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Marcus Aurelius

First published Mon Nov 29, 2010

The second century CE Roman emperor Marcus Aurelius was also a Stoic philosopher, and his private Meditations, written in Greek, gives readers a unique opportunity to see how an ancient person (indeed an emperor) might try to live a Stoic life, according to which only virtue is good, only vice is bad, and the things which we busy ourselves with are all indifferent. The difficulties Marcus faces putting Stoicism into practice are philosophical as well as practical, and understanding his efforts increases our philosophical appreciation of Stoicism.

1. Life and Works

Born in 121 CE and educated extensively in rhetoric and philosophy, Marcus Aurelius was adopted at the age of 18 by Antoninus Pius, whom he succeeded as Emperor of Rome in 161 CE. He reigned until his death in 180. His reign was troubled by attacks from Germany, rebellions in northern Italy and Egypt, and an outburst of the plague; at least part of the work for which he is famous, his so-called Meditations, was written during the last years of his military campaigns. Marcus' Meditations is not all that survives of his writings. Also extant are some edicts, official letters, and some private correspondence, including a lengthy correspondence with his rhetoric teacher and lifelong friend, Fronto.[1] The private correspondence begins before Marcus is twenty and continues into his imperial years. It includes what seem to be rhetorical exercises (for example, pieces in praise of smoke and dust, and sleep) written when Marcus was still in his 20s, an exchange about the value (or not) of rhetoric to philosophy written soon after Marcus became Emperor, and throughout, personal information, frequently concerning illnesses, births, and deaths in the family.

Marcus' chief philosophical influence was Stoic: in Book I of the Meditations, he records his gratitude to his Stoic teacher and friend Rusticus for giving him Epictetus to read, and in a letter to Fronto written between 145 and 147, he reports reading the Stoic Aristo and finding intense joy in his teachings, growing ashamed of his own shortcomings, and realizing that he can never again argue opposite sides of the same question, as required by rhetorical practice. The Stoic influence, however, does not prevent Marcus from approvingly quoting Epicurus on ethical matters (as Seneca had); in addition to Epictetus and Epicurus, Marcus quotes liberally from such figures as Antisthenes, Chrysippus, Democritus, Euripides, Heraclitus, Homer, and Plato. From Book I of the Meditations we also learn that Marcus' political heroes included republican opponents of kingship: he thanks his adoptive brother Severus not only for exemplifying the love of justice and the vision of a constitution based on equality before the law, but also for the knowledge of Brutus (assassin of Julius Caesar), Cato, Dion (more likely of Prusa than of Syracuse), (Publius) Thrasea, and Helvidius (i.14). Consonant with this, he warns himself to see to it that he does not become ‘Caesarified’ (that is, act like a dictator, vi.30).

1.1 The Character of the Meditations

Marcus' Meditations reads very differently from other philosophical texts in antiquity. Outside of Book I, which is a kind of extended ‘Acknowledgments’ of the people who graced Marcus' life as examples of some virtue or bearers of some useful lesson, it is difficult to detect much structure in the work, for instance whether the order of the books and chapters is significant, or even whether the chapter divisions reflect breaks in Marcus' thought. Marcus returns insistently to issues that must have arisen from his experiences, such as the imminence of death and his irritation with his associates' faults. Our own perennial concern with these topics, Marcus' gift for vivid imagery, and the apparent extractability of individual sentences from the text given its lack of clear structure, have all contributed to making Marcus among the most quotable of philosophers. But the reader who wants to understand Marcus' thought as a whole is bound to be frustrated; sometimes reading Marcus feels like reading the lines of Hamlet's Polonius. Philosophical treatments of Marcus have to bring their own structure to the work. The most substantial of these is Hadot 1998, which organizes Marcus' thoughts around the Epictetan disciplines of (i) desire, (ii) impulse and (iii) assent. According to Hadot, these appear in Marcus as the rules of (i) being contented with whatever happens, (ii) conducting oneself justly towards others, and (iii) exercising discernment in one's judgments (35–36).[2]

