Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Sep 17, 2008; substantive revision Tue Mar 19, 2013

Proper names are familiar expressions of natural language. Their semantics remains a contested subject in the philosophy of language, with those who believe a descriptive element belongs in their meaning (whether at the level of intension or at the level of character) ranged against supporters of the more austere Millian view.

1. Syntax

Proper names are distinguished from proper nouns. A proper noun is a word-level unit of the category noun, while proper names are noun phrases (syntagms) (Payne and Huddleston 2002, 516). For instance, the proper name ‘Jessica Alba’ consists of two proper nouns: ‘Jessica’ and ‘Alba’. Proper names may consist of other parts of speech, too: ‘Brooklyn Bridge’ contains the common noun ‘Bridge’ as well as the proper noun ‘Brooklyn’. ‘The Raritan River’ also includes the determiner ‘the’. ‘The Bronx’ combines a determiner and a proper noun. Finally, ‘the Golden Gate Bridge’ is a proper name with no proper nouns in it at all.

While any string of words (or non-words) can be a proper name, we may (tentatively) locate that liberality in the form of proper nouns. Proper names, by contrast, simply have a large number of paradigms corresponding to the sorts of things named (Carroll 1985). For instance, official names of persons in most Western cultures consist of (at least) first and last names (themselves proper nouns). Names of bridges have an optional definite determiner and often contain the common noun ‘bridge’. Hence we can have bridge names that embed other proper names like ‘The George Washington Bridge’. We can also have structurally ambiguous names like ‘the New New York Public Library’.

Names are often (Geurts 1997, Anderson 2006) claimed to be syntactically “definite,” since they can occur with markers of definiteness, such as the definite article in English. Since definite expressions include pronouns, demonstratives and definite descriptions, this evidence is often used to support views on which names are subsumed to one of these categories (Larson and Segal 1995, Elbourne 2005), though it is also consistent with names forming their own species of definite.

What we might call proper nominals (proper names without their determiner) can modify other nouns, as in ‘a Bronx resident’. They can also occur as the restrictors of determiners other than ‘the’, as in ‘every Alfred’. Some (notably Burge [1973]—see the Description Theory below) take such non-argumental occurrences as consitituting their primary use (in a theoretical, rather than statistical sense). However, it might seem more natural, pre-theoretically, to regard such occurrences as on a par with “coerced” expressions such as the verb ‘googled’.

Is there just one proper name ‘Alice’ or are there many homonyms (‘Alice-1’, ‘Alice-2’, etc.)? On the one hand, it is tempting to infer the uniqueness of the name, on syntactic grounds, from the uniqueness of the proper noun (arguably the same noun recurs in the names ‘Alice Waters’ and ‘Alice Walker’, as well as in the phrase ‘two famous Alices’). On the other hand, there is pressure from semantics to recognize multiple homonyms (or else large-scale ambiguity). For instance, if the meaning of a name is its referent, then there is either one ambiguous name ‘Alice’, with as many meanings as there are individuals named Alice, or many univocal names with identical spelling (see Kripke 1980, 8 and especially Kaplan 1990 for the latter view). If instead the meaning of a name corresponds to a rule determining, or constraining, its reference in a context, then there is no pressure to adopt either expedient.

2. Semantics

2.1 Millianism

J. S. Mill is given credit (and naming rights) for the commonsense view that the semantic contribution of a name is its referent (and only its referent). For instance, the semantic value of the name ‘Aristotle’ is Aristotle himself (note that this assumes that, by ‘Aristotle’, a particular, as opposed to generic, name is intended—see Syntax above). It is unlikely that Mill was the first to hold this view (Mill's argument that a town could still with propriety be called ‘Dartmouth’ even though it didn't lie at the mouth of the Dart River engages with a dialectic as old as Plato's Cratylus), which underwent a revival in the second half of the twentieth century, beginning with Ruth Barcan Marcus 1961.

Frege's puzzle of ‘the Morning Star’ and ‘the Evening Star’ challenges the Millian conception of names (note that while Frege used ‘proper name’ [Eigenname] to cover singular terms generally, both expressions seem to be proper names of a sort—“star” names—see Syntax). For while both expressions have the same referent (the planet Venus), they do not seem equivalent in cognitive significance, nor do they contribute in the same way to the truth conditions of all sentences in which they occur. In particular, they cannot be substituted salva veritate (preserving truth) in the scope of propositional attitude verbs (this claim is subject to dispute—see Salmon 1986):

  1. Homer believed that the Morning Star was the Morning Star. (True)
  2. Homer believed that the Morning Star was the Evening Star. (False)

Russell (1911) required that a propositional attitude holder be acquainted with each of the components of the proposition in question. This presents a further problem for the Millian view, for it seems that one can believe the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘Aristotle was wise’ without personally being acquainted with Aristotle, suggesting that Aristotle is not himself contributed to that proposition.

