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James of Viterbo

First published Thu Aug 18, 2011; substantive revision Tue Feb 5, 2013

James of Viterbo (c. 1255–1308) is one of a number of highly significant theologians who were active in the last quarter of the thirteenth century, alongside Godfrey of Fontaines, Henry of Ghent and Giles of Rome, three authors whose views he constantly discusses and with whom he often disagrees. Though decidedly influenced by the work and outlook of St. Augustine, James was very much an independent thinker, whose originality was fuelled by his attentive reading of the Greek and Arab commentators on Aristotle. On several issues, such as cognition, the love of self over God, the relation between the spiritual and temporal powers, James held strikingly original and often controversial positions.

1. Life and Writings

James was born in Viterbo around 1255. Nothing is known about the early years of his life. It is presumed that he joined the order of the Hermits of St. Augustine somewhere around 1272. He is first mentioned in 1283 in the capitular acts of the Roman province of his order as a recently appointed lecturer (lector) in the Augustinian Convent of Viterbo. This means that he must have spent the previous five years (i.e., 1278–83) in Paris, as the Augustinian order required its lecturers to be trained in theology in that city for a period not exceeding five years. James returned to Paris not long after his appointment in Viterbo, for he is mentioned again in the capitular acts in 1288, this time as baccalaureus parisiensis, i.e., as holding a bachelor of theology degree from the University of Paris. After completing his course of studies, James was appointed Master of Theology in 1292 (Wippel 1974) or 1293 (Ypma 1974), teaching in Paris for the next seven years. His output during that time was considerable. All of his works in speculative theology and metaphysics date from the Parisian period. In 1299–1300, he was named definitor (i.e., member of the governing council) of the Roman province by the general chapter of his order, and in May of 1300 he became regent master of the order's studium generale in Naples.  These would be the last two years of his academic career, however, for in September 1302 he was named Archbishop of Benevento by Pope Boniface VIII, possibly in gratitude for the support James had shown for the papal cause in his great treatise, De regimine christiano (On Christian Rulership). In December of the same year, at the request of the Angevin King, Charles II, he was transferred to the Archbishopric of Naples. He remained in Naples until his death, in 1307 or 1308.

James wrote the bulk of his philosophically relevant work while in Paris. Nothing remains of his early production in that city. His commentary on Peter Lombard's Sentences has been lost, although still extant is an Abbreviatio in I Sententiarum Aegidii Romani (Summary of the First Book of the Sentences of Giles of Rome) probably a very early work (Ypma 1975 and 1980; but see Gutiérrez 1939 and Giustiniani 1979) written while he was still a lecturer in Viterbo. Also lost are a treatise on the animation of the heavens (De animatione caeli), as well as a commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics (Expositio primae philosophiae), which Ypma surmises must have been written when James was a baccalaureus formatus, i.e., between 1288 and 1292 (Ypma 1975).

Soon after his inception as regent master, James held a series of seven Quaestiones disputatae de verbo (Disputed Questions on the Divine Word), only one of which has been edited so far (Scanzillo 1972). He then held a series of four quodlibetal questions as well as thirty-four disputed questions on the categories as they pertain to divine matters (Quaestiones de praedicamentis in divinis), although five of them have actually nothing to do with theology or the categories, as they deal with the human will and the habits (see Ypma 1975 for a possible explanation regarding their inclusion in the Quaestiones). These two works constitute the most important sources for our knowledge of James' philosophical thought.

In Naples, James wrote the work for which he is arguably best known (Gutiérrez 1939: 61–2), the De regimine christiano, a work of great importance in the history of late medieval political thought, and the only philosophical work written by James in the last eight or so years of his life.

The following table provides the list of James' authentic works (Ypma 1974; Gutiérrez 1939). Single asterisks mark those which have been fully edited; double asterisks indicate those for which there exist only partial editions:

  1. Lectura super IV libros Sententiarum
  2. Quaestiones Parisius disputatae De praedicamentis in divinis**
  3. Quaestione de animatione caeli
  4. Quaestiones disputatae de Verbo**
  5. Quodlibeta quattuor*
  6. Abbreviatio In Sententiarum Aegidii Romani**
  7. De perfectione specierum
  8. De regimine christiano*
  9. Summa de peccatorum distinctione*
  10. Sermones diversarum rerum
  11. Concordantia psalmorum David
  12. De confessione
  13. De episcopali officio

