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Leibniz's Modal Metaphysics

First published Fri May 23, 2008; substantive revision Fri Feb 8, 2013

In the main article on Leibniz, it was claimed that Leibniz's philosophy can be seen as a reaction to the Cartesian theory of corporeal substance and the necessitarianism of Spinoza and Hobbes. This entry will address this second aspect of his philosophy. In the course of his writings, Leibniz developed an approach to questions of modality—necessity, possibility, contingency—that not only served an important function within his general metaphysics, epistemology, and philosophical theology but also has continuing interest today. Indeed, it has been suggested that 20th-century developments in modal logic were either based on Leibnizian insights or at least had a Leibnizian spirit.

1. Individuals and Worlds

In order to explain Leibniz's modal metaphysics—the metaphysics of necessity, contingency, and possibility—we must look first at the foundation of Leibniz's system more generally: his conception of an individual substance. In §8 of the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz presents his classic picture, writing:

The nature of an individual substance or of a complete being is to have a notion so complete that it is sufficient to contain and to allow us to deduce from it all the predicates of the subject to which this notion is attributed. (A VI iv 1540/AG 41)

In other words, each individual substance has a complete individual concept (CIC), which contains (or from which are deducible) all predicates true of it past, present, and future. Leibniz asks his reader to consider the case of Alexander the Great. On his view, God can, as it were, look at the complete individual concept of Alexander and see that he conquered Darius and Porus, that he was the student of Aristotle, that his armies would march into India, and so on. For our purposes, it will suffice to think of the CIC as the essence of an individual substance and to think of God as able to survey all essences of all individual substances. (The issue is, in fact, vexed; for insightful presentations of views rivaling that presented here, see Sleigh 1990 or Cover and Hawthorne 1999.) Further, according to Leibniz, one of the consequences of this view of the nature of an individual substance is that no two substances can be qualitatively identical and differ numerically. In other words, the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles (PII) follows from this conception of the nature of substance, and PII entails that, for any possible world, there is at most one instance of a CIC.

Individual substances, of course, are parts of, or rather, members of a world. In other words, a world is a set of individual substances; or, as Leibniz puts in the opening line of On the Ultimate Origination of Things, a world is a “collection of finite things.” (G VII 302/AG 149) More specifically, Leibniz tells Bourguet, “the universe is only a certain kind of collection of compossibles; and the actual universe is the collection of all possible existents, that is, of those things that form the richest composite.” (G III 573) In saying that a world is a set of compossible things, however, Leibniz is saying that a world is a kind of collection of things that God could bring into existence. For not even God can bring into existence a world in which there is some contradiction among its members or their properties. But this opens up the question: Just what is meant by a contradiction in the case of the members of a world?

Let us say that two or more substances are compossible if and only if there is no contradiction between the predicates derivable from their CICs. For example, consider the two individuals, Don and Ron. One of Don's properties is being the tallest man (at time t); one of Ron's properties is also being the tallest man (at time t). Naturally, Don and Ron cannot then inhabit the same world. On the other hand, each could have the property being over 2 meters tall and be members of the same world. Now in Leibniz's fully developed metaphysics this example might not be considered a good one, since it is most likely the case that Leibnizian individuals are not to be thought of as constituted by such relational properties. Rather than thinking of compossibility in terms of the properties of substances, it might be easier to think of it in terms of the perceptions of substances. Certainly, Don and Ron cannot be said to be members of the same world if Don perceives the moon landing of Apollo 11 on July 20, 1969 and Ron does not (or would not)—and not simply because he does not have a television set, but because on his July 20, 1969, there is no United States of America, let alone a space program. From this, it should also be clear that the compossibility of substances in a world is another manifestation of Leibniz's thesis of the universal harmony of perceptions of substances.

A possible world, however, is not simply a set of compossible individuals. According to Leibniz, a possible world also entails certain laws of nature. As Leibniz says to Arnauld in a letter from 14 July 1686,

I think there is an infinity of possible ways in which to create the world, according to the different designs which God could form, and that each possible world depends on certain principal designs or purposes of God which are distinctive of it, that is, certain primary free decrees (conceived sub ratione possibilitatis) or certain laws of the general order of this possible universe with which they are in accord and whose concept they determine, as they do also the concepts of all the individual substances which must enter into this same universe. (G II 51/L 333)

Leibniz's basic idea here should conform closely with our intuitions. Imagine God's considering a set of individuals {a, b, c, d}. From God's point of view he could choose to actualize this world with one set, L*, of laws of nature or with another set of laws, L**. And this choice represents a choice between two possible worlds. This is similar to our saying that we would have a different world if the gravitational constant were different. Now, this way of speaking is not exactly right, for on Leibniz's view, the different sets of laws would ultimately produce different properties and perceptions with the individual substances. As a result, the individuals in the worlds governed by L* and L** would strictly speaking be different.

The reason Leibniz mentions the different laws governing the different possible worlds is that the systems of laws and their effects serve as criteria by which God chooses a world. We know that, for Leibniz, God chooses the “best of all possible worlds.” In §6 the Discourse on Metaphysics, however, we learn that this means that God chooses the world that is simplest in hypotheses (or laws) and richest in phenomena. Thus, while one might be tempted to see natural laws as derivative of the actual properties and perceptions of individual substances, in fact they are objects of God's choice.