Even if we don't find Russell's epistemological views persuasive, names without a referent (e.g. ‘Atlantis’) pose a problem for Millianism. For it is plausible that the sentence ‘Atlantis lies to the west of Gibraltar’ expresses a proposition (and one distinct from that expressed by ‘El Dorado lies to the west of Gibraltar’, for someone might believe the former without believing the latter) and yet on the Millian view ‘Atlantis’ does not contribute anything to the semantic content of the sentence (and hence nothing over and above what ‘El Dorado’ might contribute).

Millians have made responses to all three of these objections. For Frege's puzzle, see, to begin with, Crimmins and Perry 1983, Richard 1983, Salmon 1986, Soames 1987 and 1989. For the puzzle of empty names, see Braun 1993 and the essays in Everett and Hofweber 2000. Russell's conditions on singular thought are now generally viewed as overly stringent, and it is common to assume that we are in a position to entertain a proposition with Aristotle as a constituent (see, for instance, Kaplan 2012).

2.2 Sense Theories

Frege's (1952) answer to his own puzzle was to add an additional tier, of Sinn or “sense,” to the referential semantic value of a name. While ‘the Morning Star’ and ‘the Evening Star’ have the same reference, or ground-floor semantic value, the expressions differ at the level of sense.

Frege left his notion of sense somewhat obscure. Subsequent theorists have discerned a theoretical role unifying several distinct functions (cf. Kripke 1980, 59; Burge 1977, 356). First, as just remarked, an expression has a sense (along with a Bedeutung or reference) as part of its semantic value. Its sense is its contribution to the thought (proposition) expressed by a sentence in which it occurs. Names, considered as generic syntactic types, most likely do not have senses as their lingustic meanings. However, any successful use of a generic name (or perhaps any “particular” name) will express a complete sense. Second, the sense of an expression determines its reference. Third, sense encapsulates the cognitive significance of an expression. In the last capacity, the sense of a sentence—a thought (proposition)—must obey Frege's intuitive criterion of difference (Evans 1982). Roughly, any two sentences that may simultaneously be held to have opposite truth-values by the same rational agent must express different thoughts.

Take ‘the Morning Star’ and ‘the Evening Star’. In addition to referring to Venus, each of these names has a sense. The sense in each case determines (perhaps with respect to some parameter) the referent Venus. Additionally, the senses encapsulate the cognitive significance of each expression. This implies that the senses of the two names are different, since the thought expressed by (3) is distinct from the thought expressed by (4) (from the intuitive criterion of difference, and the fact that someone might think (3) is true but (4) is false).

  1. The Morning Star is the Morning Star
  2. The Morning Star is the Evening Star

Neo-Fregeans have come up with a host of candidates for the role of sense. These candidates do not always satify all of Frege's requirements (though they usually satisfy at least one), making the Neo-Fregean camp somewhat heterogeneous. For example, Michael Devitt (1981) takes senses to be causal-historical chains linking utterances of names to their referents (see the Causal-Historical Theory below). For him, senses play a role in semantics (by constraining the notion of synonymy and the truth conditions of attitude reports) without encapsulating the cognitive significance of an expression for a group of speakers. John McDowell (1977) provides an account of sense that fills the cognitive and reference-determining roles Frege ascribed to it, without adopting a two-tiered semantic theory (that is to say, without reifying sense as a semantic value). He associates the sense of a name with an appropriately stated clause in a Tarskian truth theory (making it possible to state what one must know to have the sense but not what the sense itself consists in).

Perhaps the best known account (emerging from the work of Carnap [1947] and Church [1951]) treats sense as intension. An intension is a function from possible worlds to extensions. For instance, the intension of ‘the number of planets’ is a function that, given a possible world w, returns a number—the number of planets at w. The extension of an expression at the actual world corresponds to its reference (in the case of ‘the number of planets’ this is 8); thus intension can be said to determine reference (relative to a world parameter). Moreover, if we take propositions to be functions from possible worlds to truth-values (i.e., intensions of sentences), then we can easily treat the intension of a noun phrase as its compositional contribution to the proposition expressed by a sentence. Finally, the intension of a definite description can be seen to correspond to its cognitive significance. The significance of a definite description ‘the F’ is presumably the information that allows one to discriminate possible worlds based (only) on who or what is (uniquely) F. The intension of a definite description partitions logical space (i.e., the set of all possible worlds) in precisely this manner.