Attention to the genre of Marcus' Meditations can help the philosophical reader. What kind of work is this? The first clear mention of Marcus Aurelius' Meditations in antiquity is by Themistius in the 4th c. CE, who calls it Marcus' ‘precepts’ (parangelmata); in 900, Suidas' dictionary calls it a leading or directing (agôgê) and the bishop Arethas calls it ‘the [writings] to himself’ (ta eis heauton).[3] Scholars now generally agree (following Brunt 1974) that Marcus wrote for his own moral improvement, to remind himself of and render concrete the Stoic doctrines he wanted to live by, such as that the world is governed by Providence; that happiness lies in virtue, which is wholly in one's power; and that one should not be angry at one's associates but regard them as siblings, offspring of the same God. While we do not have other examples of this kind of private writing from antiquity, we do have Epictetus' advice daily to write down (as well as to rehearse) the sorts of responses one ought to have to situations one encounters, so that one might have them ready at hand (procheiron) when circumstances demand (Epictetus Discourses i.1.21–25, iv.1.111; cf. iii.5.11, iii.26.39 on moral improvement being the appropriate aim of reading and writing). And Marcus describes his own writings as supports (parastêmata, iii.11) and hooks (parapêgmata, ix.3.2) and rules (kanones, v.22, x.2).

This purpose—mentally equipping oneself to deal with what comes one's way—would explain the Meditations' often aphoristic and sloganeering style (e.g. ‘Erase impressions!’; ‘Do nothing at random!’; ‘Those who now bury will soon be buried!’): as Marcus says, for the one who has been bitten by true doctrines even the briefest saying suffices as a reminder (hupomnêmasin) of freedom from pain and fear (x.34). (In i.7, Marcus speaks of reading Epictetus' ‘hupomnêmasin’; hupomnêmata is the name given them by Arrian, who wrote down Epictetus' teachings, apparently in reference to Xenophon's Memorabilia of Socrates.) It also explains why when Marcus refers to events in his life, he does not specify them in a way that would allow anyone else to identify them, and why he uses technical Stoic terminology without explanation.[4] Further, it dispels the mystery of his collecting sayings of philosophers without much scruple as to whether the philosophy from which the sayings come is consistent with Stoicism. Finally, it directs readers to look for the psychological errors Marcus is trying to combat, or the correct attitude he is trying to inculcate, when he brings up some doctrine or argument, whether Stoic or not. So for example, xi.18, which begins by saying that human beings came into the world for the sake of each other and that the metaphysical alternatives are atoms or Nature (see below, 4.1), is a list of ten prescriptions against anger (cf. ix.42). Again, ix.28 invokes the Stoic doctrine of eternal recurrence to bring to mind the insignificance of mortal things. This suggests that despite the quotability of individual assertions in the Meditations, we should approach them by studying their ‘therapeutic’ context, that is, by asking: what psychological effect(s) is Marcus trying to achieve by saying this? When Marcus says ‘p’, he is not always simply expressing his belief that p.

The approach taken below follows Hadot's (1998, 5) lead that for the ancients philosophy was a way of life, and that Marcus' Meditations show us what it was like for an individual to try to live a Stoic life. However, rather than trying to cover all the themes in Marcus in this light—in addition to the topics discussed below, he talks about time, fate, death, the cycles of change in the cosmos—I focus on one basic question for Marcus' project of living Stoically: by what principles does a Stoic act? Addressing this basic question leads into discussion of the two virtues Marcus has the most to say about: justice and piety.

2.Living Stoically

Marcus is explicit that what he is trying to do is to live as a philosopher, and that he understands this in Stoic terms:

…you are no longer able to have lived your whole life as a philosopher since youth; and it is clear to many others and to you yourself that you are far from philosophy. So you are confused: the result is that obtaining the reputation of a philosopher is no longer easy for you … If you have seen truly where the matter lies, then leave behind your reputation and be content even if you live the remainder of life, however long [it may be], as your nature wills. Consider what it wills, and let nothing else distract you. For your experience tells you how much you have strayed: nowhere in so-called reasonings, wealth, reputation, enjoyment, nowhere do you find living well. So where is it? In doing those things which human nature seeks. And how will one do these things? If one has doctrines from which [flow] one's impulses and actions. Which doctrines? Those concerning goods and evils: that nothing is good for a human being which does not make him just, temperate, courageous, free; that nothing is bad, which does not make him the contraries of the aforementioned. (viii.1)

Like any good Stoic, Marcus is enjoining himself to follow his nature. But to live according to these principles, any Stoic must bring them down to earth: what, in this particular situation, does my nature will?