2. Philosophical Theology

2.1 Theology as a Practical Science

Like many of his contemporaries, James devotes serious attention to determining the status of theology as a science and to specifying its object, or rather, as the scholastics say, its subject. In Quodlibet III, q. 1, he asks whether theology is principally a practical or a speculative science. Unsurprisingly, perhaps, for an Augustinian, James responds that the end of theology resides principally not in knowledge but in the love of God. The love of God, informed by grace, is what distinguishes the way in which Christians worship God from the way in which pagans worship their deities. For philosophers—James has Cicero in mind—religion is a species of justice; worship is owed to God as a sign of submission. For the Christian, by contrast, there can be no worship without an internal affection of the soul, i.e., without love. James allows that there is some recognition of this fact in Book X of the Nicomachean Ethics, for the happy man would not be “most beloved of God,” as Aristotle claims he is, if he did not love God by making him the object of his theorizing. In this sense, it can be said that philosophy as well sees its end as the love of God as its principal subject. But there is a difference, James contends, in the way in which a science based on natural reason aims for the love of God and the way in which sacred science does so: sacred science tends to the love of God in a more perfect way. One way in which James illustrates the difference between both approaches is by contrasting the ways in which God is the “highest” object for metaphysics and for theology. The proper subject of metaphysics is being, not God, although God is the highest being. Theology, on the other hand, views God as its subject and considers being in relation to God. Thus, James concludes, “theology is called divine or of God in a much more excellent and principal way than metaphysics, for metaphysics considers God only in relation to common being, whereas theology considers common being in relation to God” (Quodl. III, q. 1, p. 20, 370–374). Another way in which James illustrates the difference between natural theology and sacred science is by using St. Anselm's distinction between the love of desire (amor concupiscientiae) and the love of friendship (amor amicitiae). The love of desire is the love by which we desire an end; the love of friendship is the love by which we wish someone well. The love of God philosophers have in mind, James contends, is the love of desire; it cannot, by the philosophers' own admission, be the love of friendship, for according to Aristotle, at least in the Magna Moralia, friendship involves a form of community or sharing between the friends that cannot possibly obtain between mere mortals and the gods. Now although James concedes that a “community of life” between God and man cannot be achieved by natural means, it is possible through the gift of grace. The particular friendship grace affords is called charity and it is to the conferring of charity that sacred scripture is principally ordered.

2.2 Divine Power

Like all scholastics since the early thirteenth century, James subscribes to the distinction between God's ordained power, according to which “he can only do what he preordained he would do according to wisdom and will” (Quodl. I, q. 2, p. 17, 35–37) and his absolute power, according to which he can do whatever is “doable,” i.e., whatever does not imply a contradiction. Problems concerning what God can or cannot do arise only in the latter case. James considers several questions: can God add an infinite number of created species to the species already in existence (Quodl. I, q. 2)? Can he make matter exist without form (Quodl. IV, q. 1)? Can he make an accident subsist without a substrate (Quodl. II, q. 1)? Can he create the seminal reason of a rational soul in matter (Quodl. III, q. 10)? In response to the first question, James explains, following Giles of Rome but against the opinion of Godfrey of Fontaines and Henry of Ghent, that God can by his absolute power add an infinite number of created species ad superius, in the ascending order of perfection, if not in actuality, then at least in potency. God cannot, however, add even one additional species of reality ad inferius, between prime matter and pure nothingness, not because this exceeds his power but because prime matter is contiguous to nothingness and leaves, so to speak, no room for God to exercise his power (Côté 2009). James is more hesitant about the second question. He is sympathetic both to the arguments of those who deny that God can make matter subsist independently of form and to the arguments of those who claim he can. Both positions can reasonably be held, because each argues from a different (and valid) perspective. Proponents of the first position argue from the point of view of reason: because they rightly believe that God cannot make what implies a contradiction, and because they believe (rightly or wrongly) that making matter exist without form does involve a contradiction, they conclude that God cannot make matter exist without form. Proponents of the second group argue from the perspective of God's omnipotence which transcends human reason: because they rightly assume that God's power exceeds human comprehension, they conclude (rightly or wrongly) that making matter exist without form is among those things exceeding human comprehension that God can make come to pass.

