Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Moral Psychology: Empirical Approaches

1. Psychologists have begun to pursue philosophically self-conscious work on such topics as agency and moral responsibility (Wegner 2002; Stanovich 2004; Malle 2001, Male and Knobe 2001), moral judgment (Greene and Haidt 2002; Haidt et al. 1993) and culture (Nisbett 2003), while philosophers have initiated empirically informed work on moral character (Flanagan 1991, Doris 1998, 2002; Harman 1999, 2000; Meritt 2000; Miller 2002; Kamtekar 2004), emotion (Griffiths 1997; Nichols 2004a; Prinz 2004, 2005), disagreement (Brandt 1954; Moody-Adams 1997; Doris and Stich 2005, Doris and Plakias 2007), responsibility (Nichols 2004b; Knobe 2003a, b; Nahmias et al. forthcoming), well-being (Haybron forthcoming a, b, c; Tiberius forthcoming), and intuitions (Weinberg et al. 2001; Doris and Stich 2005; Sinnott-Armstrong 2005; Sunstein 2005). For an overview of the field, see Doris et al. 2010.

2. E.g., Nichols 2004b; Knobe 2003a, b; Nahmias et al. forthcoming; Kelly et al. forthcoming.

3.This scientific analogy is not unique to our exposition. Singer (1974: 517; cf. 493) understands Rawls' (1971) method of reflective equilibrium as “leading us to think of our particular moral judgments as data against which moral theories are to be tested … .” As Singer (1974: 493n3) notes, Rawls (1951) in an early paper made the analogy with scientific theory choice explicit.

4. Of course, there is no single method of thought experiments, and the method we consider here represents but one approach, if one that has been prominent in philosophical ethics. For more general discussion of thought experiments, see Sorensen (1992).

5.Authors such as Baron (1994) and Sunstein (2005) have argued that the distorting influences of “heuristics and biases” uncovered in the recent psychological literature on reasoning, judgment and decision making are widespread in everyday ethical reflection. For overviews of the relevant psychological literature see Nisbett and Ross (1980); Kahneman et al. (1982); Baron (2001); Gilovich et al. (2002).

6. We applaud Jackson's (1998: 36–7) advocacy of “doing serious public opinion polls on people's responses to various cases.” However, we expect this may be necessary more often than Jackson imagines. According to Jackson (1998: 37), “[e]veryone who presents the Gettier cases [which are well known epistemology thought experiments] to a class of students is doing their own bit of fieldwork, and we all know the answer they get in the vast majority of cases.” Yet Weinberg et al. (2002) found that responses to epistemology thought experiments like the Gettier cases varied with culture and SES; this suggests that philosophers need to be more systematic in their fieldwork.

7. Rosati (1995) raises analogous concerns with regard to highly idealized “full information accounts” of the good: the ideal, fully informed agent, is likely to be so psychologically different from the actual, very imperfectly informed, agent that there is little reason to think that the actual agent would be motivated by what motivates the ideal agent.

8. There is a wealth of terminological and doctrinal variation here. For example, Haji uses “authenticity” in the neighborhood where Kane uses “ultimacy.” Very often, these issues are couched in terms of “freedom” instead of (or together with) “responsibility”; indeed, as Kane (2002: 4–5) observes, the issues are frequently not sharply distinguished. Here, we focus entirely on responsibility attribution, and will be silent on the relation (or lack of a relation) between these issues and issues discussed under the heading of “freedom” or “free will.”

9. “Identification” is a troublesome notion, afflicted with more philosophical complexity than can feasibly be operationalized in empirical work; Woolfolk et al. attempted to depict behaviors that could plausibly be construed as manifesting identification, or its lack, without resolving the conceptual issues. For some discussion of the unresolved philosophical difficulties surrounding identification, see Velleman (1992), Bratman (1996); Watson (1996).

10. The effect appears to be easily replicable. For example, the Woolfolk group (unpublished data) obtained consistent results in variations concerning the positively valenced behavior of kidney donation, and the negatively valenced behavior of an atrocity committed by a soldier under orders.

11. Knobe (2003a) and others have attempted to diversify subject pools by recruiting subjects “on the street.” While this is also not without methodological difficulty, it goes some way towards addressing the problem of “ivory tower” subject pools.

12. The notion that character is evaluatively independent of or prior to action is sometimes thought to be the distinctive emphasis of virtue ethics (see Louden 1984: 229; Watson 1990: 451–2). But this is not plausibly understood to mean that virtue ethics is indifferent regarding questions of what to do; the question of conduct should be of substantial importance on both virtue and action centered approaches (see Sher 1998: 15–17).

13. The issues were first broached in Flanagan's (1991) important discussion, but Flanagan did not advance the aggressive skepticism of later writers.

14. See Aristotle 1984: 1106a11–12, 8b5–9a9, 1100b32–4, 1115a24–66, 117a15–221128b29; Dent 1975: 328; McDowell 1979: 331–3; Audi 1995: 451; Hollis 1995: 172; Brandt 1970: 27; Woods 1986: 149; Larmore 1987: 12; Sherman 1989: 1; Annas 1993: 51; Blum 114: 178–80.

15. There is a substantial pattern of findings suggesting that the conception of character at issue, and the social emphasis placed on it, is considerably less prominent in other cultures, notably those in East Asia (see Nisbett 2003).

16. For summaries of this 80-year research tradition, see Ross and Nisbett (1991) and Doris (2002).

17. There is a substantial history of personality psychologists expressing doubts about notions of personality traits akin to the one at issue here (e. g., Vernon 1964, Peterson 1968, Mischel 1968, 1999; Pervin 1994). For criticism of this critical view, see Funder (1991) and Goldberg (1993, 1995).