The passage above appears to explain how one might ‘follow nature’ by saying that one must modify the doctrines that inform one's impulses and actions, that is to say, one's beliefs about good and bad. How will this help? Marcus says, for example, that if we believe that pleasure is good and pain evil, then we will be resentful of the pleasures enjoyed by the vicious and the pains suffered by the virtuous. And if we are resentful of what happens, we will be finding fault with Nature and will be impious (ix.1.3). But we can already see from this that while false beliefs about good and bad make it impossible for us to follow nature and to act virtuously, their removal does not by itself enable us to follow nature and act virtuously. For once I know that pleasure and pain are indifferent, I still need to know, granting that pleasure and pain are neither good nor evil, how I should value this pleasure and that pain, in order to be following nature. The first century Stoic philosopher Seneca argues in his letters for the usefulness of concrete advice for certain types of situations (praecepta) on the grounds that having eliminated vice and false opinion, one will not yet know what to do and how to do it (94.23), for inexperience, not only passion, prevents us from knowing what to do in each situation (94.32); Seneca also says that nature does not teach us what the appropriate action is in every case (94.19). Perhaps Marcus thinks that there is, in every choice situation, something one can do that is productive of virtue (he says, ‘nothing is good for a human being which does not make him just, temperate, courageous, free’), and that is the appropriate action. Alternatively, he may think that what produces virtue is not the content of one's action but the thoughts that go along with it. But what thoughts are these? Surely, if virtue is to have any content, thinking ‘only virtue is good’ is not going to be sufficient.

2.1 The Deliberative Content Problem: The Good, The Bad, and the Indifferent

The study of textbook Stoicism shows us that anyone who tries to live as a Stoic will face a problem in specifying what the content of Stoic deliberation is supposed to be. Stoicism teaches that virtue is the only good, that vice is the only evil, and that everything else is indifferent. That is to say, only virtue can contribute to our happiness; only vice can contribute to our unhappiness. Poverty, ill-repute, and ill-health are not bad, for their possession does not make us unhappy; wealth, fame and good are not good because their possession does not make us happy. If one asks, how then shall I act? On what should I base my choices so that they are rational and not arbitrary?, the textbook answer is that among indifferents some are to be preferred as being in accordance with nature (Diogenes Laertius vii.101–5; Stobaeus ii.79.18–80, 13; ii.82.20–1, Epictetus ii.6.9 [for these passages see Long and Sedley 1987, section 58]). So whereas it is absolutely indifferent how many hairs one has on one's head or whether the number of stars in the sky is even or odd, we do, and in most cases should, prefer and select wealth, fame and good health over poverty, ill-repute and sickness, because these are (in most cases) in accordance with nature. Cicero gives one reason why there must be value-differences among indifferents: if everything aside from virtue and vice were absolutely indifferent, the perfected rationality of the Stoic wise person would have no function or task to carry out (On Ends iii.50). Would wisdom's exercise consist in flipping coins to select one indifferent over another?

Stoicism's prescription for what to do, for the content of our actions, is to act in accordance with nature. The formula for happiness, in Cleanthes, is ‘living in agreement with nature’ and in Chrysippus, ‘living according to the experience of what happens by nature’ (Stoabeus ii.75.11–76.8). When we follow nature our actions are appropriate, (kathêkonta; for Marcus' use of this term, see i.2, iii.1.2, iii.16.2, vi.22, vi.26.3), and an appropriate action is an action for which there is a reasonable (eulogon) justification (Stobaeus ii.85.13–86.4). But an appropriate action is not a morally perfect or virtuous action (katorthôma) unless it is done from understanding, the wise and stable condition possessed only by the fully virtuous person. Appropriate and morally perfect actions do not differ in content, but only in the total mental state of the agent performing them. Unfortunately texts that deal explicitly with appropriate action leave certain crucial questions unanswered: can there be more than one appropriate action in a given situation, and is the sense of ‘reasonable justification’ like the law's ‘reasonable doubt’ or ‘reasonable person’? Or is the appropriate action just the virtuous action minus the virtuous state of mind? Epictetus reports Chrysippus' remark that if he knew he was fated to be ill, then he would have an impulse towards that (ii.6.9). This remark suggests that since he doesn't know whether he is fated to be ill, the appropriate action for him is to select health. But suppose he is in fact fated to be ill: would both selecting health and selecting sickness be appropriate actions for him at the time? Is the standard for appropriateness, or accordance with nature, what it is reasonable to do given one's understanding or lack of understanding of nature, or is it what a virtuous person would do with her fully rational understanding of nature? Diogenes Laertius reports a distinction between appropriate actions that do not depend on circumstances, such as looking after one's health and sense-organs, and appropriate actions that are appropriate only in certain circumstances, such as mutilating oneself (Diogenes Laertius vii.108–9); could it be that the selection of health is always appropriate, no matter what the consequences, and no matter what the alternative? A majority of scholars take appropriate actions to be the type of action that is typically in accordance with nature, and would typically be selected by the virtuous person; however token actions of that type could fail to be in accordance with nature and would be rejected by the virtuous person. On the other hand, Brennan (1996, 326–29) argues that there is only one appropriate action for any situation, so that selection of what is preferred, or usually according to nature, is only prima facie appropriate. ‘Reasonable justification’, on this interpretation, is the reasoning available to the virtuous person; the standard for reasonableness is right reason—as it is in other Stoic uses of ‘reasonable’, such as in the description of the good emotions (eupatheiai). Further, Chrysippus' claim that the fully virtuous person performs all appropriate actions and leaves no appropriate action unperformed (SVF iii.510) would be false if there were more than one appropriate action per situation.