Another question James considers is whether God can make an accident subsist without a subject or substrate. The question arises only with respect to what he calls “absolute accidents,” namely quantity and quality, as opposed to relational accidents—the remaining categories of accident. God clearly cannot make relational accidents exist without a subject in which they inhere, for this would entail a contradiction. This is so because relations for James, as we will see in section 3.3 below, are modes, not things. What about absolute accidents? As a Catholic theologian, James is committed to the view that some quantities and qualities can subsist without a subject, for instance extension and color, a view for which he attempts to provide a philosophical justification. His position, in a nutshell, is that accidents are capable of existing independently if they are thing-like (dicunt rem). Numbers, place (locus), and time are not thing-like and are thus not capable of independent existence; extension, however, is and so can be made to exist without a subject. The same reasoning applies to quality. This is somewhat surprising, for according to the traditional account of the Eucharist, whereas extension may exist without a subject, the qualities, color, odor, texture, necessarily cannot; they inhere in the extension. James, however, holds that just as God can make thing-like quantities to exist without a subject, so too must he be able to make a thing-like quality exist without the subject in which it inheres. Just which qualities are capable of existing without a subject is determined by whether or not they are “modes of being,” i.e., by whether or not they are relational. This seems to be the case with health and shape: health is a proportion of the humors, and so, relational; likewise, shape is related to parts of quantity, without which, therefore, it cannot exist. Colors and weight, by contrast, are non-relational, according to James, and are thus in principle capable of being made to exist without a subject.

The fourth question James considers in relation to God's omnipotence raises the interesting problem of whether the rational soul can come from matter. James proceeds carefully, claiming not to provide a definitive solution but merely to investigate the issue (non determinando sed investigando). The upshot of the investigation is that although there are many good reasons (the soul's immortality, its spirituality and its per se existence) to say that God cannot produce the seminal reason of the rational soul in matter, in the end, James decides, with the help of Augustine, that such a possibility must be open to God. Thus, it is true that in the order which God has de facto instituted, the soul's incorruptibility is repugnant to matter, but this is not so in absolute terms: if God can miraculously cause something to come to existence through generation and confer immortality upon it (James is presumably thinking of the birth of Christ), then he can make it come to pass that souls are produced through generation without being subject to corruption. Likewise, although it appears inconceivable that something material could generate something endowed with per se existence, it is not impossible absolutely speaking: if God can confer separate existence upon an accident—despite the fact that accidents naturally inhere in their substrates—then, in like manner, he can confer separate existence upon a soul, although it has a seminal reason in matter.

2.3 Divine Ideas

Scholastics held that because God is the creative cause of all natural beings, he must possess the ideas corresponding to each of his creatures. But because God is eternal and is not subject to change, the ideas must be eternally present in him, although creatures exist for only a finite period of time. This doctrine of course raised many difficulties, which each author addressed with varying degrees of success. One difficulty had to do with reconciling the multiplicity of ideas with God's unity: since there are many species of being, there must be a corresponding number of ideas; but God is one and, hence, cannot contain any multiplicity. Another, directly related, difficulty had to do with the ontological status of ideas: do ideas have any reality apart from God? If one denied them any kind of reality, it was hard to see how they could function as exemplar causes of things; but to attribute full-blown essential reality to them was to run the risk of introducing multiplicity in God. 

One influential solution to these difficulties was provided by Thomas Aquinas, who argued that divine ideas are nothing else but the diverse ways in which God's essence is capable of being imitated, so that God knows the ideas of things by knowing his essence. Ideas are not distinct from God's essence, though they are distinct from the essences of the things God creates (De veritate, q. 2, a. 3).

One can discern two answers to the problem of divine ideas in the works of James of Viterbo. At an early stage of his career, in the Abbreviatio in Sententiarum Aegidii Romani­—assuming one accepts, as seems reasonable, the early dating suggested by Ypma (1975)—James defends a position that is almost identical to that of Thomas Aquinas (Giustiniani 1979). In his Quodlibeta, however, he moves to a position closer to that of Henry of Ghent. In the following I will sketch James' position in the Quodlibeta as it provides the most mature statement of his views.

Although James agreed with the notion that ideas are to be viewed as the differing ways in which God can be imitated, he did not think that one could make sense of the claim that God knows other things by cognizing his own essence unless one supposed that the essences of those things preexist in some way (aliquo modo) in God. James' solution is to distinguish two ways in which ideas are in God's intellect. They are in God's intellect, firstly, as identical with it, and, secondly, as distinct from it. The first mode of being is necessary as a means of acknowledging God's unity; but the second mode of being is just as necessary, for, as James puts it (Quodl. I, q. 5, p. 64, 65–67), “if God knows creatures before they exist, even insofar as they are other than him and distinct (from him), that which he knows is a cognized object, which must needs be something; for that which nowise exists and is absolutely nothing cannot be understood.”  But James also thinks that the necessity of positing distinct ideas in God follows from a consideration of God's essence. God enjoys the highest degree of nobility and goodness. His mode of knowledge must be commensurate with his nature. But according to Proclus, an author James is quite fond of quoting, the highest form of knowledge is knowledge through a thing's cause. That means that God knows things through his own essence. However, he does so by knowing his essence as a cause, and that is possible only by knowing “something (aliquid) through a cause, not merely by knowing that which is the cause (i.e., God)”.

