” to denote a phenotype “that contributes to group advantage at the expense of disadvantage to itself” (1980, p. 840). Wright connects this debate to Wynne-Edwards, whom he characterizes as asserting the evolutionary importance of “group selection for group advantage.” He argues that Hamilton's kin selection model is “very different” from “group selection for the uniform advantage of a group”(1980, p. 841; like Arnold and Fristrup 1982; Damuth and Heisler 1988; Heisler and Damuth 1987). See Goodnight and Stevens (1997) for an excellent summary of the empirical and theoretical discoveries enabled by Wright-style group selection models.

Wright takes Maynard Smith, Williams and Dawkins to task for mistakenly thinking that because they have successfully criticized group selection for group advantage, they can conclude that “natural selection is practically wholly genic.” Wright argues, “none of them discussed group selection for organismic advantage to individuals, the dynamic factor in the shifting balance process, although this process, based on irreversible local peak-shifts is not fragile at all, in contrast with the fairly obvious fragility of group selection for group advantage, which they considered worthy of extensive discussion before rejection” (1980, p. 841).

This is a fair criticism of Maynard Smith, Williams, and Dawkins. According to Wright, the problem is that these authors failed to distinguish between two questions: the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation question. Wright's interdemic group selection model involves groups only as interactors, not as manifestors of group-level adaptations. Further, he is interested only in the effect the groups have on organismic adaptedness and expected reproductive success. More recently, modelers following Sewall Wright's interest in structured populations have created a new set of genetical models that are also called “group selection” models and in which the questions of group adaptations and group benefit play little or no role.[9]

For a period spanning two decades, however, Maynard Smith, Williams, and Dawkins did not acknowledge that the position they attacked, namely Wynne-Edwards', is significantly different from other available approaches to group selection, such as Wright's, Wade's, Wilson's, Uyenoyama's or Lewontin's. Ultimately, however, both Williams and Maynard Smith recognized the significance of the distinction between the interactor question and the manifestor-of-an-adaptation question. In 1985, Williams wrote, “If some populations of species are doing better than others at persistence and reproduction, and if such differences are caused in part by genetic differences, this selection at the population level must play a role in the evolution of the species,” while concluding that group selection “is unimportant for the origin an maintenance of adaptation” (Williams 1985, pp. 7–8).

And in 1987, Maynard Smith made an extraordinary concession:

There has been some semantic confusion about the phrase “group selection,” for which I may be partly responsible. For me, the debate about levels of selection was initiated by Wynne-Edwards' book. He argued that there are group-level adaptations…which inform individuals of the size of the population so that they can adjust their breeding for the good of the population. He was clear that such adaptations could evolve only if populations were units of selection…. Perhaps unfortunately, he referred to the process as “group selection.” As a consequence, for me and for many others who engaged in this debate, the phrase cane to imply that groups were sufficiently isolated from one another reproductively to act as units of evolution, and not merely that selection acted on groups.

The importance of this debate lay in the fact that group-adaptationist thinking was at that time widespread among biologists. It was therefore important to establish that there is no reason to expect groups to evolve traits ensuring their own survival unless they are sufficiently isolated for like to beget like…. When Wilson (1975) introduced his trait-group model, I was for a long time bewildered by his wish to treat it as a case of group selection and doubly so by the fact that his original model…had interesting results only when the members of the group were genetically related, a process I had been calling kin selection for ten years. I think that these semantic difficulties are now largely over. (1987, p. 123).

Dawkins also seems to have rediscovered the evolutionary efficacy of higher-level selection processes in an article on artificial life. In this article, he is primarily concerned with modeling the course of selection processes, and he offers a species-level selection interpretation for an aggregate species-level trait (Dawkins 1989a). Still, he seems not to have recognized the connection between this evolutionary dynamic and the controversies surrounding group selection because in his second edition of The Selfish Gene (Dawkins 1989b) he had yet to accept the distinction made so clearly by Wright in 1980. This was in spite of the fact that by 1987, the importance of distinguishing between evolution by selection processes and any engineering adaptations produced by these processes had been acknowledged by the workers Dawkins claimed to be following most closely, Williams and Maynard Smith. More recently, Dawkins has gotten into a related debate with E.O. Wilson (2008) about the definitions of group and kin selection. As Ayelet Shavit and Roberta Millstein ably point out, this debate is bound for nowhere without tight enough definitions of these kinds of selection. They advocate the adoption of Wade's strict definitions, following Wright's prescriptions.

There are several significant more recent entries into the group selection discussions, starting with Elliott Sober and David Sloan Wilson's Unto Others: The Evolution and Psychology of Unselfish Behavior which they published in 1998. In this important work Sober and Wilson develop a case for group selection based on the need to account for the existence of biological altruism. Biological altruism is any behaviour that benefits another organism at some cost to the actor. Such behavior must always reduce the actor's fitness but it may, as Sober and Wilson (following the work of Haldane and Wright) show, increase the fitness of certain groups within a structured population. Wilson and Sober's book brought the attention of the larger philosophical community to group selection models, and explained them in an accessible fashion. It has thus brought this aspect of the units of selection controversy out onto the main stage of philosophical thought.

Peter Godfrey-Smith provides a considerably different view of the necessary conditions for group selection, one which rejects many of the currently accepted cases of the phenomenon. For a given selection story to be descriptively valid, a “Darwinian population” must exist at the level of selection being described, which requires the presence of both an interactor and a reproducer at that level, thus putting together what others have pulled apart (2009, p. 112). A Darwinian population is conceived as, at minimum, “a collection of causally connected individual things in which there is variation in character, which leads to differences in reproductive output (differences in how much or how quickly individuals reproduce), and which is inherited to some extent.” (2009, p. 39) He further differentiates between paradigmatic, minimal, and marginal Darwinian populations based on a variety of criteria, such as the fidelity of heritability, continuity (the degree to which small shifts in phenotype correlate to small changes in fitness), and the dependence of reproductive differences on intrinsic features of individuals (2009, Chapter 3).