We can cook up an intension for a name N by finding a (proper) definite description ‘the F’ true of the referent of the name at the actual world, and then setting the intension of N to the function that takes a world w and outputs the F at w. Indeed, for any intelligible intension for a name, there is a corresponding definite description. The view of sense as intension thus has many of the same features (and, as we will see, drawbacks) as the Description Theory of names.

2.3 The Description Theory

The Description Theory of names (a.k.a. descriptivism) says that each name N has the semantic value of some definite description ‘the F’. For instance, ‘Aristotle’ might have the semantic value of ‘the teacher of Alexander the Great’. As stated, this view is consistent with Millianism (it would be Millianism if we assumed that the semantic value of a definite description was the individual it referred to), however in practice it is always coupled with a view on which definite descriptions have either a Russellian (see the section on Russell's theory in the entry on descriptions) or an intensional semantics (see the section on Sense Theories above). In the latter case, descriptivism corresponds to the intensional interpretation of Frege's sense theory. It should be noted that Montague's (1973) treatment of names as denoting higher-order functions (i.e., quantifier denotations) does not belong under this heading. It was adopted for reasons of type consilience, rather than descriptivist intuitions. Moreover, his first meaning postulate imposes an intensionally rigid (see the next section) interpretation on names.

Russell is the earliest proponent of the Description Theory (see Sainsbury 1993 for a dissenting view). He applied it to ordinary, but not what he called “logically proper” names (the latter were in fact demonstratives like ‘this’ and ‘that’, and he gave them a Millian semantics). In conjunction with his semantics for definite descriptions, he used the theory to solve the puzzles mentioned in the last section, without resorting to a two-tiered semantic theory (see Sense Theories above). ‘The Morning Star’ and ‘the Evening Star’ (as well as ‘Atlantis’ and ‘El Dorado’) might correspond in semantic value to different definite descriptions, and so would make different semantic contributions to the sentences in which they occur (semantic contribution must, as on the sense theory, be connected with cognitive significance, if Russellian descriptivism is to answer Frege's puzzle). Moreover, a thinker can often be acquainted (on Russell's view) with the property F in the semantic value of the corresponding description where they cannot be acquainted with the individual the name refers to.

Famous deeds descriptivism is exemplified by the interpretation of ‘Aristotle’ as ‘the teacher of Alexander the Great’. Note that the latter description also contains a proper name, which will in turn be interpreted as a definite description. The hope is that this description will not mention Aristotle, and indeed that ultimately every description will bottom out in irreducible predicates (or “logically proper” names) rather than entering a loop (which would mean that we have not specified, only constrained, the semantic values in question). Like many exercises of this sort, this translation has never been carried out.

Some obvious problems with famous deeds descriptivism have been recognized. The choice of ‘the teacher of Alexander the Great’ as the description synonymous with ‘Aristotle’ seems arbitrary; why not ‘the most famous pupil of Plato’? Not only that, but at birth Aristotle was so-named, but not yet known as, for he had not yet become, the teacher of Alexander the Great. Finally, the vast majority of names belong to people (or inanimate objects) that have never performed any deed worthy of note. Two improvements of famous deeds descriptivism have been suggested. One is cluster descriptivism, put forward by Searle (1958) and Strawson (1959; 180 ff.), which says that a name corresponds to a definite description whose nominal is a disjunction (or more complex collocation) of predicates like ‘teacher of Alexander’ and ‘most famous pupil of Plato’. Since this approach doesn't address the problem of the cognitive significance of ‘Aristotle’ soon after his birth, it is often combined with context-sensitive descriptivism. On this view the semantic value of a name, while it is always that of some description, differs from context to context (even when the name is being used to speak about the same individual). So Aristotle's mother might have used the name ‘Aristotle’ with a different semantic value (corresponding to a different (cluster-)description) to a present-day Aristotle scholar. Frege (1952, 1956) and Russell seem to have held the context-sensitive view. Wittgenstein is often cited as a proponent of the cluster view, but attention to the text (1953, section 79) reveals that he is advocating context-sensitivity.

Metalinguistic descriptivism says that a proper name N has the semantic value of the definite description ‘the individual called N’ (Russell 1956, Kneale 1962, Bach 1981, Geurts 1997, Fara to appear). This suggestion has the advantage that the name's descriptive content is known to all speakers of the language, but has the disadvantage that, in most cases, the description is not proper (for example, there is more than one individual called ‘Alice’). Furthermore, it may not provide a satisfactory answer to Frege's puzzle, as Frege himself denied that the cognitive significance of a sentence like (4) was metalinguistic.

