Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Deontic Logic

Deontic Wffs

Suppose that we have:

a set of Propositional Variables (PV): P1, …, Pi,…—where “i” is a numerical subscript; three propositional operators: ~, →, OB; and a pair of parentheses: (, ).

The set of D-wffs (deontic well-formed formuli) is then the smallest set satisfying the following conditions (lower case “p” and “q” are metavariables):

FR1. PV is a subset of D-wffs.
FR2. For any p, p is in D-wffs only if ~p and OBp are also in D-wffs.
FR3. For any p and q, p and q are in D-wffs only if (pq) is in D-wffs.

We then assume the following abbreviatory definitions:

DF1-3. &, ∨, → as usual.
DF4. PEp = df ~OB~p.
DF5. IMp = df OB~p.
DF6. OMp = df ~OBp.
DF7. OPp = df (~OBp & ~OB~p)

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