Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Operationalism

1. This was the title of a collection of his essays (Bridgman 1955).

2. On Bridgman's life and work in general, see Walter 1990, Holton 1995a, and Moyer 1991.

3. For a recent renewal of the notion of meaning as use, see Horwich 1998.

4. The information that this paper was given at the Fifth International Congress can be found in the reprint of the paper in Bridgman 1955, 43.

5. For further details on the material in this section, see Chang 2004, chapter 3.

6. Similarly he asked: “What is the meaning, for example, in saying that an electron when colliding with a certain atom is brought to rest in 10–18 seconds? … [S]hort intervals of time acquire meaning only in connection with the equations of electrodynamics, whose validity is doubtful and which can be tested only in terms of the space and time coordinates which enter them. Here is the same vicious circle that we found before. Once again we find that concepts fuse together on the limit of the experimentally attainable” (1927, 78).