For example, under this view, the case of the evolution of altruism, which is commonly attributed to group selection, should not be considered as such, because of the lack of a true reproducer at the group level; the group level description depicts at best a marginal Darwinian population (2009, p. 119). Rather, Godfrey-Smith argues that a neighborhood selection model, in which individuals are affected by the phenotypes of their neighbors but cannot be seen as “collectives competing at a higher level,” is fully capable of capturing the selective process involved, and represents a Darwinian population, in which the individuals are seen both as the interactors and the reproducers (2009, p. 118). This would seem to entail that many group selection accounts, such as those put forward by Sober and Wilson (Sober and Wilson, 1998), as well as any models classified as Multi-level selection 1 (MLS1) models (Hiesler and Damuth 1987), cannot be properly considered as such, although Godfrey-Smith grants that there are empirical examples in which a group-level reproducer clearly exists (for example, Wade and Griesemer, 1998, 2003; there is otherwise no discussion of Wrightian approaches to group selection). Godfrey Smith argues that his system of Darwinian populations and reproducers presents an advantage over other available analyses of units of selection because it can account for previously neglected examples such as epigenetic inheritance systems. The question remains as to whether gaining an account to deal with these is worth rejecting an entire class of accepted group selection models, and whether such a loss is truly necessary to deal with epigenesis (for an epigenetic account with reproducers, see Griesemer 2000c).

3.2 Species Selection

Ambiguities about the definition of a unit of selection have also snarled the debate about selection processes at the species level. Ernst Mayr responded to the notion of species selection with a classic confusion: “It is individual selection discriminating against the individuals of the losing species that causes the extinction.” He rejects species selection, confusing the individual death of species members with extinction, saying “the actual selection takes place at the level of competing individuals of the two species{special-character:rdquo] (1997, p. 2093). Once we overcome such difficulties, and succeed in conceiving of species as unified interactors, we are still faced with two questions. The combining of the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation question (in the engineering sense) led to the rejection of research aimed at considering the role of species as interactors, simpliciter, in evolution. Once it is understood that species-level interactors may or may not possess design-type adaptations, it becomes possible to distinguish two research questions: Do species function as interactors, playing an active and significant role in evolution by selection? And does the evolution of species-level interactors produce species-level engineering adaptations and, if so, how often?

For the early history of the species selection debate, these questions were lumped together; asking whether species could be units of selection meant asking whether they fulfilled both the interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation roles. For example, Vrba used Maynard Smith's treatment of the evolution of altruism as a touchstone in her definition of species selection (1984). Maynard Smith argued that kin selection could cause the spread of altruistic genes but that it should not be called group selection (1976). Again, this was because the groups were not considered to possess design-type adaptations themselves. Vrba agreed that the spread of altruism should not be considered a case of group selection because “there is no group adaptation involved; altruism is not emergent at the group level” (1984, p. 319; Maynard Smith gives different reasons for his rejection). This amounts to assuming that there must be group benefit in the sense of a design-type group-level adaptation in order to say that group selection can occur. Vrba's view was that evolution by selection is not happening at a given level unless there is a benefit or engineering adaptation at that level. She explicitly equates units of selection with the existence of an interactor plus adaptation at that level (1983, p. 388); furthermore, it seems that she has adopted the stronger engineering definition of adaptation.

Eldredge also argues that species selection does not happen unless there are species-level adaptations (1985, pp. 196, 134). Eldredge rejects certain cases as higher-level selection processes overall because “frequencies of the properties of lower-level individuals which are part of a high-level individual simply do not make convincing higher-level adaptations” (1985, p. 133).

Vrba, Eldredge, and Gould all defined a unit of selection as requiring an emergent, adaptive property (Vrba 1983, 1984; Vrba and Eldredge 1984; Vrba and Gould 1986). This amounts to asking a combination of the interactor and manifestor of adaptation questions. As Okasha points out, the relevant question is not “whether some particle-level causal processes or other bear the causal responsibility,” but rather “whether particle-level selection bears the causal responsibility” (Okasha 2006, p. 107). An emergent character requirement conflates these two questions. Such a character may be the result of a selection process at the group/species level, but it should not be treated as a pre-condition of such a process.

But consider the lineage-wide trait of variability. Treating species as interactors has a long tradition (Dobzhansky 1956, Thoday 1953, Lewontin 1958). If species are conceived as interactors (and not necessarily manifestors-of-adaptations), then the notion of species selection is not vulnerable to Williams' original antigroup-selection objections[10]. The old idea was that lineages with certain properties of being able to respond to environmental stresses would be selected for, and thus that the trait of variability itself would be selected for and would spread in the population of populations. In other words, lineages were treated as interactors. The earlier researchers spoke loosely of adaptations where adaptations were treated in the weak sense as equivalent simply to the outcome of selection processes (at any level). They were explicitly not concerned with the effect of species selection on organismic level traits but with the effect on species-level characters such as speciation rates, lineage-level survival, and extinction rates of species. Lloyd and Gould argue that this sort of case represents a perfectly good form of species selection even though some balk at the thought that variability would then be considered, under a weak definition, a species-level adaptation (Lloyd and Gould 1993, Lloyd [1988]; 1994). Paleontologists David Jablonski and Gene Hunt used the Lloyd and Gould approach to species selection in their research on fossil gastropods, and the approach has also been adopted in the leading text on speciation, by Jerry Coyne and H. Allen Orr (Coyne and Orr 2004).

Vrba also eventually recognized the advantages of keeping the interactor question separate from a requirement for an engineering-type adaptation. In a later review article, she dropped her former requirement that, in order for species to be units of selection, they must possess species-level adaptations (1989). Ultimately, her current definition of species selection is in conformity with a simple interactor interpretation of a unit of selection (cf. Damuth and Heisler 1988; Lloyd [1988] 1994).

It is easy to see how the two-pronged definition of a unit of selection—as interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation—held sway for so long in the species selection debates. After all, it had dominated much of the group selection debates for so long. Some of the confusion and conflict over higher-level units of selection arose because of an historical contingency—Wynne-Edwards' implicit definition of a unit of selection and the responses it provoked (Borrello 2010).