When Leibniz speaks of a possible world, he means a set of compossible, finite things that God could have brought into existence if he were not constrained by the goodness that is part of his nature. The actual world, on the other hand, is simply that set of finite things that is instantiated by God, because it is greatest in goodness, reality and perfection. Naturally, the fact that we are here experiencing this world – the actual world – means that there is at least one possible world. So are there others?

Yes, indeed, there are. At least Leibniz thinks so. In his view, as we saw above, there are an infinite number of possible worlds – worlds that God did not see fit to bring into existence. Now, given that Leibniz's safe claim is that “[t]here are as many possible worlds as there are series of things that can be conceived that do not imply a contradiction,” (Grua 390) it might still be the case that there is only one possible world – only one set of essences that implies no contradiction. If we accept the claim that a possible world is simply any set of compossible individuals (i.e. a set of individuals whose properties or perceptions do not contradict each other), then there is a rather trivial way to show that there are an infinite number of possible worlds. Namely, we just have an infinity of one-object worlds: thus w1 contains a blue, 8lb. bowling ball; w2, a red, 10lb. bowling ball; w3, a pepperoni pizza; w4, a bicycle; and so on. We could even imagine worlds with two, three, or more objects.

Now, Leibniz's reasons for proposing an infinity of possible worlds are somewhat different. In his short essay On Contingency (De contingentia, 1689?), Leibniz makes the following claim:

One must certainly hold that not all possibles attain existence, otherwise one could imagine no novel that did not exist in some place and at some time. Indeed, it does not seem possible for all possible things to exist, since they get in one another's way. There are, in fact, an infinite number of series of possible things. Moreover, one series certainly cannot be contained within another, since each and every one of them is complete. (A VI iv 1651/AG 29)

The point here is that there are unactualized possibles as exemplified in works of fiction. In other words, a work of fiction represents some way the world could be. (To be precise, works of fiction represent partial ways worlds could be since they do not (and cannot) depict complete or total worlds. For example, was Lincoln shot in the world described by Moby-Dick? We don't know.) But, insofar as these possibles conflict among themselves, it is clear that not all possibles are compossible. Rather, as we saw above, sets of compossible individuals are Leibniz's possible worlds. If we add to this picture the idea that each individual has a complete individual concept – that is, a determinate concept – which is sufficient to distinguish it from every other possible world, then we see that possible individuals are tied to determinate possible worlds.

But what is the character of these non-actualized possibles? The most natural assumption is that they are like individual substances as characterized by Leibniz in Discourse on Metaphysics §8, that is, as having complete individual concepts. In other words, all individuals (actual or merely possible) have determinate essences. In the case of merely possible individuals, however, their being is contained solely in the divine mind. Consider Leibniz's claim in the Theodicy §189: “In the region of the eternal verities are found all the possibles.” (G VI 229/H 246) And, in §44 of the Monadology, in the middle of his argument for God's necessary existence, Leibniz says, “if there is reality in essences or possibles, or indeed, in eternal truths, this reality must be grounded in something existent and actual, and consequently, it must be grounded in the existence of the necessary being, in whom essence involves existence, that is, in whom possible being is sufficient for actual being.” (G VI 614/AG 218) In other words, there will be determinate essences of some substances that are actualized in the world as well as determinate essences of substances that exist solely in the divine intellect.

By way of contrast, Spinoza argues in the Ethics (Ip33) that there are no unactualized possibles. In the case of a story depicting another “reality,” we have only partial and confused knowledge of the world depicted. If we were to have true knowledge of the way all the characters and their actions extend backward and forward in time, we could ultimately arrive at some contradiction. Moreover, Spinoza holds that everything that is truly possible will be expressed at some point as God or nature expresses its infinite essence. That is, since God is a substance of infinite attributes expressed in infinite ways, everything that is possible finds existence at some point in this world. Of course, this difference between Leibniz and Spinoza is largely attributable to Leibniz's adherence to what Spinoza finds so wrong: the anthropomorphic conception of God and the attendant distinction between divine intellect and will, which is what allows for God's supposed contemplation of non-existent possibles.

In Meaning and Necessity, Rudolf Carnap suggests that a Leibnizian possible world is represented by his state-descriptions: a class of sentences containing, for every atomic sentence, either it or its negation. In other words, for each possible world there is a series of propositions that will fully describe that world. The idea of a possible world as being such a set of sentences or propositions leads naturally to the notion of a “world-book,” a term employed by Alvin Plantinga (The Nature of Necessity). Lest such devices seem anachronistic, it should be pointed out that, in the fascinating conclusion to the Theodicy, Leibniz speaks in a similar way; indeed, Leibniz's parable is something that one might imagine has come straight from Jorge Luis Borges (cf. “The Library of Babel”). The story concerns Theodorus, a high priest present when Sextus Tarquinius complains to Jupiter about his fate. (Sextus was the son of the last king of Rome, whose crime of raping Lucretia so incensed Brutus that he led a revolt that ultimately abolished the monarchy and began the Roman Republic.) Theodorus is moved by Sextus' complaint and is sent to receive instruction at the temple of Pallas Athena where he is shown “the palace of the fates.” According to Athena, “Here are representations not only of that which happens but also of all that which is possible. Jupiter, having surveyed them before the beginning of the existing world, classified the possibilities into worlds, and chose the best of all.” (Theodicy §414: G VI 363/H 370) She continues,

