Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Reference

1. Searle (1983) claims that to construe reference-determining content as in all cases specifiable linguistically, is to misconstrue the nature of such content. Some such content may (for instance) be perceptually based, but not linguistically specifiable.

2. That such names fail to refer is controversial. See, for instance, van Inwagen (1979), Parsons (1980), Zalta (1983), and Salmon (1998).

3. See, for instance, Salmon (1986) and Soames (1989).

4. For a formal proof of the necessity of identity in quantified modal logic, see Barcan Marcus' (1947).

5. Kripke's views on names were developed in light of Barcan Marcus's. See especially Barcan Marcus's (1961), along with the ensuing appendix, both of which appear in her (1993). The appendix contains a discussion of Barcan Marcus's 1961 paper, in which Kripke, then an undergraduate, participated.

6. For an excellent summary of these and a number of other problems for description theories, see Devitt and Sterelny (1999).

7. This problem is also noted by Donnellan (1972).

8. There are of course exceptions. See, for instance, Kent Bach (1987) who provides an extensive defense of a meta-linguistic account of proper names.

9. I say ‘adumbrated’ only because Kripke insisted that he was not presenting a ‘theory’ -- only a ‘picture.’

10. See Devitt and Sterelny (1999) for how this might be done.

11. I am assuming here that ‘gnomes’ and ‘unicorns’ don't refer to anything. But this is controversial. See the papers mentioned in note 2.

12. See, for instance, the papers in Bezuidenhout and Reimer (2003) by Kent Bach, Michael Devitt, Geoff Nunberg, and Nathan Salmon.

13. Parsons (1980) has argued for a revised version of Meinong's view, claiming that Quine's talk of a ‘bloated universe’ is exaggerated rhetoric.

14. Salmon is not the first contemporary philosopher to defend the view that ‘empty’ names refer to abstract objects. See, for instance, van Inwagen (1979) and Zalta (1983).

15. For deflationary accounts of reference see, for instance, Horwich (1998), Brandom (1994), and Field (2001)