In either case, the problem is that while living as a Stoic requires that one be able to say about particular token actions whether they ought to be selected—as according to nature, preferred indifferents, appropriate actions—the texts seem only to tell us about the types of actions that ought to be selected. The Stoic is left with observations such as that it is our nature to preserve our bodily constitution (Diogenes Laertius vii.85–86), but there are situations in which we ought to give up our lives (Cicero On Duties iii.89–115, On Ends iii.60). Perhaps there is nothing further to be said in general to direct the selection of token actions, but then it is entirely mysterious how trying to live in accordance with nature is supposed to help with living virtuously.

Barney 2003 and Brennan 2005 examine whether Stoicism might direct one to maximize one's own possession of preferred indifferents, and note the conflict between this and the sorts of virtuous behavior the good Stoic is supposed to engage in, like sacrificing his life for his country. To explain Stoic judgments that we ought to do what is best for the whole community rather than only ourselves, Brennan 2005 appeals to the Stoic doctrine of oikeiôsis: we have a natural tendency to care for others, at first our family and friends and ultimately our fellow-citizens and fellow-humans (154–59). This tendency may not be strong enough to overcome self-interest; however, Brennan argues that the Stoic's realization that indifferents do not contribute to happiness weakens one barrier to impartial deliberation: if indifferents were good, the Stoic would want them for herself; since they are not good, she deliberates about how to distribute them as justice demands (164–65). Since considerations of virtue cannot (on pain of circularity) enter into her deliberations, what gives ‘justice's demands’ content (at least in Cicero, and Cicero attributes similar views to Chrysippus) are considerations of the community's utility and respect for property-rights (206–26). These indifferents are to be preferred as more in accordance with nature than, for example, one's individual utility.

As we shall see, Marcus' way of addressing the deliberative content problem is in one respect like Cicero's: the characterization of right conduct comes from ideas about what justice demands, and the content of justice comes from outside Stoic ethics proper. In Marcus' case, it comes from the idea that the cosmos is a city and that all rational beings are fellow-citizens of this city. The role of citizen brings with it certain conventional expectations of conduct and Marcus simply transfers these expectations to citizenship of the cosmopolis.

3. Justice: Acting for the Sake of the Cosmopolis

Marcus says that one should be concerned with two things only: acting justly and loving what is allotted one (x.11, cf. xii.1). He fleshes out ‘acting justly’ in terms of acting communally (ix.31), and adds that wherever one is, one should live as a citizen of the cosmic city (x.15). Appeal to the idea that the cosmos is a city allows him to say that we should do well for all humanity (viii.23), for we each have a citizen's duty to contribute to the welfare of the whole cosmopolis. Conversely, anyone who does not contribute to the communal goal (to koinônikon telos) is acting seditiously (ix.23); one may not even hate one man, for this rends the community (xi.8).

This communal goal is specified in terms of indifferents rather than virtue, so it seems that one should aim to bring about preferred indifferents for the whole of which one is a part. Explaining that the interest (to sumpheron) of the whole and of a part cannot conflict, Marcus writes that by ‘interest’ he means intermediate things (tôn mesôn) (vi.45). Even though food is not a good and hunger not an evil, a Stoic will respond to a hungry person with food, rather than (only) a lecture that food is not a good and hunger not an evil. Presumably this response is grounded in our natural concern (oikeiôsis), which at its most intense is responsible for parents' caring for their children (Diogenes Laertius vii.85), and Marcus tells himself to regard other human beings as most his own (oikeiotaton) when thinking how to benefit them and how not to obstruct their plans (v.20).

