Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Molyneux's Problem

1. Ibn Tufail's Hayy ibn Yaqdhan was a best-seller throughout Western Europe in the 17th and 18th centuries. It influenced John Locke (Russell 1994) and may also have influenced Molyneux, since the introduction of this work contains the following passage about a man born blind whose eyes were opened:
Suppose a Man born Blind, but of quick Parts, and a good Capacity, a tenacious Memory, and solid Judgment, who had liv'd in the place of his Nativity, till he had by the help of the rest of his Senses, contracted an acquaintance with a great many in the Neighbourhood, and learn'd the several kinds of Animals, and Things inanimate, and the Streets and Houses of the Town, so as to go any where about it without a Guide, and to know such people as he met, and call them, by their names; and knew the names of * Colours, and the difference of them by their descriptions and definitions; and after he had learn'd all this, should have his Eyes open'd: Why, this Man, when he walk'd about the Town, would find every thing to be exactly agreeable to those notions which he had before; and that Colours were such as he had before conceiv'd them to be, by those descriptions he had receiv'd: so that the difference between his apprehensions when blind, and those which he would have now his Eyes were opened, would consist only in these two great Things, one of which is a consequent of the other, viz., a greater Clearness, and extream Delight (Ibn Tufail 1708, pp. 8-9).

The asterisk * refers to the following footnote by the translator (p. 9): Tho' this instance will serve to explain the meaning of the Author, yet 'tis very improper, because 'tis utterly impossible to give a Man that is born Blind, the least notion or idea of Light or Colours.

References: Russell 1994, Ibn Tufail 1671, 1674, and 1708.