Arguments and Inferences

1. Arguments

An argument is a set of two or more sentences or beliefs (logicians allow arguments with no premises, but they won't be relevant here). One of the sentences or beliefs is the conclusion, the rest are premises. The premises of a good argument provide justification, warrant, evidence, or support for its conclusion.

2. Validity

Arguments differ greatly in the degree to which their premises support their conclusions. In the strongest case we say that the argument is deductively valid (or just valid, shor shot). A valid argument is one in which the conclusion must be true, if all of the premises are. In such cases we also say that the premises entail the conclusion and that the conclusion is a logical consequence of the premises. Valid arguments are non-ampliative, i.e., their conclusions do not contain any information that was not already contained in their premises.

The following sentences exhibit one common pattern of argument that still goes by its Latin name, modus ponens:

(1) If Tom lives in Los Angeles, then he's a Californian

(2) Tom lives in Los Angeles

So (3) Tom is a Californian

This argument is deductively valid in virtue of its formal structure, and all arguments with this format are deductively valid. The abstract structure here is:

(1) If P, then Q

(2) P

So (3) Q

where both occurrences of the solid line are replaced by occurrences of the same indicative sentence and both occurrences of the dotted line are replaced by occurrences of the same indicative sentence.

By contrast, the argument

(1) If Tom lives in Los Angeles, then he's a Californian.

(2) Tom is a Californian

So (3) Tom lives in Los Angeles

is deductively invalid, as is any argument with this structure. Arguments with this format can have all true premises but a false conclusion.

2.1 Systems of Logic

Different systems of formal logic provide somewhat different notions of validity or entailment, although most systems overlap to a considerable extent. To streamline things let us negate a sentence by prefixing the word ‘not’, short for ‘it is not the case that’, so that ‘It is not raining’ is abbreviated by ‘not(It is raining’). Then classical logic counts all instances of the argument forms valid:

• ‘If A, then C’, therefore ‘not Aor C
• notnotA’, therefore ‘A
• not(A and B)’, therefore ‘not A or not B
• ‘not(Everything is F)’, therefore ‘there is at least one thing that is not F’.

By contrast, intuitionistic logic counts all of them invalid.

Logic and Incommensurability

Although classical and intuitionistic propositional logic appear to disagree about whether certain patterns of inference are valid (and hence about whether certain sets of sentences are consistent) champion of incommensurability could argue, as Quine has, that the meanings of the logical vocabulary (e.g., ‘not’, ‘if, …, then …’, ‘or’, ‘all’) in each system are given by their overall roles in that system. And since their roles are different in the two logics (as shown by the fact that the logics do not validate exactly the same arguments), their meanings are different. Hence the two systems do not really disagree about anything; they simply involve different notions (the classical material conditional vs. the intuitionistic conditional, etc.).

3. Inductive Strength

Arguments that are deductively invalid are ampliative. Their conclusions contain information that is not present in their premises, they go beyond the information given in their premises. In some cases this is obvious. When we draw a conclusions about what all voters in Quebec prefer based on premises describing the preferences of a sample of Quebec voters our conclusion goes beyond the information in our premises (here to voters that we didn't sample). There is an inductive leap from the premises to the conclusion.

Going Beyond the Information Given

But some leaps are safer than others. An argument is inductively strong just in case it is ampliative and is likely to have a true conclusion if all of its premises are true. Inductive strength, unlike deductive validity, comes in degrees. For example, polls based on larger and less biased samples are better than ones based on smaller or more biased samples.

Inductive strength, unlike the deductive validity studied by logicians, is not a matter of form. To take the simplest example, all cases of induction by enumeration fit the schema

(1) All of the observed As are Bs.

So (2) the next observed A will be a B.

or

(1) All of the observed As are Bs.

So (2) all As are Bs.

But some arguments of this form are strong and others are weak. Such arguments are weak if our sample of As is small or biased or if either of the predicates is unprojectible (with respect to the other).