Marcus says that the rational nature does well when it directs impulses (hormai) to communal action (viii.7). We must do what follows from our constitution, and the communal faculty (to koinônikon) plays the leading part in the human constitution (vii.55). After the communal faculty comes the rational faculty (vii.55), but again, the rational faculty is perfected in justice (ix.22). As a human being, one is a perfective part of a political organism; it follows from this that one's every action should be perfective of political life (ix.23). Sometimes Marcus goes so far as to identify the good (agathon) of a rational creature with community (v.16).

Finally, Marcus simply denies that there is ever any conflict between the good of the individual and the good of the whole community of which that individual is a part. He says, on the one side, that what the nature of the whole brings about is good (agathon) for each part (ii.3), and that what is not hurtful to the city can't be hurtful to its citizen (v.22). On the other side, he says that the perfection, well-being, and stability of the whole depends on what happens to each part (v.8). He compares the relationship between separate rational individuals and the community to limbs and body, which are so constituted as to work together (vii.13). The comparison between the citizen-city relationship and the limb-body relationship goes back to Plato's Republic (462b-d), according to which in the ideal city, harm to one citizen or part of the city is felt as harm to the rest of the citizens or the city as a whole. While Plato emphasizes the unity of sentiment in the ideal city, Marcus emphasizes the citizen's being a functional part of the whole city: just as this matter would not be a limb at all without the body of which it is a part, so too, this human individual would not be what he is without a city of which he is a part (Marcus must mean the cosmic city).

Marcus' claims about the harmony between the welfare or advantage of wholes and parts are also central to his conception of piety.

4. Piety: Welcoming What Happens as Part of the Whole

Marcus writes,

Every nature is satisfied with itself when it goes well, and the rational nature goes well when it assents to nothing false or unclear among its impressions, when it directs impulses to communal actions, when it generates desires and inclinations for only those things that are in our power, and when it welcomes everything apportioned to it by common nature. (viii.7)

The last of these four behaviors is productive of piety. The key idea in piety is that the cosmos as a whole is providentially designed, and so is as good as it can be, and so its parts are as good as they can be, and so our attitude towards every part ought to be acceptance—or as he sometimes puts it more strongly, love. According to Hadot (1998, 128), Marcus follows Epictetus in distinguishing impulse (hormê) from desire (orexis), and innovates by restricting impulse to the sphere of our activity. Desire, parallel to impulse, is restricted to the sphere of our passivity; thus, we should desire whatever befalls us. Hadot is mistaken here, for according to the Stoics, our reactions to what befalls us are also impulses, and desire is a species of impulse. Marcus says either to restrict desire to what is up to us (ix.7) or to quench (sbêsai) it. Epictetus tells us to refrain from desire for the time being (iii.24.23, 24, 85). The reason to quench desire is the danger of desiring the wrong thing: to desire something is to believe it to be good, and to have a runaway impulse towards it. Notice that this also gives us an argument against desiring the things that befall one. We might note that Marcus, in the passage above, recommends not desiring but welcoming (aspazomenê) whatever befalls one. Perhaps we should associate desire (orexis) with pursuing, and welcoming with contentment upon receiving

We can use our understanding of piety as appreciation of providence to illuminate two slogans frequently found in Marcus: ‘providence or atoms?’ and ‘erase impressions’.

4.1 Providence or Atoms?

Nine times in the Meditations, Marcus lays out the alternatives: providence, nature, reason, on the one hand, or atoms, on the other (iv.3, vi.24, vii.32, vii.50, viii.17, ix.28, xi.39, x.6, xi.18). Although he does not explain, the reference is clear enough: either the world and what happens is the design of a providential God, as believed by the Stoics (and Platonists), or the outcome of atoms colliding randomly in the void, as believed by the Epicureans. What is not obvious is why Marcus is laying out these alternatives. Is it because his grasp of Stoic physics is so tenuous that he must be open to the possibility that Epicurean physics is true (Rist 1982, 43, Annas 2004, 116)? Marcus does at one point express despair about his own grasp of physics (vii.67). Or is his point that whether one's physics is Epicurean or Stoic, one must live as the Stoics enjoin (Annas, 108–114, Hadot, 148), that is to say, rationally, with a single purpose, rising above conventional goods and evils (ix.28)? Does the convergence of Epicureans and Stoics on such ethical points, in view of the two schools' very different physical opinions, strengthen his confidence in the ethics (Annas, 109)?