18. Alternatively, the argument may be construed as abductive (Harman 1999; cf. Doris 2002: 26): the variousness of human behavior is best explained by reference to the hypothesis that robust traits are rarely instantiated in human beings.

19. Of course, if the virtue theorist is an elitist, this need not trouble her. But while historical writers on the virtues have at times manifested elitist sympathies (Aristotle 1984: 1123a6–10, 1124a17–b32; Hume 1975/1777: 250–67), this is not a sensibility that is typically celebrated by contemporary philosophers.

20. See Doris and Stich (2005: 120–1) for some concerns about this program.

21. A note on terminology. In this essay we will use the terms “egoism” and “altruism” for descriptive views about the nature of human motivation. Other authors prefer to call these views “psychological egoism” and “psychological altruism” to distinguish them from “ethical egoism” and “ethical altruism,” which are prescriptive views about how people should behave.

22. Interpretation of historical texts is, of course, often less than straightforward. While there are passages in the works of each of these philosophers that can be interpreted as advocating psychological egoism, scholars might debate whether these passages reflect the author's considered option.

23. For more on the history and philosophical implications of the debate, see Broad (1930); MacIntyre (1967); Nagel (1970); Batson (1991), Chs. 1–3.; Sober & Wilson (1998), Ch. 9.

24. For some substantive discussion of the question see Stich et al. 2010.

25. For a classic statement of this account of practical reasoning, see Goldman (1970).

26. Giving a more precise account would raise some of the deepest issues in the philosophy of biology (see, for example, Beatty 1992). Fortunately, for our purposes no more precise account is needed.

27. Though most arguments in this area try to show that evolutionary considerations make psychological altruism unlikely, Sober and Wilson (1998, Ch. 10) have offered an evolutionary argument in favor of psychological altruism. For a critique, see Stich (forthcoming).

28. For useful reviews of the literature see Batson (1991, 1998); Piliavin and Charng (1990); Schroeder et al. (1995). Broadly speaking, this literature is cognitivist in its orientation. There is also some consideration given to the egoism vs. altruism debate in the behaviorist tradition. For an insightful discussion of the relevance of literature in that tradition to the philosophical debate, see Slote (1964).

29. For an excellent overview of Batson's research, see Batson (1991); for a systematic critique, see Stich et al. 2010.

30. As Batson (1991: 80) himself remarks, “[T]he old adage, ‘Out of sight, out of mind,’ reminds us that physical escape often permits psychological escape as well.”

31. As with other philosophical isms, the tidy moniker “moral realism,” covers a substantial diversity of opinion. Nevertheless, many moral realists would accept something in the neighborhood of Smith's characterization of moral objectivity (see Railton 1986a, b; Boyd 1988; Sturgeon 1988; Brink 1989).

32. Recently, some moral realists have denied that moral realism is committed to convergence. For example, Shafer-Landau (2003: 228; cf. Moody-Adams 1997: 109; Bloomfield 2001) argues “disagreement poses no threat to realism of any stripe, and so, a fortiori, poses no threat to moral realism in particular.” See Doris and Plakias (2007) for argument to the effect that realists cannot afford to be sanguine about disagreement.

33. See Williams (1985: 136): “In a scientific inquiry there should ideally be convergence on an answer, where the best explanation of the convergence involves the idea that the answer represents how things are; in the area of the ethical, at least at high level of generality, there is no such coherent hope.”

34. It is plausible to suppose that convergence does not require total unanimity. However, this plausible qualification raises hard questions: How much dissent can obtain in ideal conditions before “substantial disagreement” is a more apt characterization than “less-than-unanimous-convergence”? As is usual in philosophy, we can't be very precise about the percentages, but we suspect that the relevant notion of convergence – always remembering that we are discussing ideal conditions – should be thought to allow only minimal dissent.

35. Brandt is not the only philosopher working in the Anglo-American “analytic” tradition to produce ethnography. Ladd (1957) reports field work with the Navaho; his conclusions (e. g., 1957: 328) about the difficulties posed by disagreement seem somewhat more sanguine than, though perhaps not radically at odds with, Brandt's.

36. For remarks on situational meaning with affinities to what follows, see Snare (1980: 356–62). Thanks to Walter Sinnott-Armstrong for pointing us to Snare's valuable discussion.

37. The last clause is important, since realists (e. g., Brink 1989: 200) sometimes argue that apparent moral disagreement may result from cultures applying similar moral values to different economic conditions (e. g., differences in attitudes towards the sick and elderly between poor and rich cultures). But this explanation seems of dubious relevance to the described differences between contemporary northerners and southerners, who are plausibly interpreted as applying different values to similar economic conditions.

38. The legal scholarship that Nisbett and Cohen (1996: 57–78) review makes it clear that southern legislatures are often willing to enact laws reflecting the culture of honor view regarding the circumstances under which violence is justified, which suggests there is at least some support among southerners for the idea that honor values should be universalizable.

39. In addition to the expedients we have considered, realists may plausibly appeal to, inter alia, requirements for internal coherence and the different “levels” of moral thought (theoretical v. popular, abstract v. concrete, general v. particular) at which moral disagreement may or may not be manifested. Brink (1989: 197–210) and Loeb (1998) offer valuable discussions with considerably more detail than we offer here, Brink manifesting realist sympathies and Loeb tending toward anti-realism.

40. We think Nisbett and Cohen will fare pretty well under such scrutiny. See Tetlock's (1999) favorable review.