Tyler Burge (1973) finds support for the metalinguistic view in non-argumental occurrences of names, which often take on a metalinguistic interpretation, as in (5) (though this interpretation is not inevitable, cf. (6)):

  1. There are relatively few Alfreds in Princeton.
  2. There are relatively few Picassos at the Met.

Burge overcomes the problem of the impropriety of the metalinguistic description by treating names used as arguments as complex demonstratives (with a context-sensitive analysis; check Burge 1973 for the details), so he is properly speaking a “demonstrativist.”

Metalinguistic descriptivism is commonly presented in a package with the view that proper nominals (see Syntax above) are metalinguistic predicates (so the nominal ‘Alfred’ is a predicate true of individuals that are so called). The latter view accounts for (5) on its metalinguistic interpretation, and provides a compositional analysis of proper names consisting of ‘the’ followed by a proper nominal as metalinguistic definite descriptions. An unvoiced definite article must be posited for proper names that do not carry one overtly, so that all proper names, under analysis, resemble those of Modern Greek (a less remarked-upon fact about Modern Greek is that the definite article also shows up between demonstrative and nominal in complex demonstratives).

Compositional metalinguistic analyses of names have recently been defended by linguists and philosophers (Matushansky 2008; Fara to appear). Nevertheless, considerable obstacles remain for such analyses and for the general treatment of proper nominals as metalinguistic predicates. Most straightforwardly, it is not strictly speaking true to say that the Raritan River is called Raritan (it is called the Raritan), or that the Bronx is named Bronx (it is named the Bronx – cf. Geurts 1999: 209, which discusses examples that work differently). Nor is a Bronx resident a resident called Bronx, but rather one who resides in the Bronx. Even worse difficulties crop up for views that attempt to analyze the meaning of a nominal like ‘George Washington Bridge’ as the intersection of the meanings of its component nouns (as Matushansky 2008: 603–4 does).

The metalinguistic interpretation of non-argumental occurrences of names does not, in the end, support metalinguistic descriptivism. As Fara herself points out, any word can take on a metalinguistic interpretation in the right context (she gives the example below in Fara to appear):

  1. I gave my cat the name ‘Hominid’ and you gave your dog the same name; between us we have two Hominids.

But if every word can also be used as a predicate with a metalinguistic interpretation, then the parsimonious approach would be to explain this as semantic polysemy or by a general coercion mechanism (much like the mechanism of deferred interpretation Fara discusses) that can derive a metalinguistic interpretation of any word used as a predicate. In the absence of such a mechanism, one would need to stipulate an additional metalinguistic interpretation for ‘hominid’ (along with every other word). However, with such a mechanism in place, it is no more parsimonious to begin with the predicate interpretation of names and derive the argumental interpretation compositionally, than it is to begin with the argumental interpretation and derive the predicate interpretation using the aforementioned mechanism.

2.4 Attacks on Descriptivism

There are three well-known arguments against description and sense theories of names (the latter on the interpretation of sense as intension).

Kripke's modal argument (1980, 48-9) contends that names and definite descriptions differ in their “modal profiles” (see also Marcus's [1947] proof of the necessity of identity statements involving names). Names are rigid designators which is to say that their intension is constant across metaphysically possible worlds (where defined). Definite descriptions like ‘the teacher of Alexander’, on the other hand, have non-constant intensions. Kripke backs up this taxonomy with intuitions about ‘might have’ modal sentences (taken in the “ontic” or “metaphysical” rather than the epistemic sense). For instance, while the first sentence sounds true on this reading, the second sounds false:

  1. Aristotle might not have been the teacher of Alexander
  2. Aristotle might not have been Aristotle

Kripke's epistemic argument (1980, 78; 87) is closely related, but trades on epistemic, rather than metaphysical, modality. His argument is not that names are rigid in epistemic contexts. That would be a hard sell, as (10) is true on its epistemic reading (Kripke 1980, 103-4):

  1. The Morning Star might have turned out not to have been the Evening Star

Instead, he argues that no definite description D has the same semantic value as the name ‘Aristotle' (say), because otherwise the sentence (10) would be analytic, and so knowable a priori. (Kripke argues [1980, 68ff] that even the sentence ‘Aristotle is the individual called “Aristotle”’—supplied by the metalinguistic description theory—is not knowable a priori.)