I have only to speak, and we shall see a whole world that my father might have produced, wherein will be represented anything that can be asked of him; and in this way one may know also what would happen if any particular possibility should attain unto existence. And whenever the conditions are not determinate enough, there will be as many such worlds differing from one another as one shall wish, which will answer differently the same question, in as many ways as possible… But if you put a case that differs from the actual world only in one single definite thing and in its results, a certain one of those determinate worlds will answer you. These worlds are all here, that is, in ideas. I will show you some, wherein shall be found, not absolutely the same Sextus as you have seen (that is not possible, he carries with him always that which he shall be) but several Sextuses resembling him, possessing all that is already in him imperceptibly, nor in consequence all that shall yet happen to him… (Theodicy §414: G VI 363/H 370–71)

Theodorus is led into one of the halls of the palace and, observing a great volume of writings in the hall, asks what it is. “It is,” Athena tells him, “the history of this world which we are now visiting…; it is the book of fates.” (Theodicy §415: G VI 363/H 371–72) And, finally, we have an argument for the infinity of worlds wrapped in a fantasy tale:

The halls rose in a pyramid, becoming even more beautiful as one mounted towards the apex, and representing more beautiful worlds. Finally they reached the highest one which completed the pyramid, and which was the most beautiful of all: for the pyramid had a beginning, but one could not see its end; it had an apex, but no base; it went on increasing to infinity. That is (as the Goddess explained) because amongst an endless number of possible worlds there is the best of all, else would God not have determined to create any; but there is not any one which has not also less perfect worlds below it: that is why the pyramid goes on descending to infinity. (Theodicy §416: G VI 364/H 372)

Leibniz makes clear here his basic view of God's obligation to choose the best world possible, as well as his view that, if there were not a single best world, no world at all would have been brought into existence. At the same time, the argument for the infinity of possible worlds given here is rather comical: (granted, there must be one best world) for any world you can imagine (or find in the pyramid), there is one that is worse. So much for Leibniz the optimist!

The world-books are on permanent display in the divine intellect. This is what Leibniz means when he says that they reside in the realm of eternal verities. But one thing should be absolutely clear: Leibniz is no modal realist à la David Lewis. Although Leibniz claims that there are an infinity of possible worlds, he does not mean that infinitely many possible worlds exist in the same way as this (actual) world does, or that infinitely many worlds are running, as it were, parallel to this one, or that “actual” is an indexical expression like “here” and “now.” The existence claim commits Leibniz only to the existence of different ways the world could be and to the shelving of these world-books in the infinite and eternal library of the divine mind. As he puts it in the same letter to Arnauld, “there is no other reality in pure possibles than the reality they have in the divine understanding.” (G II 45/AG 75) But it is crucial to Leibniz's position that there be one and only one actual world, the best of all possible worlds. As we have seen, God is obligated to bring this one world into existence. And, we have also seen that, according to Leibniz, if there were no uniquely best world, then God would not have brought any world into existence. (And God could not simply play Eenee, Meenee, Mainee, Mo! with two worlds; he must, according to the Principle of Sufficient Reason, have a ground for his decision.) Further, there cannot be two worlds that are absolutely equal in terms of their degrees of perfection, for God, by virtue of his omnipotence and omniscience, must be able to determine some distinction between the worlds. And if God had actualized more than one world and they had been of different degrees of perfection, then God would have brought into existence that which is less perfect than possible (a violation of the requirements of divine benevolence). (Concerning the reasons for this world, more below.)

2. The Nature of Modality

One reason that Leibniz's conception of possible worlds has attracted the sympathetic attention of some contemporary philosophers and has proven appealing is that it appears to foreshadow the developments in possible-worlds semantics. According to this view, our basic modal concepts—necessity, contingency, possibility and impossibility—can be defined in straightforwardly non-modal terms.

  1. Possibility: A proposition is possible if and only if it is true in some possible world. A being is possible if and only if it exists in some possible world.
  2. Contingency: A proposition is contingently true if and only if it is true in this world and false in another world. A proposition is contingent if its contrary does not imply a contradiction.
  3. Necessity: A proposition is necessarily true if and only if it is true in every possible world.
  4. Impossibility: A proposition is impossible if and only if it is not true in any possible world.