3.3 Genic Selection: The Originators

One may understandably think that Dawkins is interested in the replicator question because he claims that the unit of selection ought to be the replicator. This would be a mistake. Dawkins is interested primarily in a specific ontological issue about benefit. He is asking a special version of the beneficiary question, and his answer to that question dictates his answers to the other three questions flying under the rubric of the "units of selection".

Briefly, Dawkins argues that because replicators are the only entities that “survive” the evolutionary process, they must be the beneficiaries. What happens in the process of evolution by natural selection happens for their sake, for their benefit. Hence, interactors interact for the replicators' benefit, and adaptations belong to the replicators. Replicators are the only entities with real agency as initiators of causal chains that lead to the phenotypes; hence, they accrue the credit and are the real units of selection.

Dawkins' version of the units of selection question amounts to a combination of the beneficiary question plus the manifestor-of-adaptation question. There is little evidence that he thinks he is answering the predominant interactor question; rather, he argues that people who focus on interactors are laboring under a misunderstanding of evolutionary theory. One reason he thinks this might be that he takes as his opponents those who hold a combination of the interactor plus manifestor-of-adaptations definition of a unit of selection (e.g., Wynne-Edwards). Unfortunately, Dawkins ignores those who are pursuing the interactor question alone; these researchers are not vulnerable to the criticisms he poses against the combined interactor-adaptation view. Section 3.4 addresses those who interpret themselves as arguing against the interactor question itself.

In the next few paragraphs, two aspects of Dawkins' own version of the units of selection problem shall be characterized. I will attempt to clarify the key issues of interest to Dawkins and to relate these to the issues of interest to others.

Dawkins believes that interactors, which he calls “vehicles,” are not relevant to the units of selection problem. The real units of selection, he argues, should be replicators, “the units that actually survive or fail to survive” (1982b, pp. 113–116). Organisms or groups as “vehicles” may be seen as the unit of function in the selection process, but they should not, he argues, be seen as the units of selection because the characteristics they acquire are not passed on (1982b, p.99). Here, he is following Williams' line. Genotypes have limited lives and fail to reproduce themselves because they are destroyed in every generation by meiosis and recombination in sexually reproducing species; they are only temporary (Williams 1966, p. 109). Hence, genes are the only units that survive in the selection process. The gene (replicator) is the real unit because it is an “indivisible fragment,” it is “potentially immortal” (Williams 1966, pp. 23–4; Dawkins 1982b, p. 97).

The issue, for Dawkins, is “Whether, when we talk about a unit of selection, we ought to mean a vehicle at all, or a replicator” (1982b, p. 82). He clearly distinguishes the dispute he would like to generate from the group-versus-organismic selection controversy, which he characterizes as a disagreement “about the rival claims of two suggested kinds of vehicles” (1982b, p. 82). In his view, replicator selection should be seen as an alternative framework for both organismic and group selection models.

There are two mistakes that Dawkins is not making. First, he does not deny that interactors are involved in the evolutionary process. He emphasizes that it is not necessary, under his view, to believe that replicators are directly “visible” to selection forces (1982b, p. 176). Dawkins has recognized from the beginning that his question is completely distinct from the interactor question. He remarks, in fact, that the debate about group versus organismic selection is “a factual dispute about the level at which selection is most effective in nature,” whereas his own point is “about what we ought to mean when we talk about a unit of selection” (1982a, p. 46). He also states that genes or other replicators do not “literally face the cutting edge of natural selection. It is their phenotypic effects that are the proximal subjects of selection” (1982a, p. 47). We shall return to this issue in Section 3.4.

Second, Dawkins does not specify how large a chunk of the genome he will allow as a replicator; there is no commitment to the notion that single genes are the only possible replicators. He argues that if Lewontin, Franklin, Slatkin and others are right, his view will not be affected (see Section 2.2). If linkage disequilibrium is very strong, then the “effective replicator will be a very large chunk of DNA” (Dawkins 1982b, p. 89). We can conclude from this that Dawkins is not interested in the replicator question at all; his claim here is that his framework can accommodate any of its possible answers.

On what basis, then, does Dawkins reject the question about interactors? I think the answer lies in the particular question in which he is most interested, namely, What is “the nature of the entity for whose benefit adaptations may be said to exist?”[11]

On the face of it, it is certainly conceivable that one might identify the beneficiary of the adaptations as—in some cases, anyway—the individual organism or group that exhibits the phenotypic trait taken to be the adaptation. In fact, Williams seems to have done just that in his discussion of group selection.[12] But Dawkins rejects this move, introducing an additional qualification to be fulfilled by a unit of selection; it must be “the unit that actually survives or fails to survive” (1982a, p. 60). Because organisms, groups, and even genomes do not actually survive the evolution-by-selection process, the answer to the survival question must be the replicator. (Strictly speaking, this is false; it is copies of the replicators that survive. He therefore must mean replicators in some sense of information and not as biological entities (see Hampe and Morgan 1988; cf. Griesemer 2005).

But there is still a problem. Although Dawkins concludes, “there should be no controversy over replicators versus vehicles. Replicator survival and vehicle selection are two aspects of the same process” (1982a, p. 60), he does not just leave the vehicle selection debate alone. Instead, he argues that we do not need the concept of discrete vehicles at all. This is what we shall investigate in Section 3.4.

The important point for now is that, on Dawkins' analysis, the fact that replicators are the only survivors of the evolution-by-selection process automatically answers also the question of who owns the adaptations. He claims that adaptations must be seen as being designed for the good of the active-gene-line replicator for the simple reason that replicators are the only entities around long enough to enjoy them over the course of natural selection. He acknowledges that the phenotype is “the all important instrument of replicator preservation,” and that genes' phenotypic effects are organized into organisms (that thereby might benefit from them in their lifetimes) (1982b, p. 114). But because only the active germ-line replicators survive, they are the true locus of adaptations (1982b, p. 113; emphasis added). The other things that benefit over the short term (e.g., organisms with adaptive traits) are merely the tools of the real survivors, the real owners. Hence, Dawkins rejects the vehicle approach partly because he identifies it with the manifestor of adaptation approach, which he has answered by definition, in terms of the long-term beneficiary.