In one passage of the Meditations, Marcus gives the ‘providence or atoms’ alternatives when he is clearly interested in the convergence of ethical opinion among all the wise—not only Stoics and Epicureans, for he also cites Democritus, Plato and Antisthenes—on the insignificance of matters which ordinary people value most (life and death, pain, reputation) and the far greater importance of virtue (vii.32 & FF). In this context, Marcus puts Epicurus' view that at death our soul-atoms are dispersed and we cease to exist on all fours with the Stoic view that Nature either extinguishes or transforms us at death. Here Marcus also quotes Epicurus on pain with approval: pain is either bearable (if long-lasting) or short (if intense). His point seems to be that whatever one's particular philosophical allegiance, allegiance to philosophy involves rising above pain, death, and reputation—and also, it turns out, involves not grumbling: for if the way things are is due to providence, then they could not be better and one is wrong to grumble, but if the way things are is due to chance, then it is pointless to grumble (viii.17, ix.39).

Still, Marcus is not really open to the possibility of Epicurean physics. He asserts repeatedly, after laying out the ‘providence or atoms’ options, that the world is in fact governed by an intelligent nature of which he is a functional part, like a citizen of a state (iv.3, x.6). So we should not make too much of Marcus' diffidence about his mastery of physics (vii.67), for he may only mean that his own technical grasp of Stoic physics is inadequate, rather than that he lacks confidence in its superiority over Epicurean physics. Elsewhere he insists that he has a sufficient conception (ennoia) of a life according to nature so as to live it (i.9, 17).

Further, Marcus innovates in deriving from Providence the Stoic doctrine of the indifference of everything aside from virtue and vice: since wealth, reputation, and health are distributed among the virtuous and the vicious indiscriminately, he reasons, they cannot be good, for that would be contrary to Providence (ii.11). This does not mean Marcus is generally grounding ethics in physics, however.[5] According to the Stoics, the beliefs of anyone other than a wise and fully virtuous person are weak and unstable (since not anchored in an understanding of the whole), and so we should expect a non-wise Stoic like Marcus to seek out all kinds of reasons to shore up his ethical beliefs. Marcus can consistently regard these ‘back-up’ arguments for a moment of weakness as weaker and less plausible than the Stoic arguments and at the same time as important to have at hand—as a smoker might hang on to ‘it gives you wrinkles’ for the moments in which ‘it gives you cancer’ isn't doing the trick.

Finally, Marcus uses ‘providence or atoms’ in the Meditations to drive out an impious attitude:

Are you discontented with the part you have been assigned in the whole? Recall the alternatives: Providence or atoms, and how many are the demonstrations, that the cosmos is a city. (iv.3.2)

To understand what the thought, ‘providence or atoms’, is doing here we have to connect it with the discontent that is the topic of the passage. Marcus is admonishing himself for his discontent with things as they stand, saying to himself, ‘if you are finding fault with things as they are, then you must think that they are not due to Providence. But if they're not due to Providence, then they're the result of random causes.’ In this passage, ‘atoms’ functions as the implicit commitment of one who finds fault with things as they are. The reasoning works to raise the stakes for someone who is grumbling at the way things are. It brings out that there is a contradiction between believing, as a Stoic must, that the world is providentially run, and being discontented with anything that happens. Once the contradiction is brought out, it becomes clear which of the two alternatives a Stoic must plump for, and what follows about the attitudes he must consequently adopt towards the world and every part of it. Sometimes Marcus spells out these steps: ‘But look at the evidence in favour of Providence—the whole cosmos is organised like a city, that is to say, each part is so organized as to serve the good of the whole’. For example, at iv.27, Marcus appears to be starting to consider the twin possibilities that the world is a cosmos or a chaotic mixture (kukeôn, referring perhaps to Heraclitus fr. 125), but then he immediately asserts that it is a cosmos. Often, however, Marcus does not have to spell this out. In any event, what ‘atoms’ stands for, in this context, is impiety. So Marcus is telling his grumbling self: your grumbling is evidence of impiety, evidence of your being like an Epicurean—except that actual Epicureans are more philosophical and do not grumble about an irrational cosmos bringing them bad luck, but rather, try themselves to live rationally.