  1. Aristotle is D

The semantic argument, due to Donnellan (1972) and Kripke (1980, 80ff), and related to the externalist arguments of Putnam (1975) and Burge (1979), drives a wedge between Frege's two semantic levels of sense and reference (see Sense Theories above). Sense, for Frege, constitutes the semantic contribution of an expression to the thought (proposition) expressed (and hopefully communicated) on an occasion of utterance. It comprises the cognitive significance of a term for a group of communicating agents. However, the argument goes, a sense understood in this way might not determine the correct reference. For instance, in a certain group the cognitive significance carried by the name ‘Peano’ might be the same as that of the description ‘the discoverer of the Peano axioms’ (the assumption is that the members of the group believe no more and no less than this about Peano), yet as it turns out Dedekind, not Peano, discovered the (misnamed) axioms. The problem is that the intension of ‘the discoverer of the Peano axioms’ maps the actual world onto Dedekind, and so is a presentation of the referent Dedekind, rather than a presentation of the referent of ‘Peano’. Thus the “sense” that captures the cognitive significance of ‘Peano’ (in a certain group) does not also determine the reference of ‘Peano’.

Kripke (1980, 81) and Donnellan (1972, 343) also point out that the cognitive significance of a name for a group might not amount to an intension (a function from worlds to extensions) at all. Kripke gives the example of the name ‘Feynman’ to which the members of a certain group attach the indefinite description ‘a physicist’, which is insufficient, due to the popularity of the profession, to single anyone out, let alone Feynman himself. (The members of the group presumably also attach the metalinguistic information ‘is called “Feynman”’, but this will still be insufficient if there is more than one so-named physicist.) This point is relevant to the Description Theory, as it would appear that in this case the semantic/cognitive value of the name ‘Feynman’ corresponds to that of either an indefinite description (‘a physicist’) or else an improper definite description (‘the physicist’).

As Ben Caplan (2007) points out these same arguments apply to Millians who attempt to account for Fregean intuitions of cognitive significance and substitution failure by suggesting that uses of names in context additionally assert or suggest some descriptive content (for instance, Soames 2002 and Thau 2002).

2.5 The Causal-Historical Theory of Reference

Kripke and Donnellan (and, anticipating them, Peter Geach 1969) offer an externalist alternative to the theory that cognitive significance determines reference (see the entry on externalism about mental content). Donnellan argues that an “omniscient being who sees the whole history of the affair” (1972, 355) is in better shape to determine the referent of a particular name than one who limits themselves to the (possibly distorted or attenuated) descriptive content associated with the name by a group of agents. Kripke (1980, 91) suggests that the reference of a name is established by a dubbing ceremony (or “baptism”) at which the dubee is indicated by a demonstration or uniquely referring description. All uses of the name that derive from this source (uses deriving from the baptism itself, or acquired from someone who was present at the baptism, or from someone who acquired it from someone who was present at the baptism, etc.) refer to the original dubee, even if the speaker associates the name with a description that is untrue of that dubee.

Evans (1973) offers the case of ‘Madagascar’ as a counterexample to Kripke's externalist theory. That name originally referred to a portion of mainland Africa, but its reference subsequently shifted to the island off the coast, as a result of a miscommunication propagated by Marco Polo. Despite the fact that there is a continuous “chain” of derived uses of the name ‘Madagascar’ going back to the baptism of the mainland, the name as used now refers to an island.

Kripke includes the following caveat in his account of the reference-passing links in a causal-historical chain:

When the name is ‘passed from link to link’, the receiver of the name must, I think, intend when he learns it to use it with the same reference as the man from whom he heard it. If I hear the name ‘Napoleon’ and decide it would be a nice name for my pet aardvark, I do not satisfy this condition. (Kripke 1980: 96)

Kripke's condition distinguishes reference-passing from what we might call “vehicle-passing” or etymological relation. It is the latter that Leigh Fermor chronicles in the following passage:

The Roman imperial mantle on Greek shoulders has led to a splendid confusion; for the word ‘Rum’, on Oriental tongues, referred not only to the Christian Byzantines – they are so styled in the Koran – but, for a century or two, to their conquered territory in Asia Minor; it designated the empire of the Seldjuk Turks in Anatolia with its capital at Konia (Iconium), reigned over by the ‘Sultans of Rum’. To tangle matters still further the word Romania was often used in the West, especially during the crusades, to specify the parts of the Eastern Empire which lay in Europe; the Turks extended ‘Rum’ into ‘Rumeli’, (‘land of the Rumis‘) to cover the same area. One still finds the confusing word ‘Rumelia’ on old maps. (In Greece, Rumeli now specifically applies to the great mountainous stretch of continental Greece running from the Adriatic to the Aegean, north of the Gulf of Corinth and south of Epirus and Thessaly.) (Leigh Fermor 1966, 98)

When the Turks applied the word ‘Rum’ to their conquered territory, they were influenced in their choice by a previous use of the same word to refer to the Byzantine Empire, but they did not intend to use the word in exactly the same way. Though not as dramatic as calling one's pet aardvark ‘Napoleon‘, this is a case in which the intentional condition is not satisfied. It is conceivable that all true cases of a vehicle changing its reference are purposeful, and hence break the causal-historical chain by violating this condition.