The second key aspect of Dawkins' views on interactors is that he seems to want to do away with them entirely. Dawkins is aware that the vehicle concept is “fundamental to the predominant orthodox approach to natural selection” (1982b, p. 116). Nevertheless, he rejects this approach in The Extended Phenotype, claiming, “the main purpose of this book is to draw attention to the weaknesses of the whole vehicle concept” (1982b, p. 115). But his “vehicle” approach is not equivalent to "the interactor question"; it encompasses a much more restricted approach.

In particular, when Dawkins argues against “the vehicle concept,” he is only arguing against the desirability of seeing the individual organism as the one and only possible vehicle. His target is explicitly those who hold what he calls the “Central Theorem,” which says that individual organisms should be seen as maximizing their own inclusive fitness (1982b, pp. 5, 55). Dawkins' arguments are indeed damaging to the Central theorem, but they are ineffective against other approaches that define units of selection as interactors.

One way to interpret the Central Theorem is that it implies that the individual organism is always the beneficiary of any selection process. Dawkins seems to mean by “beneficiary” both the manifestor of adaptation and that which survives to reap the rewards of the evolutionary process. He argues, rightly and persuasively, I think, that it does not make sense always to consider the individual organism to be the beneficiary of a selection process.

But it is crucial to see that Dawkins is not arguing against the importance of the interactor question in general, but rather against a particular definition of a unit of selection. The view he is criticizing assumes that the individual organism is the interactor, and the beneficiary, and the manifestor of adaptation. Consider his main argument against the utility of considering vehicles: the primary reason to abandon thinking about vehicles is that it confuses people (1982b, p. 189). But look at his examples; their point is that it is inappropriate always to ask how an organism's behavior benefits that organism's inclusive fitness. We should ask instead, says Dawkins, “whose inclusive fitness the behavior is benefiting” (1982b, p. 80). He states that his purpose in the book is to show that “theoretical dangers attend the assumption that adaptations are for the good of…the individual organism” (1982b, p. 91).

So, Dawkins is quite clear about what he means by the “vehicle selection approach”; it always assumes that the organism is the beneficiary of its accrued inclusive fitness. Dawkins advances powerful arguments against the assumption that the organism is always the interactor cum beneficiary cum manifestor of adaptations. This approach is clearly not equivalent to the approach to units of selection characterized as the interactor approach. Unfortunately, Dawkins extends his conclusions to these other approaches, which he has, in fact, not addressed. Dawkins' lack of consideration of the interactor definition of a unit of selection leads to two grave problems with his views.

One problem is that he has a tendency to interpret all group selectionist claims as being about beneficiaries and manifestors of adaptations as well as interactors. This is a serious misreading of authors who are pursuing the interactor question alone.

Consider, for example, Dawkins' argument that groups should not be considered units of selection:

To the extent that active germ-line replicators benefit from the survival of the group of individuals in which they sit, over and above the [effects of individual traits and altruism], we may expect to see adaptations for the preservation of the group. But all these adaptations will exist, fundamentally, through differential replicator survival. The basic beneficiary of any adaptation is the active germ-line replicator (1982b, p. 85).

Notice that Dawkins begins by admitting that groups can function as interactors, and even that group selection may effectively produce group-level adaptations. The argument that groups should not be considered real units of selection amounts to the claim that the groups are not the ultimate beneficiaries. To counteract the intuition that the groups do, of course, benefit, in some sense, from the adaptations, Dawkins uses the terms “fundamentally” and “basic,” thus signaling what he considers the most important level. Even if a group-level trait is affecting a change in gene frequencies, “it is still genes that are regarded as the replicators which actually survive (or fail to survive) as a consequence of the (vehicle) selection process” (1982b, p. 115). Thus, the replicator is the unit of selection, because it is the beneficiary, and the real owner of all adaptations that exist.

Saying all this does not, however, address the fact that other researchers investigating group selection are asking the interactor question and sometimes also the manifestor of adaptation question, rather than Dawkins' special version of the (ultimate) beneficiary question. He gives no additional reason to reject these other questions as legitimate; he simply reasserts the superiority of his own preferred unit of selection. In sum, Dawkins has identified three criteria as necessary for something to be a unit of selection: it must be a replicator; it must be the most basic beneficiary of the selection process; and it is automatically the ultimate manifestor of adaptation through being the beneficiary.

Recent work by Alexander Rosenberg brings the level of the unit of selection down even further than Dawkins. In his recent book Darwinian Reductionism: Or, How to Stop Worrying and Love Molecular Biology, Rosenberg argues that higher level selection is reducible to more fundamental levels. Taking a reductionist stance, which he believes is necessary to avoid an “untenable dualism” in biology between physicalism and antireductionism, he argues that the principle of natural selection (PNS) should be properly viewed as a basic law of physical science (specifically chemistry), which can operate at the level of atoms and molecules (2006, p. 189–191). Different molecular environments would favor different chemical types, and those that “more closely approximate an environmentally optimal combination of stability and replication,” are thus the “fittest” and would predominate (2006, p. 190). This could then be applied at each step of the way from simple molecules to compounds, organelles, cells, tissues, and so on, such that “the result at each level of chemical aggregation is the instantiation of another PNS, grounded in, or at least in principle derivable from, the molecular interactions that follow the PNS in the environment operating at one or more lower levels of aggregation” (2006, p. 192).

