Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Moral Naturalism

1. Copp 2003 gives a useful survey of attempts to explicate the "natural" in talk of natural properties and makes an intriguing nonstandard proposal. Such definitional concerns are also to the fore in Sturgeon 2003 and 2006a. (Sturgeon boldly maintains that ethics comes within the purview of one of the natural sciences, namely ethics; but his naturalism is saved from triviality by his contention that moral properties and facts pull causal-explanatory weight - on which see section 4.2 below)

2. Not everyone will agree that we can understand "welfare" naturalistically. Railton's work (notably "Moral Realism" and "Facts and Values" in his 2003) is among the most interesting attempts to argue that we can.

3. Note that a sophisticated moral anti-realist might agree that moral concepts may indeed be said to signify natural properties but urge nonetheless that roughly Moorean considerations tell against moral naturalism insofar as, in contrast with the case of "water"'s picking out of H2O, not only is it not the case that the meaning of the concept determines what natural property it signifies, it is also not the case that the meaning of the concept together with the worldly facts determines what property that is. And it is in this that the openness of the question consists. This is the view defended in Gibbard 2003: see especially chapter 5 and 6. The naturalist claims that natural properties are identical to or constitute moral properties, but for Gibbard there are no moral properties, only moral concepts.

4. These writings by Brink are among the clearest of many contemporary statements of this line of objection. A classic early airing is Harman 1977, p. 19. And cf. Putnam 1981, pp. 205ff.

5. Horgan and Timmons, in the interest of developing an analogy with Putnam's famous Twin Earth thought experiments, conceive a whole planet, Moral Twin Earth as they call it.

6. On the view defended by Chalmers and Jackson 2001, "enough" may be less than what would put us in a position to offer explicit analytic definitions.

7. Many papers critical of Horgan and Timmons that I do not discuss here include Sayre-McCord 1997; Laurence, Margolis and Dawson 1999; Copp 2000.

8. For some of the central issues see e.g. Chalmers and Jackson 2001 and the works there cited and discussed.

9. Two contrasting and interesting takes on reforming definitions in metaethics are Sturgeon 1982 (critical) and Railton 1989 (friendly). Brandt 1979 and Rawls 1971 are the loci classici for the method of reforming definitions in ethics.

10. A complication is that sometimes "acting in accordance" may not be very straightforward. Thus consider what it would mean for you or me to act in accordance with our judgement that Gaius Caligula was wicked. One way to handle this would be with reference to motivation of a highly hypothetical sort. Another would be to say, in the spirit of Hare, that that one must be motivated to act in accordance with the more general standard of evaluation necessarily bound up in the judgement.

11. I'm ignoring here a still weaker form of internalism that says that there is indeed a necessary connection between moral judgements and motivation but it's of a "for the most part" sort. Necessarily moral judgement is connected to motivation most of the time but consistently with that there can be occasional cases where moral judgement fails to motivate. Such a view is endorsed by e.g. Geach 1956 and Wiggins 1993.

12. This is contestible of course. It's a version of the so-called Humean Theory of Motivation that says no belief state can motivate, in and of itself, restricted to the case of beliefs about natural facts. Dropping the restriction of course generalizes the problem to cover realism more generally. However the mainstream of contemporary moral naturalists is united in resisting internalism. The option of seeking to accommodate internalism by resisting the HTM has tended to find more favour among realists of a nonnaturalist sort, notably McNaughton in his 1988. Cf. also McDowell 1979. Shafer-Landau, who styles himself a nonnaturalist, argues against both internalism and HTM in his 2003. On HTM, the literature is huge: Smith 1994, chapter 4 is the most influential contemporary discussion (and defence). Other strategies have been proposed to resist this internalist dialectic, Wedgwood, 2001 and Tresan, 2006 being notably interesting recent cases in point.

13. Similar diagnoses can found in Lenman 1999. See also Smith 1994, chapter 3. Smith there develops an intriguing parallel between the moral judgements of the amoralist and the colour judgements of the congenitally blind. It's worth noting that Smith characterizes internalism somewhat idiosyncratically compared to the mainstream of the literature as the belief that moral judgements necessarily motivate one insofar as one is rational. (The qualification is crucial to his primary dialectical purpose of reconciling internalism and the Humean Theory of Motivation with moral realism.)

14. Also much discussed in the literature are states of depression or listlessness. (See Stocker 1979; Mele 2003, chapter 5.) Even if we are not amoralists we are subject to such states. You have, let us say, some moral belief to the effect that you should do something and on a good day you care very much about doing it and are well motivated to. But today is not a good day. You are low, listless, sapped of all motivation to do anything including the stuff you continue to believe and assert you ought to do. Those who are impressed by the line of internalist response to the amoralist problem aired above may be tempted by analogous moves which stress that the listless person's moral judgements are parasitic on her judgements when not so afflicted in much the way the amoralist's are on those of others.

