Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to David Lewis's Metaphysics

1. A significant oversimplification of Lewis's actual view, as will be apparent in the (forthcoming) article on Lewis's applied metaphysics.

2. Note that all Lewis means by “Nominalist” here is one who denies the existence of universals.

3. Phillip Bricker has pointed out (personal communication) that this constraint injects “a kind of arbitrariness into logical space. For example, if there are perfectly natural asymmetric relations (such as ‘is earlier than’), the converse of such a relation (‘is later than’) could not also be perfectly natural.” As Bricker further notes, Lewis seems not to have noticed this consequence.

4. A bit more carefully, its intrinsic nature is exhausted by the perfectly natural properties it instantiates, together with the perfectly natural properties and relations instantiated by its parts. Of course the simpler formulation will do if we are talking about fundamental particulars, as they have no proper parts.

5. Again, a bit more carefully: x and y are perfect duplicates just in case they and their parts can be put into a one-to-one correspondence that preserves the facts about which perfectly natural properties and relations are instantiated.

6. As Phillip Bricker has pointed out, this statement needs a qualification. For Lewis considers it an open epistemic possibility that there are two (or more) metaphysically possible worlds that are perfect duplicates of each other. And he holds that propositions simply are sets of possible worlds. If the given epistemic possibility in fact obtains, then there will automatically be propositions—the unit-sets of duplicate worlds—that vary in truth value between two worlds, which worlds themselves do not differ with respect to the geometrical arrangement of their spacetime points, or with respect to which perfectly natural properties are instantiated at those points. So Lewis needs a way to slightly restrict the scope of the thesis. He does not always notice this need. For example, discussing Humean Supervenience in his 1994, he writes, without qualification “I claim that all contingent truth supervenes just on the pattern of coinstantiation…” (p. 474).

Notes to the Supplement on Reduction

7. Together, perhaps, with a “totality” fact to the effect that these are all the pixels.

8. Though, in an earlier version of this essay, I managed to completely overlook it, its obviousness notwithstanding. Thanks to Phillip Bricker for pointing it out to me.

Notes to the Supplement on Physicalism

9. Lewis provides various reasons for thinking that physicalism involves more than this; we won't go into them.

Notes to the Supplement on Humean Supervenience

10. For how could you view them as base-level, without already believing in multiply-located particulars—hence, without already abandoning spacetime monism?

Notes to the Supplement on Physical Magnitudes

11. Along with many others: e.g., Maudlin considers magnitudes whose values are represented by fiber bundles.