Although James' insistence on the distinctness of ideas with respect to God's essence is reminiscent of Henry of Ghent's teaching, it is important to note, as has been stressed by M. Gossiaux (2007), that James does not conceive of this distinctness as Henry does. For Henry, ideas possess esse essentiae; James, by contrast, while referring to divine ideas as things (res), is careful to add that they are not things “in the absolute sense but only determinately,” viz., as cognized objects (Quodl. I, q. 5, p. 63, 60). Thus, divine ideas for James possess a lesser degree of distinction from God's essence than do Henry of Ghent's. Nevertheless, because James did consider ideas to be distinct in some sense from God, his position would be viewed by some later authors—e.g., William of Alnwick—as compromising divine unity.

3. Metaphysics

3.1 Analogy

The concept of being, all the medievals agreed, is common. What was debated was the nature of the commonness. According to James of Viterbo, all commonness is founded on some agreement, and this agreement can be either merely nominal or grounded in reality. Agreement is nominal when the same name is predicated of wholly different things, without there being any objective basis for the application of the common name; such is the case of equivocal names. Agreement is real in the following two cases: (1) if it is based on some essential resemblance between the many things to which a particular concept applies, in which case the concept applies to these many things by virtue of the self same ratio and is said of them univocally; or (2) if that concept is truly common to the many things of which it is said, although it is not said of them relative to the same nature (ratio), but as prior to one and posterior to the others, insofar as these are related in a certain way to the first. A concept that is predicated of things in this way is said to be analogous, and the agreement displayed by the things to which it applies is said to be an agreement of attribution (convenientia attributionis). James believes that it is according to this sense of analogy that being is said of God and creatures, and of substance and accident (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis I, q. 1, p. 25, 674–80). For being is said in a prior sense of God and in a posterior sense of creatures by virtue of a certain relation between the two; likewise, being is said first of substance and secondarily of accidents, on account of the relation of posteriority accidents have to substance. The reason why being is said in a prior sense of God and in a secondary sense of creatures and, hence, the reason why the ‘ratio’ or nature of being is different in the two cases is that being, in God, is “the very thing which God is” (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 1, p. 16, 412), whereas created being is only being through something added to it. From this first difference follows a second, namely, that created being is being by virtue of being related to an agent, whereas uncreated being has no relation. These two differences can be summarized by saying that divine being is being through itself (per se), whereas created being is being through another (per aliud) (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 1, p. 16, 425–6). In sum, being is said of God and creature, but according to a different ratio: it is said of God according to the proper and perfect nature of being, but of creatures in a derivative or secondary way.

3.2 The Distinction of Being and Essence

James' most detailed discussion of the distinction between being and essence occurs in the context of a question that asks if creation could be saved if being (esse) and essence were not different (Quodl. I, q. 4). His answer is that although he finds it difficult to see how one could account for creation if being and essence were not really different, he does not believe it is necessary to conceive of the real distinction in the way in which “certain Doctors” do. Which Doctors does he have in mind? In Quodl. I, q. 4, he summarizes the views of three authors: Godfrey of Fontaines, according to whom the distinction is only conceptual (secundum rationem); Henry of Ghent, for whom esse is only intentionally different from essence, a distinction that is less than a real distinction but greater than a rational distinction; and finally, Giles of Rome, for whom esse is one thing (res), and essence another. Thus, James agrees with Giles, and disagrees with Henry and Godfrey, that the distinction between being and essence is real; however, he disagrees with Giles about the proper way of understanding the real distinction.

The starting point of his analysis is Anselm's statement in the Monologion that the substantive lux (light), the infinitive lucere (to emit light), and the present participle lucens (emitting light) are related to each other in the same way as essentia (essence), esse (to be), and ens (being). The relation of lucere to lux, he tells us, is the relation of a concrete term to an abstract one. To-emit-light denotes light as an act, just as to-be (esse) denotes essence from the point of view of an act. Now, a concrete term signifies more things than the corresponding abstract term, e.g., esse signifies more things than essence, for essence signifies only the form, whereas esse signifies the form principally and the subject secondarily. By ‘subject’ James means the actually existing thing, which he also calls the aggregate or supposit (Wippel 1981). Esse and essence thus signify the same thing principally, but differ in terms of what they signify secondarily. Although this difference is only conceptual in the case of God, it is real in the case of creatures. It is this difference that explains why one does not predicate to-emit-light (lucere) of light itself (lux) or being of essence: what properly exists is that which has essence, viz., the supposit. Esse denotes essence as existing in a supposit.