This last use of ‘providence or atoms’ shows that since Marcus is writing to bring about certain psychological effects in himself, we have to look to context to determine what the desired effect is, and then determine how the things he tells himself are supposed to bring about the effect. Perhaps the desired effect calls for hyperbolic statements in order to correct for some natural tendency he thinks he has. If we do not keep this in mind as we read Marcus, we will only find contradictions, tensions, and ambivalences and we will conclude that Marcus is an eclectic and imprecise thinker.[6]

4.2 Erase Impressions

Marcus often tells himself, ‘erase (exaleipsai) your impressions (phantasiai)’ (v.2, vii.29, viii.29, ix.7, cf. ii.5, iii.16, v.36). According to Stoic epistemology, things in the world impress images of themselves on human and animal souls, rather as shapes might impress themselves on a wax tablet, or writing might appear on a blank piece of paper. Human beings may also assent to or withhold assent from these impressions; judgments are the result of our assenting to impressions, or more precisely to the propositional articulations of our impressions. While assent is voluntary, impressions are not (cf. Epictetus fr. 9). So clearly we can't erase our impressions in the sense of simply wiping them out, but then what is Marcus telling himself to do? In exchanges with Academic skeptics, the Stoics say that the wise person does not assent except to impressions that represent accurately the thing in the world that is their cause (‘kataleptic’ impressions); how does Marcus' injunction to ‘erase’ impressions relate to this standard?

According to Hadot (103–4), by ‘erase impressions’ Marcus means ‘assent only to objective and physical descriptions of externals’. What Marcus is telling himself to erase, Hadot says, is value-judgments about everything external to his character. Hadot thinks Marcus is simply confused in using the term phantasia for these judgments (the correct term, which he sometimes uses [cf. iv.39, v.26, viii.4], and which he sometimes distinguishes from phantasia [cf. viii.47–49], is hupolêpsis or ‘assumption’).

The distinction between objective physical facts and subjective value judgments is more existentialist than Stoic—for the Stoics value is objective, and indeed Marcus repeatedly exults in the beauty and goodness of the cosmos as a whole. (We should not assume that the evaluations are all added by us, the subjects, to the impression, for the Stoics think that there are evaluative impressions, cf. Epictetus fr. 9.) Nevertheless, it is right that Marcus, following Epictetus, recommends refraining from judging ‘good’ or ‘bad’ since those describe only virtue and vice and none but the fully virtuous person really knows those (see, e.g., Encheiridion 45). And it is also right that Marcus often deals with things that are conventionally accorded high value in reductive material terms. So, for example, he writes,

Take for instance the impression in the case of relishes and such edibles, that this one is the corpse of a fish, and that one of bird or pig. And again that this Phalernian [wine] is the little juice of a bunch of grapes, and the purple-edged robe is sheep's wool dyed by the blood of a shellfish; and in the case of things having to do with sexual union [that it is] friction of the genitals with the excretion of mucus in spasms. Such are the impressions that get at things and go right into them, so that one sees how each thing really is. (vi.13, cf. viii.21, 24)

Indeed, Marcus himself describes what he is doing here as defining what each thing is stripped naked, and enumerating the components into which it disintegrates (iii.11); elsewhere he adds that this technique leads one to despise the thing so analyzed (xi.2).

However, this is only one of two complementary ways Marcus deals with his impressions. The other is to consider things that are conventionally disvalued in their larger context, so as to show what good they serve. Indeed, the passage recommending the examination of each thing stripped naked continues,

… nothing is so productive of greatness of mind as to be able to examine, systematically and in truth, each of the things that befall us in life, and to look always at it so as to consider what sort of use (chreia) it provides for what sort of cosmos and what value (axia) it has for the whole, and what in relation to the human being, he being a citizen of the highest city, of which other cities are like households (iii.11, cf. viii.11, iv.23, iii.2, vi.36, vii.13, x.20, 25)

Here Marcus is recommending, for the purpose of correct appreciation of the value of things, the reintegration of each thing into its cosmic context. So contrary to first appearances, the goal is not to regard things in the world as stripped of value, but rather, to see each thing's true value, which is determined by considering its contribution to the whole cosmos. The physical description of each thing is not a description of its naked physical appearance when isolated from everything else, but its reintegration into the beautiful and intelligent design of the cosmos. So Marcus writes,

For example, when some parts of baking bread crack open, these cracks too, even though in a way they are contrary to the baker's orders, are somehow fitting and in their own way rouse eagerness for food. Again, figs, when they are ripest, gape open … and many other things, if one were to look at them individually, would be far from beautiful of appearance, but nevertheless, on account of their following things that come to be by nature are well-ordered and educate our soul. (iii.2)

Insight into what is in accordance with nature is gained by determining, for each thing that obtains, its contribution to, or functional role in, the cosmos. (An alternative way of spelling out what is in accordance with nature might have been to look at what regularly happens, or what happens with healthy specimens, etc.) And once one understands this functional contribution, one is able to see the value of each thing, how beautifully it contributes to a well-designed whole.

