Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Moral Cognitivism vs. Non-Cognitivism

Agent-Centered Teleology

There is a related worry about non-consequentialist judgements of rightness. Certain moral theories require agents to maximize agent-centered value (Broome 1991, 14-16). Thus such theories require a distinct better-than relation for each agent. Egoism, for example, requires that each agent bring about the outcome which is best for that very same agent. What is good for one agent may not be good for another. So egoism requires people to aim at different outcomes and, on the assumption of teleology, to rank different outcomes as best. What then is the non-cognitive attitude the egoist expresses? It isn't just approval of or preference for actions that favor his or her own well being, since the egoist is not an egotist – a person who thinks that all agents should aim at his or her well-being (Dreier 1996b).

One solution is for the non-cognitivist to view the attitude in question as a preference, but a preference between properties rather than a preference between states of affairs individuated in a more coarse-grained fashion. To prefer a property is to prefer to have that property oneself, where the reference to oneself is essentially de se. So to accept egoism is to accept a preference ordering in which I prefer that Smith does well if I am Smith, that Jones does well if I am Jones, and so on. These preferences will then explain why an egoist prefers and aims at his or her own good (Dreier 1996b).

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