But does Leibniz's account of necessity and contingency really amount to possible-worlds semantics for modality avant la lettre? While Leibniz had all the tools at his disposal to develop such an account of modality, he did not, or, at least, he did not do so explicitly in any texts. Rather, his account of the nature of necessity and contingency has more to do with his account of the nature of truth and the analysis of propositions. More specifically, it has to do with his doctrine of infinite analysis. In his piece On Contingency, Leibniz writes,

[I]n necessary propositions, when the analysis is continued indefinitely, it arrives at an equation that is an identity… But in contingent propositions one continues the analysis to infinity through reasons for reasons, so that one never has a complete demonstration, though there is always, underneath, a reason for the truth, but the reason is understood completely by God, who alone traverses the infinite series in one stroke of mind. (A VI iv 1650/AG 28)

In other words, a proposition is necessary (or expresses a necessary truth) if, in analyzing it, one arrives at a statement of identities. A simple example can be found in arithmetic: “2+2 = 4.” Since “2 = 1+1” and “4 = 1+1+1+1”, we can easily show that the original statement can be reduced to “1+1+1+1 = 1+1+1+1.” Here we have an obvious case of an identity and one where we can say that the concept of the predicate – in this case, “4” – is contained is contained in the subject, “2+2” (or “(1+1) + (1+1)”).

It should be clear that Leibniz's definition of what is necessary will be adopted by Kant, but Kant will call this analytic. (On the other hand, Kant famously rejects the idea that the arithmetic statement given above (or any arithmetic statement) is analytic. Although this is a topic of some controversy, the majority of jurors have a returned a verdict in favor of Leibniz's classificatory scheme and against that of Kant.)

A true proposition that is contingent is one in which it can never be demonstrated that the subject and predicate terms are reducible to identities. Indeed, according to Leibniz, the analysis of these concepts can be carried on to infinity. While this might seem vague, Leibniz often compares the distinction between necessary and contingent truths to rational and irrational numbers.

[I]n proportions, while the analysis sometimes comes to an end, and arrives at a common measure, namely, one that measures out each term of the proportion through exact repetitions of itself, in other cases the analysis can be continued to infinity, as happens in the comparison between a rational number and an irrational number, such as the comparison of the side and the diagonal of a square. So, similarly, truths are sometimes provable, that is, necessary, and sometimes they are free or contingent, and so cannot be reduced by any analysis to an identity, to a common measure, as it were. And this is an essential distinction, both for proportions and for truths. (A VI iv 1657/AG 97)

Although “infinite analysis” might still seem a rather elusive idea, the driving thought should not be so difficult. The reason for any contingently true proposition is to be found in another contingently true proposition, and this chain of reasons goes back ultimately to the creation of the world (or rather to God's free choice of this particular world). We, with our finite minds, are not able to grasp this chain of reasons, but God can do so.

But in contingent truths, even though the predicate is in the subject, this can never be demonstrated, nor can a proposition ever be reduced [revocari] to an equality or to an identity, but the resolution proceeds to infinity, God alone seeing, not the end of the resolution, of course, which does not exist, but the connection of the terms or the containment of the predicate in the subject, since he sees whatever is in the series. Indeed, this very truth was derived in part from his intellect, in part from his will, and it expresses his infinite perfection and the harmony of the entire series of things in its own particular way. (A VI iv 1656/AG 96)

Leibniz's definition of a possibility is simply a proposition that can be shown to be such that a contradiction will never arise in its analysis. (A VI iv 758/LLP 61) And an impossibility, not surprisingly, is defined as a proposition that can be demonstrated to generate a contradiction in its analysis.

It was claimed above that Leibniz does not explicitly adopt the kind of possible-worlds semantics endorsed by Lewis and others in his own definitions and explanations of our basic modal concepts. But it is easy to show that Leibniz's account of these modal concepts can be translated into the now standard possible-worlds semantics. Consider the way Leibniz distinguishes necessary and contingent truths in §13 of the Discourse on Metaphysics.

The one whose contrary implies a contradiction is absolutely necessary; this deduction occurs in the eternal truths, for example, the truths of geometry. The other is necessary only ex hypothesi and, so to speak, accidentally, but it is contingent in itself, since its contrary does not imply a contradiction. And this connection is based not purely on ideas and God's simple understanding, but on his free decrees and on the sequence of the universe. (A VI iv 1547/AG 45)

And, slightly later, discussing Julius Caesar's crossing of the Rubicon (and predicate “crosses the Rubicon” in the concept of Caesar), Leibniz writes the following:

For it will be found that the demonstration of this predicate of Caesar is not as absolute as those of numbers or of geometry, but that it supposes the sequence of things that God has freely chosen, a sequence based on God's first free decree always to do what is most perfect and on God's decree with respect to human nature, following out of the first decree, that man will always do (although freely) that which appears to be best. But every truth based on these kinds of decrees is contingent, even though it is certain; for these decrees do not change the possibility of things, and, as I have already said, even though it is certain that God always chooses the best, this does not prevent something less perfect from being and remaining possible in itself, even though it will not happen, since it is not its impossibility but its imperfection which causes it to be rejected. And nothing is necessary whose contrary is possible. (A VI iv 1548/AG 46)

The crucial idea here is that a proposition is contingently true in this world when it is somehow dependent upon the first free decree of God, that is, when the reason for the truth of the proposition is to be located in the actualization of this particular world. There is another world, W*, existing in the infinite library of world-books, which is such that if God had brought that world, W*, into existence P would be false. In other words, a proposition is contingently true when it is true in that world and false in some other world. As mentioned above, however, Leibniz defines a possible proposition in another text from this period as a proposition which will never result in a contradiction in its analysis, and given his account of worlds, this simply means that the proposition is true in some world. Further, since necessary truths are not dependent upon the first free decree of God but are instead revealed by analysis to be identities, they are in fact propositions that are true in all possible worlds. And so, while our basic modal concepts are explained in terms of the in-esse doctrine of truth (i.e. the Predicate-in-Notion Principle) and the notion of infinite analysis (in the case of contingency), it is a not a great jump to possible-worlds semantics.