According to Rosenberg, this approach addresses antireductionist arguments regarding group level properties. Rosenberg argues that his new envisioning of the PNS as a purely physical law allows us to better understand the lower level origins of apparently higher level causes, thus revealing that “the appearance of ‘downward causation’ is just that: mere appearance.” (2006, p. 197) For example, he claims that group level selection explanations, such as are commonly given for altruism, do not require an antireductionist stance, since physical laws, such as that 2nd law of thermodynamics, can allow for local unfavorable changes (in this case, local decreases in entropy) as long as compensation is made elsewhere. With regard to his physical PNS, “groups of biological individuals may experience fitness increases at the expense of fitness decreases among their individual members for periods of time that will depend on the size and composition of the group and the fitness effects of their traits. What the PNS will not permit is long-term fitness changes at the level of groups without long-term fitness changes in the same direction among some or all of the individuals composing them.” (2006, p. 198). In other words, this is supposed to show that there is no need to think in terms of irreducible group level interactors. Again, Rosenberg merges characteristics of interactors and replicators in his analysis.

In the next section, we will consider some relatively more recent work in which genic selectionism is defended through a pluralist approach to modeling. What matters in the final analysis, though, is exactly what matters to Dawkins, and that is the search for the ultimate beneficiary of the evolution by selection process.

3.4 Genic Selection: The Pluralists

As we saw in the previous section, Dawkins had particular problems with his treatment of the interactor. While he admitted that the “vehicle” was necessary for the selection process, he did not want to accord it any weight in the units of selection debate because it was not the beneficiary, but rather an agent of the beneficiary. Starting with Ken Waters' work in 1986, though, there emerged a new angle available to genic selectionists. The line of argument was pursued by Sterelny and Kitcher (1988), by Waters (1991), and by Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters (1990). While there are substantive differences between their views, especially about scientific realism, the discussion will be restricted here to what they have to say narrowly about genic selectionism and genic pluralism.

The new "genic pluralism," as Sterelny and Kitcher call it, appears to let one bypass the interactor question, by, in effect, turning genes into interactors.

Kim Sterelny and Philip Kitcher proposed in 1988 that there are two “images” of natural selection, one in which selection accounts are given in terms of a hierarchy of entities and their traits' environments, the other of which is given in terms of genes having properties that affect their abilities to leave copies of themselves (see Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters 1990, Sterelny 1996a,b). Waters (1986, 1991) made similar claims. They all argue that something significant follows from the fact that hierarchical models or selection processes can be reformulated in terms of the genic level. These claims have been resisted on a variety of grounds (see objections in R.A. Wilson 2003, Stanford 2001, Van der Steen and van den Berg 1999, Gannett 1999, Shanahan 1997, Glennan 2002, Sober 1990, Sober and Wilson 1998, Brandon and Nijhout 2006, Sarkar 2008).

The big payoff of the genic point of view, according to Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters, is: “Once the possibility of many, equally adequate, representations of evolutionary processes has been recognized, philosophers and biologists can turn their attention to more serious projects than that of quibbling about the real unit of selection” (1990, p. 161).

By “quibbling about the real unit of selection,” here, they seem to be referring to the large range of articles in which evolutionists have tried to give concrete evidence and requirements for something to serve as an interactor in a selection process.

As an aside, it is important to note that neither Sterelny, Kitcher, nor Waters is advocating genic selectionism to the exclusion of other views. What interests them is a proposed equivalence between being able to tell the selection story one way, in terms of interactors and replicators, and to tell the same story another way, purely in terms of “genic agency”. Thus, they are pluralists, in that they are not ultimately arguing in favor of the genic view; they are, however, expanding the genic selectionist view beyond its previous limits.

The pluralists attack the view that “for any selection process, there is a uniquely correct identification of the operative selective forces and the level at which each impinges” (Waters 1991, p. 553). Rather, they claim, “We believe that asking about the real unit of selection is an exercise in muddled metaphysics” (Kitcher et al. 1990, p 159). The basic view is that “the causes of one and the same selection process can be correctly described at different levels” (including the genic one) (Waters 1991, p.555). Moreover, these descriptions are on equal ontological footing.[13]

The pluralists seem to be arguing against the utility of the notion of the interactor in studying the selection process. Echoing Dawkins, their idea is that the whole causal story can be told at the level of genes, and that no higher level entities need be proposed or considered in order to have an accurate and complete explanation of the selection process. But, arguably, the genic level story cannot be told without taking the functional role of interactors into account, and thus the pluralists cannot avoid quibbling about interactors, as they claim (see Lloyd 2005a).

Let us recall what the interactor question in the units of selection debate amounts to: What levels of entities interact with their environments through their traits in such a way that it makes a difference to replicator success? As mentioned before, there has been much discussion in the literature about how to delineate and locate interactors among multilayered processes of selection. Each of these suggestions leads to slightly different results and different problems and limitations, but each also takes the notion of the interactor seriously as a necessary component to understanding a selection process.

The genic pluralists state that “All selective episodes (or, perhaps, almost all) can be interpreted in terms of genic selection. That is an important fact about natural selection” (Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters 1990, p. 160). Thus, the functional claim of the pluralists is that anything that a hierarchical selection model can do, a genic selection model can do just as well. Much attention is paid to showing that the two types of models can represent certain patterns of selection equally well, even those that are conventionally considered hierarchical selection. This is argued for using both specific examples and schema for translating hierarchical models into genic ones. Let us consider one challenging case here.

Take the classic account of the efficacy of interdemic or group selection, the case that even G.C. Williams acknowledged was hierarchical selection. Lewontin and Dunn (Lewontin and Dunn 1960, and Lewontin 1962), in investigating the house mouse, found first, that there was segregation distortion, in that over 80% of the sperm from mice heterozygous for the t-allele also carried the t-allele, whereas the expected rate would be 50%. They also found that male homozygotes (those with two t-alleles) tended to be sterile (in several populations they were lethal, but in the populations in question, they were sterile.) They also found a substantial effect of group extinction based on the fact that female mice would often find themselves in groups in which all males were sterile, and the group itself would therefore go extinct. This, then, is how a genuine and empirically robust hierarchical model was developed.

What the pluralists want to note about this case is very narrow, that is “whether there are real examples of processes that can be modeled as group selection can be asked and answered entirely within the genic point of view.” (Kitcher et al. 1990, p. 160). Just as a warning to the unwary, the key to understanding the genic reinterpretation of this case is to grasp that the pluralists use a concept of genetic environment that their critics ignore.

