Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Moral Cognitivism vs. Non-Cognitivism

Assertion Conditions and Truth-Conditionality

Some theorists have challenged the coherence of non-cognitivism by arguing that if the appropriateness of an assertive utterance depends on a certain descriptive condition being fulfilled, then that descriptive condition constitutes (part of the) truth condition for that utterance. Insofar as the non-cognitivist holds that moral assertions are appropriate when and only when a person has an appropriate noncognitive attitude, the presence of that attitude constitutes (part of the) truth condition for the utterance.  Thus, the argument concludes, even if the non-cognitivist account of the use of moral terms were correct, they would still possess truth conditions with contents characterizing the non-cognitive attitudes of the speaker making the utterance. (Jackson and Pettit 1998). This argument has been vigorously challenged.   Firstly it seems to ignore the distinction between expressing an attitude and stating that one has one, a distinction that expressivists have used from the beginning to elucidate their theory and to distinguish it from descriptivist versions of subjectivism. (Barnes 1933) Furthermore, even if sincere assertions of moral sentences express the belief that one is in a certain attitudinal state, the content of that belief has different truth conditions from the sentence. (Ridge 1999) Thus expressivist critics of the objection have charged that it ignores the distinction between what a sentence explicitly says, and what it conventionally implies. Moral sentences conventionally imply that a speaker has a non-cognitive attitude without explicitly saying that this is so. (Barker 2000) But it is what sentences explicitly say that determines their truth conditions.

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