15. Surprising certainly. Whether we also say "inappropriate" depends on whether we take the implicature to be conventional or conversational. Copp takes it to be conventional. Finlay 2005 makes a case for preferring a conversational reading.

16. Expressivists may accept this in some suitably deflationary sense of "fact".

17. Among other important discussions of internalism about reasons, it is maybe worth singling out Smith 1994, chapter 3. Much of this is concerned with Foot's "Morality as a System of Hypothetical Imperatives" in her 1978, still perhaps the locus classicus. Foot has since abandoned her earlier externalism and adopted an understanding of practical reason which is thoroughly moralized. On her later view the amoralist's challenge is indeed incoherent. Discussing this late Footian position in my 2006, I suggest that there is indeed a coherent challenge here but it is best understood as a question about the relationship between one bunch of reasons and another.

18. See all works cited in bibliography. Thomson perhaps doesn't fit all that neatly here: she seldom cites Aristotle and there are fewer echoes of Aristotelian biology in her work than in those of the other authors listed. But the considerable and evident influence on her work of Geach, Foot, and Anscombe places her at least very close to this tradition. Arguably the list should include John McDowell. McDowell is certainly pervasively inspired by Aristotle and he describes himself as a naturalist. See especially his 1995. But I suspect many philosophers would find his use of the term "naturalist" here somewhat Pickwickian. Certainly it's noteworthy that Miller in his 2003 entitles a chapter devoted to McDowell "Contemporary Non-Naturalism"!

19. As is argued ably by Hull 1998 and Kitcher in his splendid 1999.

20. Chapter 11 of Kitcher 1985 makes this case authoritatively. Metaethical relevance of a more negative nature is perhaps another story: see here a fascinating recent paper by Sharon Street (2006) in which she deploys considerations drawn from evolutionary biology to argue against moral realism, including moral naturalism.

21. For Williams views on Aristotelian ethics see his 1985, chapter 3. See also the beautifully lucid and concise discussion in the (unnumbered) chapter at pp. 69-76 of Williams 1972 entitled "Moral Standards and the Distinguishing Mark of Man"

22. For a sparkling critique of Nussbaum see Antony 2000.

23. This is a central concern in Copp and Sobel's well-judged critique (Copp and Sobel 2004, pp. 539-543).

24. For more discussion of Hursthouse and Foot see Copp and Sobel 2004, pp. 532-543; Lenman 2006.

25. My account draws on her 1996, 1997 and 2001.

26. She makes it clear here that the list is not meant to be exhaustive.

27. 1996 (pp. 143-144) and 1997 (pp. 294-298) are both rather less doubtful about the want story.

28. As a consequence of this she denies (ibid., pp. 284-285) that e.g. courage and industriousness are virtues as it is better for us if those who are unjust lack these traits.

29. In 2001 only two ways of being vicious, injustice and miserliness, come into the frame.

30. For critical discussion of Anscombe see Lenman 2006.

31. See all works by these cited in the bibliography.

32. The confirmational holism occupies the foreground of Sturgeon 1985, 2002, Boyd 1988, Brink, 1989, pp. 136-138. The coherentism is defended in detail in Brink 1989 chapter 5, Sturgeon 2002. See also Sayre-McCord 1996.

33. These remarks, perhaps a little ironically, echo Sturgeon's main line of objection to Brandt in his 1982.

34. For similar thoughts cf. Wright's important discussion of "width of cosmological role" in his 1992, chapter 5.

35. My discussion is focused on Jackson 1998. Here he simply assumes the truth of cognitivism. But he has interesting arguments against noncognitivism elsewhere. See Jackson 1999, Jackson and Pettit 1998, 2003.

36. My aim here is to explain the main somewhat formal idea as clearly as I can. In this I don't expect to compete with Lewis 1972 which every student of philosophy should read. Other accessible explanations of the central idea that focus on the moral case are in Smith 1994, chapter 2 and Miller 2003, chapter 9. For more on the notion of Ramsey sentences in the context of their primary contemporary habitat in the philosophy of mind, see further Janet Levin's entry on functionalism, especially section 4.

37. In fairness Smith does not say so: his 1994 obviously significantly predates Jackson 1998!

38. To keep the length of this entry within reasonable bounds, I have omitted in this section to discuss the work of many important contemporary naturalist philosophers. The most important such omission is the rich and influential work of Peter Railton. His principal relevant writings are listed in the bibliography. Useful critical discussions include Sobel 1994, Rosati 1995b, Miller 2003, chapter 9, Kelly 2004.

39. Many thanks to David Copp for his helpful input on an earlier draft.