The kernel of James' solution, then, lies in the distinction between what terms signify primarily and secondarily. To his mind, this is what makes his solution closer in spirit to Giles of Rome than to either Godfrey or Henry, without committing him to a conception of the distinction as rigid as that of Giles. The distinction is real for James, but in a qualified way (Gossiaux 1999). Because identity or difference between things is determined to a greater degree by primary rather than by secondary signification, it follows that essence and existence are primarily and absolutely the same (idem) and conditionally or secondarily distinct. Yet, although the distinction is conditional or secondary, it is nonetheless necessary and points to a real composition in creatures. 

3.3 Relations

James devotes five of his Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis (qq. 11–15), representing some 270 pages of edited text, to the question of relations. It is with a view to providing a proper account of divine relations, he explains, that it is “necessary to examine the nature of relation with such diligence” (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 11, p. 12, 300–301). But before turning to Trinitarian relations, James devotes the whole of q.11 to the status of relations in general. The following account focuses exclusively on q. 11. James in essence adopts Henry of Ghent's “modalist” solution, which was to exercise considerable influence among late thirteenth-century thinkers (Henninger 1989), although he disagrees with Henry about the proper way of understanding what a mode is.

The question boils down to whether relations exist in some manner in extra-mental reality or solely through the operation of the intellect, like second intentions (species and genera). Many arguments can be adduced in support of each position, as Simplicius had already shown in his commentary on Aristotle's Categories—a work that would have a decisive influence on James' thought. For instance, in support of the view that relations are not real, one may point out that the intellect is able to apprehend relations between existents and non-existents, e.g., the relation between a father and his deceased son; yet, there cannot be anything real in the relation given that one of the two relata is a non-existent. But if so, then the same must be true of all relations, as the intellectual operation involved is the same in all cases. Another argument concerns the way in which relations come to be and cease to be. This appears to happen without any change taking place in the subject which the relation is said to affect. For instance, a child who has lost his mother is said to be an orphan until the age of eighteen, at which point it ceases to be one, although no change has occurred: “the relation recedes or ceases by reason of the mere passage of time.”

But good reasons can also be found in support of the opposing view. For one, Aristotle clearly considers relations to be real, as they constitute one of the ten categories that apply to things outside the soul. Furthermore, according to a view commonly held by the scholastics, the perfection of the universe cannot consist solely of the perfection of the individual things of which it is made; it is also determined by the relations those things have to each other; hence, those relations must be real.

The correct solution to the question of whether relations are real or not, James contends, depends on assigning to a given relation no more but no less reality than is fitting to it. Those who rely on arguments such as the first two above to infer that relations are entirely devoid of reality are guilty of assigning relations too little reality; those who appeal to arguments such as the last two, showing that relations are distinct from their subjects in the way in which things are distinct from each other, assign too great a degree of reality to relations. The correct view must lie somewhere in between: relations are real, but are not distinct from their subjects in the way one thing is distinct from another.

That they must be real is sufficiently shown by the first Simplician arguments mentioned above, to which James adds some others of his own. However, showing that they are not things is slightly more complicated. James' position, in fact, is that relations are not things “properly and absolutely speaking,” but only “in a certain way according to a less proper way of speaking.” A relation is not a thing in an absolute sense because of the “meekness” of its being, for which reason “it is like a middle point between being and non-being” (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 11, p. 30, 668–9). The reasoning behind this last statement is as follows: the more intrinsic some principle is to a thing, the more that thing is said to be through it; what is maximally intrinsic to a thing is its substance; a thing is therefore maximally said to be on account of its substance. Now a thing's being related to another is, in the constellation of accidents that qualify that thing, what is minimally intrinsic to it and thus farthest from its being, and so closest to non-being. But if relations are not things, at least in the absolute sense, what are they? James answers that they are modes of being of their foundations. “The mode of being of a thing does not differ from the thing in such a way as to constitute another essence or thing. The relation, therefore, is not different from its foundation” (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 11, p. 33, 745–7). Speaking of relations as modes allows us to acknowledge their reality, as attested by experience, without hypostasizing them. A certain number's being equal to another is clearly something distinct from the number itself. The number and its being equal are two “somethings” (aliqua), says James; they are not, however, two things; they are two in the sense that one is a thing (the number) and the other is a mode of being of the number.