It should probably not be surprising that Leibniz's explication of the nature of the distinction between necessary and contingent truths can be translated into the terms of contemporary possible-worlds semantics. For Leibniz tells us in On Freedom (De libertate... 1689?) that he first came to think of the nature of possibilia in terms of fictional worlds, worlds that have existence in a somewhat tenuous sense. “But the consideration of possibles, which are not, were not, and will not be, brought me back from this precipice [Spinoza's necessitarianism]. For if there are certain possibles that never exist, then the things that exist, at any rate, are not always necessary, for otherwise it would be impossible for others to exist in their place, and thus, everything that never exists would be impossible.” (A VI iv 1653–54/AG 94) It was only later that he began to conceive of the distinction between necessary and contingent truths in terms of finite and infinite analysis. In the end, then, we can say that the doctrine of infinite analysis is dependent upon the doctrine of the infinity of possible worlds.

3. Leibnizian Essentialism

Leibniz's logical conception of the nature of substance, according to which each individual substance has a concept so complete that it contains all predicates true of it past, present, and future (or from which all its predicates are deducible), also seems to push him to endorse a strong version of essentialism. Just how strong this essentialism is has been the subject of debate among scholars of Leibniz's thought.

Call essentialism the doctrine that for any individual substance, x, there is a property P of x such that, necessarily, if x exists, then x has P. In other words, there is some property that is essential to x. For example, one could argue that humanity is essential to Caesar; and if Caesar (somehow) were to lose the property of being a human being, Caesar would cease to be Caesar.

Call superessentialism the doctrine that for any individual substance, x, and for any property P of x, necessarily, if x exists, then x has P. In other words, every property is essential to x. For example, one might imagine that crosser of the Rubicon or possessor of 12,147 hairs on his head on the Ides of March, 44 B.C.E. were properties that, were they different, the Caesar of our world would no longer exist. (For the sake of argument, assume that the head-hair count is true; it is only supposed to get at some seemingly trivial property.) Or, put differently, if those properties were different, the Caesars would be genuinely different individual substances.

Now, it certainly seems that Leibniz's view is that, indeed, every property of an individual substance is essential to it.

This very point is something that Antoine Arnauld noticed immediately upon reading the Discourse on Metaphysics. (More exactly, Arnauld read only what are now usually presented as brief synopses of the individual sections.) As he wrote to Leibniz, “Since it is impossible that I should not always have remained myself, whether I had married or lived in celibacy, the individual concept of myself contained neither of these two states; just as it is well to infer: this block of marble is the same whether it be at rest or be moved; therefore neither rest nor motion is contained in its individual concept.” (G II 30) Arnauld's point is quite simply that the property of being celibate is not essential to him or to his concept because he would still be Arnauld even if he had married and had children.

Leibniz's response takes us into some fascinating metaphysical territory. Returning to his original example of Adam and his sins, Leibniz writes the following:

I have said that all human events can be deduced not simply by assuming the creation of a vague Adam, but by assuming the creation of an Adam determined with respect to all these circumstances, chosen from among an infinity of possible Adams. This has given Arnauld the occasion to object, not without reason, that it is as difficult to conceive of several Adams, taking Adam as a particular nature, as it is to conceive of several mes. I agree, but when speaking of several Adams, I was not taking Adam as a determinate individual. I must therefore explain myself. This is what I meant. When one considers in Adam a part of his predicates, for example, that he is the first man, set in a garden of pleasure, from whose side God fashioned a woman, and similar things conceived sub ratione generalitatis, in a general way (that is to say, without naming Eve, Paradise, and other circumstances that fix individuality), and when one calls Adam the person to whom these predicates are attributed, all this is not sufficient to determine the individual, for there can be an infinity of Adams, that is, an infinity of possible persons, different from one another, whom this fits. Far from disagreeing with what Arnauld says against this multiplicity of the same individual, I myself used this to make it better understood that the nature of an individual must be complete and determinate. I am even quite convinced of what Saint Thomas had already taught about intelligences, which I hold to apply generally, namely, that it is not possible for there to be two individuals entirely alike, or differing only numerically. Therefore, we must not conceive of a vague Adam, that is, a person to whom certain attributes of Adam belong, when we are concerned with determining whether all human events follow from his assumption; rather, we must attribute to him a notion so complete that everything that can be attributed to him can be deduced from it. Now, there is no room for doubting that God can form such a notion of him, or rather that he finds it already formed in the realm of possibles, that is, in his understanding.