Now that we have a sense of what erased impressions are to be replaced with, we can return to the questions of what is to be erased, and what it is to be erased. Marcus does seem to speak indifferently about judgments and impressions: he tells himself to erase his impressions, and he tells himself to remove opinion (iv.7, viii.40); he tells himself he can bear what his opinion renders bearable and do what his impressions deem advantageous or appropriate (x.3). But this need not be because Marcus is confused about the difference between an impression and a judgment; he may just be using the term ‘impression’ more loosely, as his predecessors, Stoic as well as non-Stoic, do. For the predecessors: Marcus' Stoic role-model, Epictetus, says the Iliad is nothing but impressions and the use of impressions (i.28.13). Marcus himself uses the term ‘impression’ for a recognition (of his own need to be straightened out, i.7), a conception of a standard (of a constitution observing equality before the law) (i.14), the impression a person makes on others (i.15), and an appearance—the way a thing strikes someone (i.16). These are all accepted uses of the term. So it's more fruitful to ask: what kind of impression are we supposed to erase?

Plato's Protagoras, which greatly influenced the Stoics, can help us here. This text contrasts the power of phantasia (often translated ‘appearance’) with an art of measurement, the former often going wrong because comparative or perspectival (A looks tall because she's beside the very short B; B looks taller than A because she's closer to me), and standing in need of correction by an unchanging standard (a meter ruler, for example) (356b-57a). That Marcus may find the same defects of isolation and perspective in impressions is suggested indirectly by the corrections he prescribes: inspect your impressions (ii.7, iii.6, v.22, viii.13, viii.26); test them by ‘physicizing, ethicizing, dialecticizing’ (viii.13), that is to say, by seeing how they fare when tested against your physical, ethical, and dialectical understanding—all of which are informed by a picture of the whole. In xii.18, he tells himself:

Always look at the whole: what that thing is that gives you such an impression, and undo it, distinguishing it into its cause, its matter, its point, the time within which it must come to a stop.

To the extent that impressions are involuntary, Marcus' ‘erase’ may mean ‘override’. He may be saying: for the purposes of action and response, wipe out the influence of such-and-such impressions (Plato's Protagoras, similarly, speaks of rendering the power of appearance unauthoritative [356e]); focus instead on your understanding of the whole, which will give you a different impression. However, the Stoics' image of the mind as a wax tablet being impressed by different shapes or a piece of paper on which different things may be written gives a particular point to talk of ‘erasing.’ The work Marcus is doing is to replace one inadequate impression with another, the second better grounded in a comprehension of reality. Perhaps making the second mark requires erasing the first—or perhaps making the second mark is a means of erasing the first, for it may be that the withholding of assent from compelling impressions requires countering them with others.

At v.16, Marcus says that one's mind will be of the same character as the impressions it has. This seems unfair, if impressions are entirely involuntary. Marcus may think that while involuntary in the moment, impressions are subject to control in the long run. Perhaps if I keep refusing to assent to my present impression that wealth is good, wealth will eventually cease to appear to me as good. It is also not implausible that one's character and opinion would influence one's impressions, especially in the case of evaluative impressions (such as that x is good or to-be-preferred) and impressions it requires some expertise to have (such as that y is treadle for a foot loom).

5. Conclusion

As mentioned above (1.1), Marcus' Meditations touch on many more topics than the ones addressed here, but we get further in understanding Marcus if we focus on a topic and see how his remarks on that topic are related to his overall project of reminding himself how a Stoic should live. It would be worth working this out for others of his frequent remarks, such as that we are tiny and temporary fragments in the cosmos, that death takes us all in the end, that we ought to live purposively rather than like mechanical toys.


Primary Literature

Works by Marcus Aurelius

Other Ancient Sources

Collected Fragments

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Epictetus | ethics: ancient | political philosophy: ancient | Seneca | skepticism: ancient | Stoicism


Thanks to Tad Brennan, Stephen Menn, and John Cooper for their helpful comments on this article.