Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to David Lewis's Metaphysics

Physical Magnitudes

Lewis looks to science—really, to physics—to tell us what perfectly natural properties there are. But observe that he presupposes that the things about which physics will inform us are properties—and that is a category that physics has not used for several centuries. Rather, physics trades in physical magnitudes. This is not a mere terminological quibble. Consider mass. On Lewis's conception, having mass 5 kg and having mass 7 kg should be viewed as distinct perfectly natural properties, or so one would naturally assume. They are also to be understood as non-modal. That would seem to mean, among other things, that whether a particular has mass 5 kg places no logical or metaphysical constraints on whether it has mass 7 kg. But that seems crazy: it seems, quite to the contrary, that the claim that a given particular has mass 5 kg logically implies that it does not have mass 7 kg. At the very least, we should be suspicious of a philosophical position that automatically forbids us from understanding the logical relations between these claims in this way.

The same point emerges in a more dramatic fashion when we turn to spatiotemporal relations—or, to keep things simpler, just spatial relations. Several authors (e.g. Bricker 1993; Maudlin 2007a) make the following observation: spatial relations obey the triangle inequality, and appear to do so as a matter of at least metaphysical—and, plausibly, logical—necessity. If the distance between points A and B is x, and the distance between B and C is y, then the distance between A and C cannot be more than x + y. But why should this constraint hold, if the spatial relations between A and B, and B and C, on the one hand, place no constraints on the spatial relations between A and C, on the other?

There is also trouble for the minimality thesis. Suppose that point A is 5 meters from point B, B is 5 meters from C, C is 5 meters from D, and A is 15 meters from D. It follows that A is 10 meters from C. So, in order to include just enough information to completely characterize these points, we do not need to mention that A is 10 meters from C: doing so would introduce an unwanted redundancy. Consider then a set of spatial relations that simply left one such relation out—say, the relation being 10 meters from. For the reason just indicated, this set will contain enough spatial relations for their distribution among the fundamental particulars to fully and determinately fix the spatial nature of reality. But it surely cannot follow that while some spatial relations deserve the elite status of “perfectly natural”, others don't. After all, which ones could those be?

Finally, an argument advanced by Maudlin (2007a; see also Bricker 1993) reveals trouble for the thesis that perfectly natural properties/relation are intrinsic to the particulars that instantiate them. We should, Maudlin points out, ask why the triangle inequality holds. It could, of course, be accepted as a bare metaphysical posit. But there is another answer, which is to treat distance as a derived relation, defined thus: the distance between points A and B is the length of the shortest continuous path through space that connects them (where the spatial metric integration over which yields length along a path can be treated as a primitive feature of the space). This definition yields the triangle inequality as a trivial consequence—which seems a point in its favor. Notice, however, that distance relations so understood are not intrinsic to the points that exhibit them: for “paths” are certain kinds of sets (or sums—it doesn't matter which) of spatial points, so to say that A is such-and-such a distance from B is to imply that there are points other than A and B. That violates one aspect of the traditional conception of “intrinsic”, since the instantiation by some particulars of some intrinsic relation is, according to this conception, supposed to be entirely independent of whatever else exists. (See for example Langton & Lewis, 1998.)

Maudlin extends this argument to other physical magnitudes, showing that a certain kind of path-dependence characterizes magnitudes familiar from modern physics. A quick sketch of the argument must suffice: Suppose that particle A has a certain value of a physical magnitude, and particle B likewise has a value for that physical magnitude. Now, many magnitudes that appear in contemporary physical theories are vector-valued, let that be the case with this example. Given the traditional conception of intrinsicness, it should—if the possession by A of its value for the magnitude is intrinsic to it, and the possession by B of its value for the magnitude is intrinsic to it—be fully determinate whether A and B have the same value for the magnitude. But in the case of vector-valued magnitudes[11] this is simply not so. It amounts to saying that it must be fully determinate whether A's and B's vectors are pointing in the same direction. That will be true, provided that space is Euclidean. But not, in general, otherwise.

What has gone wrong? I do not have anything like an adequate answer to that question, but there does seem to be a significant error built into the conception of natural properties that Lewis and many others are working with—traceable, as hinted earlier, to the undue influence of first-order logic. Recall a muddle that Wittgenstein gets himself into in the Tractatus. All implication, he thinks, must at bottom be truth-functional implication. Well, what about the implication from “A is red all over” to “A is not green all over”? (He could have used, as a much cleaner example, the implication from “A has mass 5 kg” to “A does not have mass 7 kg”.) Wittgenstein claims, bizarrely, that on analysis this will turn out to be a truth-functional implication. Nonsense. A vastly more sensible reaction is to recognize that the logic Wittgenstein saddles himself with is not built to handle this kind of implication. How, after all, would first-order predicate logic handle it? Only by introducing a relation “— has mass — kg”, along with non-logical axioms such as “∀xyz ((x has mass y & x has mass z) → y = z)”.

I do not really mean to suggest that logic itself needs reform. But what does need reform is a tendency to think that the basic kinds of implication captured in the logic with which we are familiar must exactly mirror the basic metaphysical connections that characterize the structure of our ontology. It would, that is, be a bad mistake to reason in the following way: “The fundamental ontological structure of the world must be fully describable by some first-order language, whose names will therefore correspond one-one with the fundamental particulars (or: whose variables will therefore range over the fundamental particulars), and whose predicates will correspond one-one with the fundamental properties and relations. What's more, since any two atomic sentences of this language will be logically independent of one another, it follows that the facts to which these sentences correspond must be metaphysically independent of one another. Hence, whether a given particular has a given property places no metaphysical constraints on whether that or any other particular has any other property.” That line of reasoning leads, as we've seen, to a conception of fundamental ontology that cannot properly accommodate the lessons of modern physics. It is, finally, reasonably clear where Lewis's sympathies lie, with respect to this conflict (and even if he was not properly aware of their significance): on the side of physics.

So a certain amount of reform is necessary in the conception Lewis works with of perfectly natural properties and relations—a reform we might signal by saying that this should really be a conception of perfectly natural magnitudes (some monadic, some dyadic, etc.). Switching our focus from properties and relations to physical magnitudes removes the silly worry we saw above about the minimality thesis: for we can now view that thesis as requiring that there are just enough magnitudes for the distribution of their values across all particulars to fix the nature of reality. And it allows us to maintain that these magnitudes are non-modal, in the sense that the value possessed by one particular for one magnitude places no constraints of a logical or metaphysical kind on either (i) the value possessed by that particular for any other magnitude, or (ii) the value possessed by any other particular for any magnitude.

But once these reforms are carried out, we're still not done: there remains the problem Maudlin highlights for thinking of possession of a value for a magnitude as something wholly intrinsic to the possessor. Here it is much less clear to me how to proceed, and I will simply flag this as an interesting and important open question.