It, therefore, also follows that he would not have been our Adam, but another Adam, had other events happened to him, for nothing prevents us from saying that he would be another. Therefore, he is another. (G II 41–42/AG 72–73)

Leibniz's point is that, since the Adam of the actual world (call him “Adam@”) has a complete concept containing all of his properties and since Adam@ (or any substance) expresses the entire world of which he is a member, Adam@ could not exist in a different world. Moreover, if any of Adam@'s properties were somehow changed, then the resulting being would not be Adam@. This is indeed an important consequence of his Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles. When we speak of the Adam who brought sin into the world and an Adam who did not, we cannot, strictly speaking, be referring to the same individual. And that failure of identical reference is the key to seeing that all of Adam's properties are essential to him. Leibniz makes this point about as clearly as he makes any point in §30 of the Discourse on Metaphysics in his discussion of Judas' sin: “But someone else will say, why is it that this man will assuredly commit this sin? The reply is easy: otherwise he would not be this man.” (A VI iv 1576/AG 61) In other words, Leibniz seems to deny the possibility of “transworld-individuals” and asserts instead that every individual is “world-bound.” Nevertheless, Leibniz argues that there are “vague Adams,” that is, quasi-individuals which exist in more than one world. And when we imagine other possible worlds in which “Adam” does not sin or eats the forbidden donut, we are imagining only an incomplete or vague “Adam” who is the individual in that world – not the same individual. That is, the “vague Adams” are only quasi-individuals because their individual concepts are not complete. Indeed, when Leibniz speaks of the “vague Adams,” what he has in mind is some set properties that is common to a number of individuals: Adam@, Adamw (i.e. Adam in world′), Adamw, Adamw′′′, and so on. In the terminology of David Lewis's modal theory, they are the “counterparts” of Adam in other possible worlds. Strictly speaking, however, only individuals with complete individual concepts are denizens of other possible worlds; quasi-individuals per se cannot be said to exist. But an incomplete concept can be used to delimit a set of counterparts that do exist with complete individual concepts in different possible worlds. And lest it be thought that talk of the idea of a “vague Adam” is limited to his discussion in the 1680s with Arnauld about modal matters, it should be noted that Leibniz makes much the same point 20 years later in the concluding sections of the Theodicy discussed and quoted above when he writes of the “several Sextuses” that are to be found in the palace containing the books of fates. All of this speaks very strongly for attributing the doctrine of superessentialism to Leibniz throughout his life as well as the denial of the doctrine of transworld identity.

But if we attribute the doctrine of superessentialism to Leibniz, then it would seem that there will be a difficulty in distinguishing those properties that traditionally were thought to be essential to an individual and those that were thought to be mere accidents. In other words, if all properties are essential, on Leibniz's view, is there any difference between his humanity and his wearing a fluffy silk shirt on 1 January 1700? Not surprisingly, Leibniz has a solution to this apparent problem. In an important work on logic from the period of the Discourse on Metaphysics and Correspondence with Arnauld, the General Inquiries about the Analysis of Concepts and of Truths (Generales Inquisitiones de Analysi Notionum et Veritatum, 1686), Leibniz makes the standard, Aristotelian distinction between essential properties and accidents, saying “that thing which is called ‘a man’ cannot cease to be a man except by annihilation; but someone can begin or cease to be a king, or learned, though he himself remains the same.” (A VI iv 740/LLP 47) The important point here is the species to which an individual belongs contributes one level of properties to an individual; but, of course, these are properties that are held in common by all members of that particular species. Therefore, for example, Adam is not only a man, but necessarily also rational and, to use the Aristotelian chestnut, a featherless biped. Following Mondadori (1993), let us call being a human being a specific essential property. But there may also be individuating essential properties, those which single x out from the other members of the same species and which are nevertheless such that, lacking them, x would no longer be x. For example, consider several counterpart Adams: one who brought no sin into the world, one who did so by eating the forbidden donut, etc. As we have said, they cannot be identical to Adam@, which is another way of saying that Adam@ would cease to be Adam@ if he no longer brought sin into the world by eating the forbidden fruit. But now consider a Plantinga-inspired example: the alligator who brought sin into the world. Could the alligator count as a counterpart of Adam@? No, for lacking the property of humanity, there are simply no counterparts of Adam@. In support of this view, consider On Freedom, Fate and the Grace of God (De libertate, fato, gratia Dei, 1686/87), where Leibniz first has a critic of his view say that, “God … has in his intellect a notion or an idea of Peter as perfect as possible containing all truths concerning Peter, the objective reality of which constitutes the complete nature or essence of Peter, and accordingly, to deny is essential to Peter and is foreknown by God.” Leibniz's response employs the distinction between necessary and contingent properties:

there is contained in this complete notion of a possible Peter, which I concede is observed by God, not only the essential or the necessary, namely, that which flows from incomplete or specific notions, and which are demonstrated from terms so that the contrary implies a contradiction, but also the existential or contingent so to speak are contained therein, because it is of the nature of an individual substance that its nature be perfect and complete. (A VI iv 1600)

