Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Secession

1. Reference re Secession of Quebec. 1998. 2 S.C.R.

2. I have argued elsewhere that to make a plausible case for any particular view of what the claim-right to secede is turns out to be a complex enterprise, one that requires the theorist to enter the domain of the philosophy of international law. The point is that to determine whether states should refrain from interfering with a group's unilateral attempt to create a new state on a portion of the territory of an existing state requires reflection on the nature and purposes of the international legal system, including the role of states and of international commitment to the preservation of their territorial integrity. This cannot be done simply by pumping intuitions about the moral justifiability of secession in hypothetical cases, considered in isolation, without regard for the moral theory of international institutions. (Buchanan, forthcoming [a]).

3. Sunstein does not distinguish, as I have above, between an explicit constitutional right to secede and a constitutional sanction for secession in the absence of an explicit constitutional right to secede, as when secession can be achieved through constitutional amendment.

4. Norman, Wayne, 2003, “Domesticating Secession,” in S. Macedo and Allen Buchanan, eds., Secession and Self-Determination, NOMOS XLV, New York: New York University Press, forthcoming.

5. Reference re Secession of Quebec. 1998. 2 S.C.R.

6. The perceived need to provide an inducement to join the new Ethiopian state by providing a “bail out” option may have been what led the Transitional Government of Ethiopia to include a right to secede in both the Transitional Charter and the new Constitution that followed it. At a constitutional consultation in April of 1993 in which a number of other scholars participated, this author advised the Transitional Government to hedge the right to secede if they chose to include it in the new constitution. They did so in the manner indicated above.

7. This section draws on Buchanan 2006.

8. It is important to emphasize that Remedial Right Only theories only concern the grounds for a unilateral right to secede; they can recognize that consensual secessions are morally permissible.

9. Both types of Primary Right Theory allow the possibility that injustice provides one type of justification for the unilateral (claim-right) to secede. They allow unilateral secession as a remedy for injustice, but deny that injustice is the only ground for a unilateral (claim-)right to secede. They are Primary Right Theories, not Primary Right Only Theories.

10. This and the next paragraph draw on Buchanan, Allen (1998), “What's So Special About Nations?”, in Jocelyne Couture, Kai Nielsen, and Michel Seymour (eds.), Rethinking Nationalism (University of Calgary Press, Calgary).

11. I offer such an account of legitimacy in my forthcoming ‘Political Legitimacy and Democracy’ and Justice, Legitimacy, and Self-Determination.

12. UN General Assembly Resolution 2625 (XXV). Annex, Declaration on Principles of International Law concerning Friendly Relations and Co-operation among States in accordance with the Charter of the United Nations, General Assembly Official Records: Twenty-fifth Session, Suppl. No 8 (A/8028), p. 121; United Nations Yearbook, 1970, p. 788.