4. Inference

Entailment and inductive support are relations among sentences or beliefs or propositions (in a given context). By contrast, inference is an activity, something people (and perhaps other intelligent systems) do. When someone draws an inference, she extracts or extrapolates information from premises to a conclusion.

Ampliative Inference

Reasoning or inference is ampliative when we infer a conclusion that contains information that is not present in the premises or data or reasons from which we inferred it. The topic of inference is central to epistemic standards or norms, because the premises of a good inference provide reasons or justification or warrant or evidence for the conclusion that we infer.

There are many kinds of ampliative reasoning, including induction by enumeration, reasoning with analogies, causal reasoning, and theory confirmation in science. Inference to the best explanation is also a form of ampliative reasoning; with it we reason from the premise that a hypothesis would explain certain facts (e.g., the DNA samples from the ice pick, the footprints in the snow) to the conclusion that the hypothesis (e.g., the butler did it) is true.

Rules for Entailment vs. Rules of Inference

Rules in systems of deductive logics and (to the extent they exist) inductive logics (e.g., the probability calculus and inferential statistics) are not rules for reasoning or inferring. Consider our earlier valid argument:

(1) If Tom lives in Los Angeles, then he's a Californian

(2) Tom lives in Los Angeles

So (3) Tom is a Californian

As Harman (e.g., 1986) has emphasized, I may believe that both of the argument's premises are true, and when I notice they entail (3) I come to believe it as well. But it is also possible that (3) strikes me as so implausible that when I realize that it is entailed by (1) and (2) I change my mind about them and conclude that one (or both) of them is false. Or I may not be sure what to believe, but simply not care enough about where Tom lives to bother sorting things out.

Still, many thinkers urge, inference often does proceed by way of modus ponens and related rules, and logic often can tell us is that if the premises of a proposed inference are all true, then the conclusion must be true as well. Equivalently, logic affords guidelines for consistency, and consistency is desirable (something we should aim for), because having true beliefs is in general desirable, and if one's beliefs are inconsistent then at least one of them must be false.

This is not to say that formal systems can always tell us whether our beliefs or probabilities are consistent. As work by Church, Turing, and others in the 1930s demonstrates, when we are dealing with even a moderately powerful system (like first-order logic), there cannot be any fool-proof recipe that will tell us, after any finite number of steps, whether each particular set of sentences is consistent. Moreover, even in cases where there is such a procedure or algorithm, it may be too intractable, computationally, for us to use it in real time. Still, some philosophers maintain, these normative models supply rational ideals that we shouldn't violate in those cases where we can knowingly avoid it.

4.1 Logic: Examples to Accompany Main Entry

Excluded Middle

A logic validates the law of excluded middle (i.e., treats it as a logical truth) just in case it counts each substitution instance of the following schema as true:

A or not A

where A can be replaced by an indicative sentence in the (or a) language of the logical system.

Conjunctions

A conjunction, as logicians use the word, is an “and” sentence. It claims that two simpler sentences are both true. For example: ‘It was hot in Paris last summer and it was cool in London this summer’ is a conjunction. It is true just in case the two simpler sentences

• It was hot in Paris last summer.
• It was cool in London this summer.

are both true. The two simpler sentences that make up a conjunction are called conjuncts. The English connectives ‘and’, ‘but’, ‘however’, ‘although’, and ‘moreover’, typically work as conjunctions.

Conjunction elimination is the logical rule that tells us that we can infer either conjunct from a conjunction; e.g., we can infer ‘It was hot in Paris last summer’ from ‘It was hot in Paris last summer and it was cool in London this summer’. Conjunction introduction is the rule that runs the other direction, allowing us to infer a conjunction from the pair of its prospective conjuncts. Both rules embody mini-valid arguments.

More detail on various logics and styles of inferences can be found in the entries on logic, probability, confirmation, and rationality