While the first passage seems to be Leibniz's position, he actually finesses this view in the second passage. Those properties that are said to be necessary or essential are actually what were called above the specific essential properties. Thus, Peter's specific essential properties include being a human being and what follows from that, for example, being rational. The crucial feature of these properties is that their absence means that the individual would be annihilated entirely; for example, if humanity were somehow stripped from Peter's complete individual concept, Peter would cease to exist completely. Those properties that are said to be contingent or existential are all the myriad properties that individuate Peter and that make Peter the particular person that he is. As Leibniz says, they are what fill out Peter's complete individual concept. Now, these properties can still be considered essential in the sense relevant to Leibniz's superessentialism, but in the following way (similar to what was said above about Adam@): if such a property, for example, denying Christ, were stripped from Peter's complete individual concept, Peter would cease to be Peter. In other words, imagine Peter's notion, containing, among other things, humanity, being a disciple of Christ, being the founder of the church, and being a denier of Christ. Leibniz's point seems to be that we could peer into a nearby possible world where a Peter-counterpart did not deny Christ. But there is no nearby possible world in which a Peter was the alligator or marmoset that denied Christ.

If, however, this is Leibniz's view, then it might seem that we have a problem: the specific essential properties of an individual are few; the individuating essential properties are many; and the specific essential properties are in fact so few that they do little work. Yet, it should be emphasized that, for Leibniz, there is something very important about drawing a line between human beings and other animals: we are rational, while they are not; we are capable of morality, while they are not. This view comes out most clearly in Leibniz's New Essays, where he is trying to undermine Locke's deep anti-essentialism: “as we know the inner essence of man, namely reason, which resides in the individual man and is present in all men, and as we find among us no fixed inner feature which generates a subdivision, we have no grounds for thinking that the truth about their inner natures implies that there is any essential specific difference among men.” (A VI, vi, 325–26/RB 325–26) In other words, there are certain properties within us that necessarily differentiate us from all other species and those that differentiate us from all other individuals within that species. In this regard, Leibniz is a traditionalist, upholding a real, essential distinction between human beings and other creatures. Yet, insofar as he believes that all properties of an individual are essential to that individual, Leibniz is radical.

4. Human Freedom: Certainty without Necessity

In On Contingency, Leibniz remarks that “there are two labyrinths of the human mind, one concerning the composition of the continuum, and the other concerning the nature of freedom, and they arise from the same source, infinity.” (A VI iv 1654/AG 95) Someone coming upon this passage for the first time might be puzzled by Leibniz's claim. Why, after all, should the labyrinth of the nature of freedom be related to infinity? Given our discussion above concerning contingency and infinite analysis, the answer should be relatively clear.

Leibniz's account of modality opens the way for him to present a distinctive kind of compatibilist theory of free will. For, according to Leibniz, Caesar's crossing of the Rubicon was a free act insofar as it spontaneously flowed from his own individual nature or was part of his complete concept and insofar as it represented Caesar's choice of what he perceived to be the best option for him at the time. This action was not necessary – and therefore contingent – because its contrary (for example, staying in Gaul) does not imply a contradiction. In saying that there is no contradiction, Leibniz means that either property or action – crossing the Rubicon or remaining in Gaul – could co-exist within a complete set of properties of a Caesar. But as we saw above, there are some properties that, were they changed, the individual would cease to be. Thus, for example, it is a fair bet that Caesar was not free to become a trout. Put differently, we can say that, while Caesar crossed the Rubicon in this world and thus began the Roman Civil Wars, there is another possible world in which a Caesar did not cross the Rubicon. (Again, the “existence” of the other possible world is meant only to imply that there is some set of compossible essences that include the Caesar-counterpart who does not cross the Rubicon.)

Leibniz's conception of substance, according to which each individual has a complete individual concept, still seems remarkably necessitarian. After all, even predicates related to my future actions are now contained within my complete individual concept. This smacks of determinism and raises in its own way the problem of future contingents. As mentioned above, Leibniz claims that we are free in part precisely because our actions follow from our very natures with complete spontaneity. But also, according to Leibniz, God “inclines our souls without necessitating them.” Indeed, in the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz claims that the actions of an individual are certain but not necessary. They are, Leibniz argues, certain ex hypothesi—that is, they are certain given the creation or instantiation of this particular world. God saw that Caesar would cross the Rubicon, that Judas would betray Christ, that Adam would sin, and so on; each of these acts and an infinity of others were included in each individual's complete concept; and yet God chose this world in which such actions would certainly take place. But, at the same time, since the contraries of any such actions do not imply contradictions, they are not necessary. God, in choosing a possible world, chooses all the essences of all the actual individuals, each of which has its program, according to which it acts spontaneously and freely. While it is still a program or a complete concept, on Leibniz's view, that does imply determination.