Waters tells how to “construct” a genic model of the causes responsible for the frequency of the t-allele. He writes that we must first distinguish “genetic environments that are contained within female mice that are trapped in small populations with only sterile males from genetic environments that are not contained within such females. In effect, the interactions at the group level would be built in as a part of one kind of genetic environment” (1991, p. 563). In other words, various very detailed environments would have to be specified for various different t-alleles and wild-type alleles. In order to determine the invariant fitness parameter of a specific allele, let's call it ‘A’ for example, we would need to know what kind of environment it is in at the allelic level, e.g., whether it is paired with a t-allele. Then we would need to know a further detailed layer of the environment of ‘A’, such as what the sex is of the “environment” it is in. If it is in a t-allele arrangement, and it is also in a male environment, the allelic fitness of ‘A’ would be changed. Finally, we need to know the type of subpopulation or deme the ‘A’ allele is in. Is it in a small deme with many t-alleles? Then it is more likely to become extinct. So, as we can see, various aspects of the allele's environment are built up from the gene out, depending on what would make a difference to the gene's fitness in that very particular kind of environment. If you want to know the overall fitness of the ‘A’ allele, you add up the fitnesses in each set of specialized, detailed environments and weight them according to the frequency of that environment.

Waters writes, “What appears as a multiple level selection process (e.g., selection of the t-allele) to those who draw the conceptual divide [between environments] at the traditional level, appears to genic selectionists of Williams's style as several selection processes being carried out at the same level within different genetic environments” (1991, p. 571). The “same level” here means the “genic level,” while the genetic environments include everything from the other allele at the locus, to whether the genotype is present in a male or female mouse, to the size and composition of the deme the mouse is in. This completes the sketch of the genic pluralist position. We now turn to its reception.

Genic pluralism's impact has been largely philosophic rather than biological (but see Shanahan 1997 and Van der Steen and Van den Berg 1999). Within philosophy, the view has been widely disseminated and taught, and a steady stream of critical responses to the genic pluralist position has been forthcoming. These responses fall into two main categories: pragmatic and causal.

The pragmatic response to genic pluralism simply notes that in any given selective scenario the genic perspective provides no information that is not also available from the hierarchical point of view. This state of affairs is taken by critics of this type as sufficient reason to prefer whichever perspective is most useful for solving the problems facing a particular researcher. Examples of this approach include Glymour, Van der Steen and, to some extent, Shanahan (Glymour 1999, Van der Steen and Van den Berg 1999, and Shanahan 1997). The weakness of this approach as a critique of genic pluralism is that it does not so much criticize genic pluralism as simply ignore it.

The other major form of critique of genic pluralism is based on arguments concerning the causal structure of selective episodes. The idea here is that while genic pluralism gets the “genetic book-keeping” (i.e., the input/output relations) correct, it does not accurately reflect the causal processes that bring about the result in question. This line of argument was first broached by William Wimsatt (1980, 1981). Examples of this approach used against the genic pluralists include Sober 1990, Sober and Wilson 1994 and Sober and Wilson 1998, all of which also appeal to aspects of the manifestor of adaptations and beneficiary questions to establish the failure of genic pluralism to represent certain selective events correctly. Causal concerns are also raised in the work of Shanahan, Van der Steen, Stanford and Glennan (Shanahan 1997, Van der Steen and Van den Berg 1999, Stanford 2001, and Glennan 2002), though without the focus on other units questions. The weakness of this line of criticism is its inability to isolate a notion of cause that is both plausible and plausibly true of hierarchical but not genic level models. This feature—that the genic and hierarchical models are so similar as to be indistinguishable—which appears as an insurmoutable problem in the context of debates about differing causal structure, turns out to be the locus of the most recent critical response to genic pluralism, which denies that the genic selectionists have any distinct and coherent genic level causes at all (Lloyd 2005a).

Genic pluralism presents alleles as independent causal entities, with the claim that the availability of such models makes hierarchical selection models—and the ensuing debates about how to identify interactors in selection processes—moot. Or, in a less contentious version of the argument, from Waters (1991), the hierarchical and genic models are fully developed causal alternatives. However in each case of the causal allelic models, these models are directly and completely derived from precisely the hierarchical models the authors reject. Moreover, causal claims made on behalf of alleles are utterly dependent on hierarchically identified and established interactors as causes, thus undermining their claims that the units of selection (interactor) debates are mere “quibbles” and are irrelevant to the representation of selection processes. Sarkar has made a similar claim, arguing that, contrary to the claims of pluralists, cases of frequency-dependence, such as in heterosis and in game-theoretic models of selection, necessitate selection at higher than genic levels because the relevant properties of the entities at the genic level are only definable relative to higher levels of organization. Thus, they cannot be properly described as properties of alleles nor are they “even definable at the allelic level.” (Sarkar 2008, p. 219)

To say that the allelic level models are completely derivative from higher level models of selection processes, Lloyd 2005a uses the following guidelines. Two models that are mathematically equivalent may be semantically different, that is, they have different interpretations. Such models can be independent from one another or one may be derivative of the other. In the genic selection case, the pluralists appear to be claiming that the genic level models are independent from the hierarchical models. The claim is: although the genic models are mathematically equivalent, they have different parameters, and a different interpretation, and they are completely independent from hierarchical models.

But, despite the pluralists' repeated claims, we can see from their own calculations and examples that theirs are derivative models, and thus, that their “genic” level causes are derivative from and dependent on higher level causes. Their genic level models depend for their empirical, causal, and explanatory adequacy on entire mathematical structures taken from the hierarchical models and refashioned.