Kripke himself admits (1980, 93; 97) that his rough account provides something less than an airtight theory. Even if the determinants of a name's reference are more complex than Kripke's simplified tale would allow, they do seem to remain in the purview of the “being who sees the whole history of the affair.” and do not correspond to the description summing up the cognitive significance of the name for its users.

Causal descriptivism (Loar 1976, Lewis 1984, Kroon 1987, Jackson 1998) considers a token of a name t to have the semantic value of the definite description ‘the individual dubbed in the ceremony connected by a causal-historical chain to t’. While this view illustrates the peculiar resilience of descriptivism, its detractors claim that such a description will not capture the cognitive significance of the name-token (especially among those unacquainted with the causal-historical account of reference).

2.6 Descriptivist Replies

On Russell's theory of definite descriptions, they are quantifiers, and as such can in principle take wide or narrow scope with respect to sentential operators. As Dummett points out (1973, 110-151), this means that all Kripke's modal argument shows is that names (considered as descriptions) obligatorily take wide scope with respect to metaphysical modal operators. A representation of (9) on which the names (each interpreted as the description ‘the teacher of Alexander’) take wide scope (giving a reading that is false) appears below:

  1. x(∀z(teach-alex zz = x) ∧ ∃y(∀z(teach-alex zz = y) ∧ ◊ xy)))

There is a problem with this approach, however (see Soames 1998). Since names must sometimes take narrow scope in attitude contexts (in order to account for Fregean intuitions), a sentence where the name appears (on the surface) below an attitude verb which is itself in the scope of a metaphysical modal would place conflicting requirements on the putative scope of a name:

  1. Homer might have believed that the Morning Star is the Evening Star

On the favoured reading (on which the proposition Homer might have believed is non-trivial), (13) provides a counterexample to the proposed rule that names take scope over metaphysical modals (there might, of course, be a more complex rule in play that can explain both judgments—viz. that names take scope over metaphysical modals unless doing so will cause them to scope over an attitude verb).

Kripke's modal argument claims that names differ from definite descriptions in that they are rigid designators. However, certain definite descriptions designate rigidly too. For instance, the extension of ‘the even prime’ is 2 at every possible world. A popular descriptivist response to the modal argument is then to semantically equate names with rigid definite descriptions. Indeed, we can inoculate existing description theories against the modal argument by the process of rigidification. Two ways to rigidify a non-rigid definite description have been explored. One is to prefix it with a term-forming dthat operator (Kaplan 1978). Another is to apply the “actually” operator to the nominal restrictor of the description. These procedures are described below.

The “actually” operator in modal logic is supposed to mirror the behavior of the English adverb ‘actually’ and adjective ‘actual’ in the examples below:

  1. I thought your yacht was longer than it actually is.
  2. The actual teacher of Alexander might not have taught Alexander.

Models for the interpretation of modal logic consist of a pointed set (i.e., a set with a designated member) of possible worlds, an accessibility relation, and a valuation function. The designated world, also known as the actual world, is required to define truth in such structures (as opposed to global truth or satisfiability). Actualist modal logics include an operator @ (the “actually” operator) that shifts the point of evaluation of the formula in its scope back to the actual world. It follows that while the intension of the description ‘the number of planets’ picks out a different number at certain different possible worlds, the intension of ‘the @(number of planets)’ picks out 8 at every world (making it rigid). This is because the predicate ‘@(number of planets)’ is true, at a world w, of whatever the predicate ‘number of planets’ is true of at the actual world. In general, adding the ‘actually’ operator takes a possibly nonrigid definite description ‘the F’ and turns it into a description ‘the @(F)’ whose intension rigidly picks out the object that is F in the actual world.

Rigidification comes at a cost. Prior to rigidification, we could distinguish the descriptivist intensions of the names ‘the Morning Star’ and ‘the Evening Star’. However, once they are rigidified (for instance to ‘the @(heavenly body seen in the morning)’ and ‘the @(heavenly body seen in the evening)’) their intensions coincide (as the constant function that picks out Venus relative to every possible world). Thus we can no longer distinguish their cognitive values on an intensionalist sense theory. Those who adopt actualist rigidification therefore tend to be Russellians, and equate the semantic/cognitive value of a name not with its intension, but with a structured function (the contribution a Russellian definite description makes to a structured proposition). With this technology, theorists can distinguish the values of the two descriptions above, since they are structures with different components (cf. Carnap's [1947] notion of intensional isomorphism).