5. Why This World?

Leibniz is famous for his “optimism,” that is, for the thesis that this is the best of all possible worlds. According to Leibniz, God surveyed the infinitely many possible worlds, determined which was best, and instantiated it or made it actual. In an important article, “Theories of Actuality,” Robert Merrihew Adams dubs this the “Divine Choice Theory” of actuality. In the main article on Leibniz, the reasons for this view are presented. But it is important to see that there are several factors that contribute to God's choice: first, according to Leibniz, God chose the world that was simplest in hypotheses (or laws) and richest in phenomena; second, it is claimed that God was chiefly concerned with the happiness of minds; third, since (it is argued) God sought to have the maximum perspectives on the universe, the world is a plenum, filled with minds each of which expresses the world from its own point of view.

Although the Divine Choice Theory does seem to be Leibniz's preferred way to explain the origin of this—the actual—world, he does offer another explanation that deserves comment. This is the doctrine of striving possibles. According to this view, as presented principally in On the Ultimate Origination of Things (De rerum originatione radicali, 1697), each essence naturally strives for existence, and the actual world is simply the final battlefield after all possible essences have engaged in mortal combat for survival. In short, this is metaphysical Darwinism, in which the most perfect (and mutually compatible) essences survive to constitute a world. Consider the following:

Furthermore, in order to explain a bit more distinctly how temporal, contingent, or physical truths arise from eternal, essential or metaphysical truths, we must first acknowledge that since something rather than nothing exists, there is a certain urge for existence or (so to speak) a straining toward existence in possible things or in possibility or essence itself; in a word, essence in and of itself strives for existence. Furthermore, it follows from this that all possibles, that is, everything that expresses essence or possible reality, strive with equal right for existence in proportion to the amount of essence or reality or the degree of perfection they contain, for perfection is nothing but the amount of essence.

From this it is obvious that of the infinite combinations of possibilities and possible series, the one that exists is the one through which the most essence or possibility is brought into existence. In practical affairs one always follows the decision rule in accordance with which one ought to seek the maximum or the minimum: namely, one prefers the maximum effect at the minimum cost, so to speak. (G VII 303/AG 150)

Since the theory of Striving Possibles seems so obviously to conflict with the Divine Choice Theory and since the latter is so much a part of Leibniz's mature system, we seem to have good reason to question how seriously to take this view. (The classic articles on this issue are those by Shields and Blumenfeld listed in the bibliography.) There is, however, a common way to reconcile the two views: the Divine Choice Theory literally explains the origin of this world, and the Striving Possibles Theory is merely a metaphor. But a metaphor for what? Answer: for the moral evaluation taking place in the divine intellect. In other words, God ought to be understood as surveying not simply all worlds (sets of compossible essences) prior to creation but also, in some sense, individual essences; and those essences which individually are most perfect and which collectively can form a world are in fact elected for existence.

In conclusion, it has been claimed throughout this piece that Leibniz advances his unique views on modality in opposition to the views of Hobbes and Spinoza. In short, the modal metaphysics we find in Leibniz's system is a result of the attempt to combine the insights of a mechanistic (and therefore deterministic) world-view with the demands of orthodox Christianity. There are a number of important particular points to bring out here. First, on Spinoza's view, everything that is possible is actual; that is, there are no unactualized possibilities. To claim that some particular thing or event could have been otherwise or to claim that the world itself could have been otherwise is simply to make an assertion without adequate knowledge. Indeed, one of the cornerstones of Spinoza's philosophy is the view that, if one has knowledge of the third kind, then one will recognize that everything happens out of the necessity of the divine nature. Second, if the Divine Choice Theory is the preferred account of the origin of this actual world, then Leibniz stands in opposition to Spinoza both because the Divine Choice Theory entails the existence of non-actualized possible worlds and also because it clearly entails a God that is anthropomorphic and transcendent. In other words, the Divine Choice Theory requires a God in whom intellect and will are distinct. Third, Leibniz's accounts of necessity and contingency are, obviously, in service of his commitment to the real freedom of human beings – and this in the face of the mechanistic world-view to which he otherwise adhered. This should be in no way surprising because Leibniz, unlike Hobbes and Spinoza, upheld the basic tenets of Christianity and had to explain how freedom and responsibility could be attributed to an individual, whose very nature (following Leibniz's account of truth) entailed all properties, past, present, and future.


Primary Sources for Leibniz with Abbreviations

[LLP] Logical Papers. Translated and edited by G. H. R. Parkinson. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1966.
[RB] New Essays on Human Understanding. Translated by Peter Remnant and Jonathan Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
[AG] Philosophical Essays. Translated and edited by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
[L] Philosophical Papers and Letters. Edited and translated by Leroy E. Loemker. 2d ed., Dordrect: D. Reidel, 1969.
[G] Die philosophischen Schriften. 7 vols. Edited by C. I. Gerhardt. Berlin, 1875–90. Reprint, Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1965. Cited by volume and page number
[A] Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe. Edited by the Deutsche Akademie der Wissenschaften zu Berlin. Darmstadt, 1923 ff., Leipzig, 1938 ff., Berlin, 1950 ff. Cited by Series (Reihe), Volume (Band), and page number.
[H] Theodicy: Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom on Man and the Origin of Evil. Translated by E. M. Huggard. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1985.

Secondary Sources

See also the main entry on Leibniz.

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