In making relations modes of being of the foundation, James was clearly taking his cue from Henry of Ghent, who has been called “the chief representative of the modalist theory of relation” (Henninger 1989). For Henry and James, relations are real in the sense that they are distinct from their foundations and belong to extra mental reality. However, James' understanding of the way in which a relation is a mode differs from Henry's. For Henry, a thing's mode is the same thing as its ratio or nature; it is the particular type of being that thing has, what “specifies” it. But according to James' understanding of the term, a mode lies beyond the ratio of a thing, like an accident of that thing (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, p. 34, 767–8). In conclusion, one could say that in his discussion of relations, James was guided by the same motivation as many of his contemporaries, namely securing the objectivity of relations without conferring full-blooded existence upon them. Relations do exhibit some form of being, James believed, but it is a most faint one (debilissimum), the existence of a mode qua accident.

3.4 Individuation

James discusses individuation in two places: Quodl. I, q. 21 and Quodl. II, q. 1. I will focus on the first treatment, because it is the lengthier of the two and because the tenor of James' brief remarks on individuation in Quodl. II, q. 1, despite certain similarities with his earlier discussion (Wippel 1994), make it hard to see how they fit into an overall theory of individuation.

The question James faces in Quodl. I, q. 21 is a markedly theological one, namely whether, if the soul were to take on other ashes at resurrection, a man would be numerically the same as he was before. In order to answer that question, James tells us, it is first necessary to determine what the cause of numerical unity is in the case of composite beings. There have been numerous answers to that question and James provides a short account of each. Some philosophers have appealed to quantity as the principle of numerical unity; others to matter; others yet to matter as subtending indeterminate dimensions; finally, others have turned to form as the cause of individuation. According to James, each of these answers is part of the correct explanation though it is insufficient if taken on its own. The correct view, according to him, is that form and matter taken together are the principal causes of numerical identity in the composite, with quantity contributing something “in a certain manner.” Form and matter, however, are principal causes in different ways; more precisely, each accounts for a different kind of numerical unity. For by ‘singularity’ we can really mean two distinct things: we can mean the mere fact of something's being singular, or we can point to a thing qua “something complete and perfect within a certain species” (Quodl. I, 21, 227, 134–35). It is matter that accounts for the first kind of singularity, and form for the second. Put otherwise, the kind of unity that accrues to a thing on account of its being a mere singular, results from the concurrence of the “substantial” unity provided by matter and the “accidental” unity provided by quantity. By contrast, the unity that characterizes a thing by virtue of the perfection or completeness it displays is conferred to it by the form, which is the principle of perfection and actuality in composites.

Although James thinks he can quite legitimately enlist the support of such prestigious authorities as Aristotle and Averroes in favor of the view that matter and form together are constitutive of a thing's numerical unity, his solution has struck commentators as a somewhat contrived and ad hoc attempt to reach a compromise solution at all costs (Pickavé 2007; Wippel 1994). James, it has been suggested, “seems to be driven by the desire to offer a compromise position with which everyone can to some extent agree” (Pickavé 2007: 55). Such a suggestion does accord with what we know about James' temperament, namely, his dislike of controversy and his tendency, on the whole, to prefer solutions that present a “middle way” (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 11, p. 23, 513; Quodl. II, q. 7, p. 108, 118; De regimine christiano, 210; see also Quodl. II, q. 5, p. 65, 208–209). However, James' professions of moderation must sometimes be taken with a grain of salt, as there are some positions he wants to pass off as moderate that are quite far from being so, as we will see in Section 7 below.

4. Natural Philosophy (The Doctrine of Seminal Reasons)

The belief that matter contains the ‘seeds’ of all the forms that can possibly accrue to it is one of the hallmarks of James of Viterbo's thought, as is the belief that the soul pre-contains, in the shape of “propensities” (idoneitates), all the sensitive, intellective, and volitional forms it is able to take on. We will look at James' doctrine of propensities in the intellect in Section 5, and his doctrine of propensities in the will in Section 6. In this section, we present James' arguments in favor of seminal reasons.

One important reason for subscribing to the existence of seminal reasons is that the doctrine enjoys the support of Augustine.  Although James is sometimes quite critical of his Augustinian contemporaries, including his predecessor Giles of Rome, he is an unreserved follower of Augustine, especially when it comes to the greater philosophical issues, such as knowledge and natural causation. However, what is particularly interesting about James is the way in which he enlists such decidedly un-Augustinian sources as Aristotle, Averroes, and especially Simplicius in the service of his Augustinian convictions (Côté 2009).

