Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Auditory Perception

1. This suggests an intuitive difference between music and visual arts such as painting and sculpture. As Kivy (1991) explains, it is difficult even with the most abstract paintings and sculptures to see them in a way that takes them to be entirely formal or abstract. That is, it is difficult to avoid seeing pictures and sculptures as representational. In contrast, it seems easier to listen attentively to the formal acoustical features of musical sounds, without being compelled to think of what makes them.

2. We might also ask whether humans are unique among animals in perceiving speech.