As reviewed above, one example from their own writing comes from Waters' treatment of the t-allele case, a universally recognized case of three levels of selection operating simultaneously on a single allele. Waters actually offers, right before the t-allele case, a suggestion that a Williams's type analysis could be based on an application of Lloyd's additivity criterion for identifying interactors, which is strictly hierarchical (Waters 1991, p. 563; Lloyd [1988] 1994, Ch. 5). Thus, Waters is suggesting borrowing a method for identifying potential higher-level interactors in order to determine the genic environments and thus to have more adequate genic level models. Similarly, Sterelny and Kitcher resort to a traditional approach to identifying interactors in order to make their genic models work. Robert Brandon proposed that the statistical idea of screening off be used to identify which levels of entities are causally effective in the selection process; i.e., it is a method used to isolate interactors. But Sterelny and Kitcher propose using screening off to identify layers of allelic environments (1988, p. 354).

Hence, Sterelny, Kitcher, and Waters all use the same methods for isolating relevant genic-level environments as others do for the traditional isolating of interactors. What, we may ask, is the real difference? Both can be seen as attempting to get the causal influences on selection right, because they are using the same methods. What is different is that the genic selectionists want to tell the causal story in terms of genes and not in terms of interactors and genes. Moreover, they propose doing away with interactors altogether. Are we to think that renaming changes the metaphysics of the situation?

It seems that levels of interaction important to the outcome of the selection process are being discovered in the usual ways, i.e., by using approaches to interactors and their environments, and that that exact same information is being translated into talk of the differentiated and layered environments of the genes.

The issue concerning renaming model structures is especially confusing in the genic pluralists presentations, because they repeatedly rely on an assumption or intuition that, given an allelic state space, we are dealing with allelic causes. This last assumption is easily traced back to Williams' and Dawkins' views that alleles are the ultimate beneficiaries of any long term selection process; thus, the genic pluralist argument rests substantially on a view regarding the superior importance of the beneficiary question, which has been clearly delineated from the interactor question, above.

Let us summarize the consequences of derivativeness in terms of the science and metaphysics of the processes discussed. First, the genic pluralists end up offering not, as they claim, a variety of genuinely diverse causal versions of the selection process at different levels. This is because the causes of the hierarchical models, however determined, are simply transformed and renamed in the lower level models, but remain fully intact as relevant causes at the full range of higher and lower levels. More importantly, no new allelic causes are introduced. Second, while genic models may be derived from hierarchical models, they fail to sustain the necessary supporting methodology. Third, the lack of genuine alternative causal accounts destroys the claims of pluralism or, at least, of any interesting philosophical variety, since there are no genuine alternatives being presented, unless you count renaming model structures as metaphysically significant[14]. Perhaps the best way to save the pluralist vision of Sterelny, Kitcher, and Waters is to appeal to the recent work of Godfrey-Smith on neighbor selection (2008), which can be cast within a pluralist program. His effort is to revive and discuss an alternative fashion of modeling altruism or group benefit, within the terms of a lower, individual level (see the discussion in section 3.1).

There is a further complication with respect to the nature of the genic selection models put forward by genic pluralists. These models function under the presupposition that they are at least mathematically equivalent to hierarchical models. This claim has largely depended on the work of Dugatkin and Reeve in establishing this equivalence (Dugatkin and Reeve 1994, Sterelny 1996b, Sober and Wilson 1998, Sterelny and Griffiths 1999, Kerr and Godfrey-Smith 2002a, Waters 2005). However, recent work has indicated that this equivalence does not in fact hold. In Dugatkin and Reeve and the rest of this literature, comparison of population genetic models was largely based on predictions of allele frequency changes; in other words, if two models made the same predictions as to the changes of allelic frequencies in a given situation, then the models are equivalent. However, this is an overly simplistic method for testing model equivalence which pays little mind to the details of the models themselves. When the notion of representational adequacy of the models is taken into account, specifically through the inclusion of parametric and dynamical sufficiency as important points of comparison, this equivalence between genic and hierarchical models disappears (Lloyd, Lewontin, and Feldman 2008).

Parametric sufficiency concerns what state space and variables are sufficient to capture the relevant properties of a given system, while dynamical sufficiency “concerns what state space and variables are sufficient to describe the evolution of a system given the parameters being used in the specific system” (Lloyd et al. 2008, p. 146). Utilizing these concepts allows for a more detailed and meaningful evaluation of a given mathematical model. And under such an analysis, the claims of Dugatkin and Reeve regarding the equivalency of genic and hierarchical models cannot be sustained. Since allelic parameters and the changes in allelic frequencies depend on genotypic fitnesses, the genic models claimed to be equivalent to the hierarchical models are neither parametrically nor dynamically sufficient.[15]

3.5 Units of Evolutionary Transition

In our preceding discussions of units of selection, we have restricted ourselves to situations in which the various units were pre-established entities. Our approach has been synchronic, one in which the relevant units, be they genes, organisms, or populations, are the same both before and after a given evolutionary process. However, not all evolutionary processes may be able to be captured under such a perspective. In particular, recent discussions regarding so-called ‘evolutionary transitions’ present a unique complication to the debates over units and levels of selection.

In the words of James Griesemer, evolutionary transition is “the process that creates new levels of biological organization” (2000, 69). Examples of such transitions include the origins of chromosomes, multicellularity, eukaryotes, and social groups (Maynard-Smith and Szathmary 1995, 6-7). These transitions all share a common feature, namely that “entities that were capable of independent replication before the transition can replicate only as part of a larger whole after it” (Maynard-Smith and Szathmary 1995, 6).

Evolutionary transitions create new potential levels and units of selection by creating new kinds of entities that can have variances in fitness. Thus, according to Griesemer, it is the “project of a theory of evolutionary transition to explain the evolutionary origin of entities with such capacities” (2000, 70). However, since such cases involve the evolutionary origin of a given level of selection, traditional synchronic approaches to units and levels of selection, which assume the pre-existence of a “hierarchy of entities that are potential candidates for units of selection”, may be insufficient, since it is the evolution of those very properties that allow entities to serve as, for example, interactors or replicators that is being addressed (2000, 70). Such a task requires a diachronic perspective, one under which the properties of our currently extant units of selection cannot be presupposed. As Griesemer argues, “…as long as evolutionary theory concerns the function of contemporary units at fixed levels of the biological hierarchy…, the functionalist approach may be adequate to its intended task. However, if a philosophy of units is to address problems going beyond this scope — for example to problems of evolutionary transition,… then a different approach is needed” (Griesemer 2003, 174).