James offers a thorough discussion of seminal reasons in Quodl. II, q. 5.   The question he raises there is not so much whether there are seminal reasons, for this is “admitted by all Catholic doctors” (Quodl. II, q. 5, p. 59, 16), but rather, how one is to properly conceive of them. A seminal reason, according to James, has two characteristics: it is (1) an inchoate state of the form to be, and (2) an active principle. Most of the discussion in Quodl. II, q. 5 is devoted to establishing the first point. James thinks that the thesis that forms are present in potency in matter is consonant with the teaching of Aristotle, who, he claims, follows a “middle way” on the issue of generation, eschewing both the position that forms are created, and also Anaxagoras' “hidden-forms hypothesis,” according to which all forms are contained in act in everything. Now to say that forms are present in matter inchoately or in potency, according to James, entails that the potency of matter is something distinct from matter itself. One argument in favor of this thesis is that matter is not corrupted by the taking on of a form: it remains in potency towards other forms. Also, potency is relational, whereas matter is absolute. When James states that matter is distinct from potency he does not mean to say that they are entirely distinct or unconnected, quite the contrary: potency is the potency of matter. However, potency adds three characteristics to the concept of matter. First, it adds the idea of a relation to a form (matter is in potency towards a form); second, it adds the idea that the form to which it is related is a form it lacks; finally, it implies that the form which matter lacks is a form it has the capacity to acquire, for as James explains, one does not say that a stone is in potency toward the power of sight merely because it lacks sight. In order for something to be in potency toward a particular form it must both lack that form and also possess an aptitude to take it on. James neatly summarizes his views in the following passage: “[the potency of matter] denotes a respect of the matter toward the form, attendant upon its lacking that form and having the aptitude to take it on, so that four properties are included in the concept of potency, namely matter, lack of form, aptitude toward the form and a respect toward the form insofar as it is educible by an agent and motor cause” (Quodl. II, q. 5, p. 69, 359 – p. 70, 363).

The originality of James' position lies in the way in which he conceives matter's aptitudes. The term “aptitude” has a precise technical meaning, which he fleshes out with the help of Simplicius' commentary on the Categories. It denotes a certain incipient or inchoative state of the form in matter. Potency and act, James tells us, are two states or modes of the same thing, not two distinct things. What exists in the mode of actuality must preexist in the mode of potency, but in an inchoate way. James is aware of the several objections that may be leveled against his conception of aptitudes or propensities. The most serious of these is perhaps the charge that their existence makes generation, i.e., the production of new beings, impossible or useless. James replies by suggesting that those who argue in this fashion misconstrue Aristotle's doctrine of change. For change, according to Averroes' understanding of Aristotle (see Quodl. III, q. 14), does not result from an agent's implanting a form in a receiving subject, for this would imply that forms “migrate” from subject to subject; it results rather from an agent's making that which is in potency to be in act. For this to occur, however, more is required than the mere passive potency of matter: the seminal reason must also be viewed as an active principle. The activity of potency manifests itself in the shape of a natural inclination or tendency to attain its completion.  Generation thus requires two things (besides God's general operative causality): the “transmutative” agency of an extrinsic cause and the intrinsic agency of the formae inchoativum which inclines the potency to attain its completion.

James' doctrine of seminal reasons would elicit considerable criticism in the early fourteenth century and beyond (Phelps 1980). The initial reaction came from Dominicans, e.g., Bernard of Auvergne, the author of a series of Impugnationes (i.e., attacks) contra Jacobum de Viterbio, and John of Naples who argued against James' distinction between the potency of matter and potency. But James' theory would also encounter resistance from within the Augustinian Order, e.g., from Alphonsus Vargas of Toledo.

5. Cognition

James' doctrine of cognition must also be understood in the context of his thoroughgoing Augustinianism and against the backdrop of the late thirteenth-century arguments against Thomistic abstraction theories. According to Thomas Aquinas' theory of knowledge, the agent intellect abstracts a thing's form or essential information from the image or representation of that thing. The outcome of this process was what Aquinas called the intelligible species, which was then taken to “move” the possible intellect to conceptual understanding. However, as thinkers such as Vital du Four and Richard of Middleton were to point out (see the articles by Robert and Noone), the information coming in through the senses is related to a thing's accidental properties, not to its substance. How, then, could abstraction from the senses produce an intelligible species relating to the thing's essence?

