Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Non-wellfounded Set Theory

Some basic definitions concerning measureable spaces

This supplement contains only those few definitions from measure theory which are needed in the main entry. It is mainly intended as a reminder for those who have seen the subject. Others will want to consult books on measure theory or analysis.

Let M be any set. A σ-algebra of subsets of M is a collection of subsets of M which contains M itself as an element and is closed under complement and countable union. A measurable space is a pair M = (M, Σ), where M is a set and Σ is a σ-algebra of subsets of M. The sets in Σ are called measurable sets or events. A measure on M is a function μ : Σ → [0,∞] which has the property that if S0, S1, … Sn, … is a countable collection of pairwise disjoint sets, then μ( n Sn) = Σn μ(Sn). The measure μ is a probability measure if μ(M) = 1.

For any space M, let Δ(M) be the set of probability measures on M. For any measurable set E, we define

Bp (E) = {μ ∈ Δ(M) : μ(E) ≥ p}.

We want to specify a σ-algebra Σ* on the set Δ(M). We take Σ* to be the smallest σ-algebra containing all sets of the form Bp (E) for p∈ [0,1] and E∈ Σ. So (Δ(M), Σ*) is a measurable space.

Given two measurable spaces A and B, the product space A×B is the cartesian product of the sets A and B, endowed with the σ-algebra generated by the sets of the form E×F, where E is measurable in A and F is measurable in B. For a subset EA×B, the sections of E are the sets: Ea={b:(a,b) ∈ E} and Eb={a:(a,b) ∈ E}. Each section of a measurable subset of the product is measurable.

If μ is a probability measure on A and ν a probability measure on B, we can define the probability measure μ × ν on A×B by

(μ × ν)(E)= ∫ μ(Eb) dν = ∫ ν(Ea) dμ.

(Of course, this definition refers to the notion of integration. We are not going to develop this topic here.)

Going in the other direction, a probability measure μ on A×B induces via the projections, a measure on each of the factor spaces. These measures are called marginals, and defined and denoted by

marA = μ ⋅ πA-1
marB = μ ⋅ πB-1