Explaining rigidification by the dthat term-forming operator requires some further setup, provided in the following section.

Before moving on, note that certain non-rigid definite descriptions, such as ‘the man in the corner’, pattern with names rather than with the “role-type” definite descriptions in examples like (8) (the terminology, and its exegesis, can be found in Rothschild 2007). In other words, the modal argument does not distinguish ordinary names from a broad class of “particularized” definite descriptions. Moreover, certain special names, such as ‘Miss America’, behave in much the same way as role-type descriptions.

2.7 The Character of Names

On Kaplan's (1989) semantics of indexical expressions (see the relevant section of the entry on indexicals), the character of an expression is distinguished from its content relative to a context. Indexicals, like the pronoun ‘I’, receive a different content (they are used to refer to different individuals) in different contexts. Kaplan nevertheless thought something remained constant in different contexts—the linguistic meaning of ‘I’. He proposed to identify this meaning with a function from contexts to contents (what he called the “character” of ‘I’). In the case of the first-person pronoun, this function maps a context c onto the speaker in c. The character of ‘I’ thus corresponds to the linguistic rule that ‘I’ picks out the speaker of the context.

As Kaplan (1989, 529ff) emphasizes, character has affinities with Frege's notion of sense. It corresponds to a level of linguistic meaning distinct from reference. It also captures (at a certain level) the cognitive significance of an indexical expression for those competent in the language. As with Frege's notion, there is a connection between character and definite descriptions. Kaplan (1978) introduced a term-forming expression, dthat, which combines with a definite description. The character of this complex term corresponds to the intension of the embedded definite description (i.e., the function that maps any world w onto the unique object that satisfies the descriptive content in w). That is to say, the character of the term ‘dthat(the F)’ is the function that maps any context c onto the constant function from worlds to the object that is F in c. For example, ‘dthat(the speaker)’ (simplifying somewhat) has the same character as ‘I’. Adding the operator thus rigidifies the description by projecting its descriptive content onto the level of character.

A name, considered as a generic syntactic type (see Syntax above), refers to different individuals depending on the context. We might therefore treat the generic name ‘Alice’ as having a character equivalent to ‘dthat(the individual called “Alice”)’. The cognitive significance ascribed to a generic name, on this account (corresponding to its character), is the same as that ascribed by metalinguistic descriptivists (on their account, corresponding to its intension). Indeed, this account is simply a rigidified version of metalinguistic descriptivism (for a view close to this one, see Pelczar and Raisbury 1998).

On the other hand, if names are individuated, as Kripke and Kaplan would have it, by naming ceremony (see Syntax), a different view of the character of names applies. Just as the reference of ‘I’ depends on who is speaking, the reference of ‘Alice-1’ (a particular name of the generic form ‘Alice’) depends on the individual dubbed in an earlier naming ceremony. We might treat the character of ‘Alice-1’ as follows (Haas-Spohn 1995):

  1. The individual dubbed in the ceremony that is the source (in c) of ‘Alice-1’

Once again, this is a rigidified version of an existing description theory, viz. causal descriptivism. Other versions of descriptivism that we have seen so far could also be rigidified using the dthat operator. The context-sensitive theory, on which the nominal predicate is itself provided by context is an interesting (and extremely powerful) variant.

A general problem that the “character-descriptivist” accounts above must face is Frege's puzzle of the failure of coreferring names to intersubstitute salva veritate in propositional attitude contexts. Propositional attitude reports containing names that differ in character but not content, on the standard semantics provided by Kaplan (1989), will themselves not differ in content (and thus truth-value). In order to parlay a difference in character into a difference in truth-value, propositional attitude verbs would need to operate on character rather than content. This approach is defended in Recanati 2000 and Schlenker 2003. Two-dimensional semantics (Jackson 1998, Chalmers 2004) instead identifies two different kinds of intension, one of which is closely related to character (it is a function from contexts or epistemically possible states to extensions) and serves as the object of attitudes.

Kaplan himself rules out contextual variation (i.e., a non-constant character) in names. As he writes (1989, 563):

Those who suggest that proper names are merely one species of indexical depreciate the power and the mystery of the causal chain theory.