Griesemer argues that his reproducer concept (discussed in section 2.2), which incorporates the notion of development into the treatment of units and levels of selection, is a step toward meeting the goal of addressing such evolutionary transitions. As he claims, “… the dependency of formerly independent replicators on the ‘replication’ of the wholes — the basis for the definition of evolutionary transition … is a developmental dependency that should be incorporated into the analysis of units” (2000, 75). Griesemer argues that thinking in broader terms of reproducers avoids the presupposition of evolved coding mechanisms implicit to the concept of replicators. In the case of evolutionary transitions, this allows us to separate the basic development involved in the origin of a new biological level from the later evolution of sophisticated developmental mechanisms for the “stabilization and maintenance of a new level of reproduction” (2000, 77).

Samir Okasha, in his recent book, Evolution and the Levels of Selection, notes that explaining evolutionary transitions in Darwinian terms poses a particular challenge: “Why was it advantageous for the lower-level units to sacrifice their individuality and form themselves into a corporate body?” (Okasha 2009, 218). Influenced by the work of Richard Michod, Okasha identifies three stages of such a transition, each defined in terms of the connection between fitness at the level of the collective and the individual fitness of its component particles (2009, 238). Initially, collective fitness is simply defined as average particle fitness. As fitness at the two levels begins to be decoupled, collective fitness remains proportional to average particle fitness, but is not defined by it; at such a stage, “the emerging collective lacks ‘individuality’, and has no collective-level functions of its own” (2009, 237). Finally, collective fitness “starts to depend on the functionality of the collective itself” (2009, 237–8).

For Okasha, the different stages of an evolutionary transition involve different conceptions of multi-level selection. Using the distinction defended by Lorraine Heisler and John Damuth (1987, 1988) in their “contextual analysis” of units of selection, Okasha claims that early on in the process of an evolutionary transition, multi-level selection 1 (MLS1), in which the particles themselves are the “‘focal’ units” upon which selection directly acts, applies. However, by the end of the transition, both the collectives and the particles are focal units of selection processes, with independent fitnesses, a case of Damuth and Heisler's multi-level selection 2 (MLS2) (2009, 4). An easy way to capture this distinction is that, under MLS1, the lower level particles are the interactors as well as the replicators, while in MLS2, both the upper level collectives as well as the particles are interactors. Thus, the issues surrounding evolutionary transitions involve both the interactor question and the replicator question. Understanding evolutionary transitions hence provides additional significance to Damuth and Heisler's distinction: “Rather than simply describing selection processes of different sorts, which should be kept separate in the interests of conceptual clarity, MLS1 and MLS2 represent different temporal stages of an evolutionary transition” (Okasha 2009, 239).

Peter Godfrey-Smith, in his recent book, Darwinian Populations and Natural Selection, discusses evolutionary transitions as the appearance of a “new kind of Darwinian population”, of “new entities that can enter into Darwinian processes in their own right” (2009, 122). For him, these transitions involve a “de-Darwinizing” of the lower-level entities such that “an initial collective has come to engage in definite high-level reproduction, and this has involved the curtailing of independent evolution at the lower level” (2009, 124). This can be accomplished in a variety of ways, such as through the bottleneck caused by the production of new collectives from single individuals, coupled with germ-line segregation (as in the transitions to multicellularity), or by a single member of the collective preventing all other members from reproducing (for example, among eusocial insects), or by single member having primary but not total control over the other constituents (as in the evolution of eukaryotes) (Godfrey-Smith 2009, 123-124).

These processes all involve restrictions on the ability of the lower-level entities to function as interactors and replicators, and the emergence of upper-level collectives as both interactors and replicators. The degree to which lower-level entities are thus restricted can vary. For example, somatic cells are still capable of bearing individual fitness, of outcompeting neighboring cells, and of producing more progeny. Thus, they are not yet “post-populational”; they “retain crucial Darwinian features in their own right” (2009, 126). However, they are dependent on the germ-line cells for the propagation of new collectives, and thus their ability to act as replicators is necessarily curtailed. Thus, in order to prevent subversion and encourage cooperation, such a transition requires both the “generation of benefit” and the “alignment of reproductive interests” (Godfrey-Smith 2009, 124, with terminology from Calcott 2008). For example, in the case of multicellularity, the latter can be accomplished by “close kinship within the collective” (2009, 124).

Thus, there are a variety of philosophical approaches to analyzing evolutionary transition on offer, whether in terms of reproducers, multilevel selection, or Darwinian populations. The essential diachronic nature of the problem poses a unique challenge, and involves not just the interactor and replicator (or reproducer) questions, but also the questions of who is the beneficiary of the selection process, and how that new level emerges.

4. Conclusion

It makes no sense to treat different answers as competitors if they are answering different questions. We have reviewed a framework of four questions with which the debates appearing under the rubric of “units of selection” can be classified and clarified. Dawkins, Hull, and Brandon separated the classic question about the level of selection or interaction (the interactor question) from the issue of how large a chunk of the genome functions as a replicating unit (the replicator question). The interactor question should also be separated from the question of which entity should be seen as acquiring adaptations as a result of the selection process (the manifestor of adaptation question). In addition, there is a crucial ambiguity in the meaning of adaptation that is routinely ignored in these debates: adaptation as a selection product and adaptation as an engineering design. Finally, we can distinguish the issue of the entity that ultimately benefits from the selection process (the beneficiary question) from the other three questions.

This set of distinctions has been used to analyze leading points of view about the units of selection and to clarify precisely the question or combination of questions with which each of the protagonists is concerned. There are many points in the debates in which misunderstandings may be avoided by a precise characterization of which of the units of selection questions is being addressed.


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altruism: biological | biology: philosophy of | evolution | gene | genetics: evolutionary | natural selection | replication