According to him, Kripke's theory of how names refer is “pre-semantic.” Unlike the character of ‘I’, which captures its linguistic meaning, the suggested non-constant character for ‘Alice-1’ would encapsulate a pre-semantic fact, one that doesn't belong in the language-user's repertoire.

While the causal-historical theory implies that the reference of a name is determined by facts about the context, this context-dependence should not necessarily be encoded in its character (linguistic meaning). The covariation of reference with alternative facts about the context could, however, correspond to our imperfect knowledge of the settled (pre-semantic) facts that determine meaning. That is to say, while the character-like function from contexts to individuals in (14) is not (on this view) the linguistic meaning of ‘Alice-1’, it might nevertheless correspond to its cognitive significance for language-users with a less than perfect grasp of the pre-semantic facts. This means that the function will still fulfill one of the key roles of sense. Stalnaker (1978) pursues a solution to Frege's puzzle along these lines.

2.8 Anti-Functionalism

Kripkeans and Fregeans alike assume that a name determines a (perhaps partial) function from worlds to entities (for Kripke this function is constant). Millianism and the intensional interpretation of Frege's view both entail this thesis (“functionalism”) about names. Russellian descriptivism also entails it, for a Russellian description (if proper) has a unique witness at certain worlds (including the actual one). However, the thesis is not true of all uses of names, as we can see from the following case, due to Josh Dever (1998) (see also Cumming 2008). Suppose Sherlock Holmes gives an interim account of a case that begins as follows:

  1. The murder was committed by two individuals, call them X and Y. First note that, since there is no sign of a struggle, both X and Y were known to the victim.

X’ and ‘Y’ are names (or at least seem to be). It is possible, as recognized by Kripke (1980, 91), to introduce a name in the course of a conversation. Kripke only considered names that were introduced using a definite description (for instance, Evans' [1979] example of the introduction of ‘Julius’ to refer to the inventor of the zip), and so had a determinate reference (and intension). In (18), ‘X’ and ‘Y’ are interchangeable names for the pair of murderers. If the murder was in fact committed by Louise and Auguste Lumiere, then we might propose that the conjoined noun phrase ‘X and Y’ refers to them. However, there seems to be no consideration in favour of treating ‘X’ as referring to Louise rather than Auguste or vice versa.

In fact, Dever's case is more complex than it needs to be. A simple case of a name introduced by an indefinite noun phrase makes the same point.

  1. A man, call him ‘Ernest’, was walking in the park at 3pm today. Ernest sat down on this bench. (cf. Geurts 1999: 204)

Some would argue that the use of ‘Ernest’ in the second sentence in (18) is referential, referring to the individual the speaker of (18) had in mind. However, it is possible that one who utters (18) has no-one in mind (consider Holmes concluding (18) on the basis of statistical patterns of pedestrian traffic in the park). It is also plausible that (18) is true even if the speaker is wrong about the person they had in mind, so long as there was another man who acted in the manner described. On such an understanding of (18), the occurence of ‘Ernest’ is interpreted, not referentially, but as an existentially bound variable. It follows that there is no function from worlds to individuals that corresponds to this use of the name (if there were, it would single out a determinate individual at the actual world, and we have just seen that this leads to the wrong interpretation). Note that appeal to Kaplan's notion of character is not availing in this instance, since character is itself functional. If the character determines a functional content (an intension) at a context c, then it will determine a referent at c (the result of applying the intension to the world coordinate of c).

2.9 Names as Anaphors

One view of names that is able to account for examples like (18) treats them as anaphoric expressions, similar to pronouns. The anaphoric view is compatible with descriptivism (for instance, Geurts [1997] is a proponent of both views), so long as definite descriptions are understood as anaphors (as they are in Heim 1982). An early proponent of the anaphoric view is Fred Sommers. Sommers thinks of Kripke's dubbing ceremony as “an act that introduces a special duty pronoun” (1980, 230). Burge, who is, as remarked above, a demonstrativist, represents the semantic value of a demonstrative (and so an argumental occurrence of a name) with a variable. When this variable remains free, it is given a value by the speaker's act of demonstration (modeled by a variable assignment). However, Burge also (1973, 436) anticipates cases in which the variable is bound by a preceding quantifier (including an example like (18), in which the quantifier is existential). In such cases, the demonstrative (or argumental name) is interpreted as “a pronominal place marker” (1973, 436)—i.e., an anaphor.


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descriptions | Frege, Gottlob | indexicals | logic: intensional | mental content: externalism about | nonexistent objects | Plato: Cratylus | propositional attitude reports | reference | rigid designators | Russell, Bertrand | semantics: two-dimensional | singular terms: medieval theories of