Although James of Viterbo agreed by and large with the spirit of this objection and believed that the replies by proponents of abstractionism were unsuccessful, he had another reason for rejecting the theory. This was because it implied a view of the intellect which he thought to be profoundly mistaken, namely, the view that there is a real distinction between the agent intellect (which abstracts the species) and the possible intellect (which receives it). If it were truly the case, he reasoned, that one needed to posit a distinct agent intellect because phantasms are only potentially intelligible, then, by the same token, one would have to posit an “agent sense”, because sensibles “are only sensed in potency” (Quodl. I, q. 12, p. 164, 234). But given that no proponent of abstraction admits an agent sense, one should not allow them an agent intellect. Furthermore, if there were an agent intellect distinct from the possible intellect, it would be a natural power of the soul and so would be required for the cognition of all intelligibles, not just a certain class of them. Similarly, qua natural power, its use would be required not only in the present life but also in the afterlife. But of course that would be absurd, as the agent intellect, ex hypothesi, is only necessary to abstract form from matter, something the mind does only when it is joined to a corruptible body. 

James was well aware that by denying the distinction between the two intellects, he was opposing the consensus view of Aristotle commentators. Indeed, his views seem to run counter to the De anima itself, though, as he would mischievously point out, it was difficult to determine just what Aristotle's doctrine was, so obscure was its formulation (Quodl. I, q. 12, p. 169, 426—170, 439). He replied that what he was denying was not the existence of a “difference” in the soul, but merely that the existence of a difference implied a distinction of powers (Quodl. I, q. 12, p. 170, 440–45). The intellect, he held, was both in act and in potency, active and passive, but one could account for its having these contrary properties without resorting to the two intellect model. This is because intellection is not a transient action (like hitting a ball), requiring an active subject distinct from a passive recipient; rather, it is an immanent action (like shining). James' solution, in other words, was to conceive of the intellect (as indeed the will) as essentially dynamic, as an “incomplete actuality”, its own formal cause, spontaneously tending toward its completion, much in the way seminal reasons tend toward their completing forms—indeed both discussions drew their inspiration from the same source: Simplicius' commentary on Aristotle's analysis of the second species of quality. The intellect was described as a general (innate) propensity made up of a series of more specific (equally innate) propensities, the number of which was a function of the number of different things the intellect is able to know: “The intellective power is a general propensity with respect to all intelligibles, that is, with respect to the actual conforming to all intelligibles. On this general propensity are founded other specific ones, which follow the diversity of intelligibles” (Quodl. VII, q. 7, p. 93, 453–55). Of course, as James readily acknowledged, although the intellect is its own formal cause, it cannot issue forth an act of intellection without some input from the senses. However, the type of causality the senses were viewed as exercising was deemed to be purely “excitatory” or “inclinatory” (Quodl. I, q. 12, p. 175, 613–16), making the senses not the principal but rather an instrumental cause of intellection. In all, three causes account for the operation of the intellect, according to James: 1) God as efficient cause; 2) the soul and its propensities as formal cause, and 3) the object presented by the senses as “excitatory” cause.

Although, as we have just seen, James rejected the distinction between the agent and possible intellects, there was another, equally widely-held distinction in the area of psychology that he did maintain, namely the distinction between the soul and its powers.

For the purposes of this article, it will suffice to think of the debate regarding the relation of the soul to its powers as being motivated at least in part by the need to provide a coherent understanding of the soul's structure and operations in view of two inconsistent but equally authoritative accounts of the soul's relation to its powers. One was that of Augustine, who had asserted that memory, intelligence, and will (i.e., three powers) were one in substance (De trinitate X, 11), and so believed that the soul was identical with its powers; the other was Aristotle's, who clearly believed in a certain distinction, and whose remarks about natural capacities (dunameis) as belonging to the second species of quality, in Categories c. 8,14–27, and hence to the category of accident, making them distinct from the soul's essence, were commonly applied by the scholastics to the soul's powers. Each view, of course, had its supporters; and, naturally, as was so often the case, attempts were made to find a middle way that would accommodate both positions. During James' tenure as Master at the University of Paris, the majority view was very much that there was a real distinction. It was the view held by many of the scholastics whose teachings he studied most carefully, namely Aquinas, Giles of Rome, and Godfrey of Fontaines. There was, however, a commonly discussed minority position, one that eschewed both real distinction and identity: that of Henry of Ghent. Henry believed that the powers of the soul were “intentionally”, not really, distinct from its essence. James, however, sided with Thomas, Giles, and Godfrey, against Henry (Quodl. II, q. 14, p. 160, 70–71; Quodl. III, q. 5, p. 83, 56—84, 63). His reasoning was as follows. Given that everyone agreed that there was a real distinction between the soul and one of its powers in act (between the soul and, e.g., an occurrent act of willing), then if one denied that there was a real distinction between the soul and its powers, as Henry had, one would be committed to the existence of a real distinction between the power in act (e.g., an occurrent act of willing) and that same power in potency (that is, the will, qua power, as able to produce that act), since the power in act is really the same as the soul. But as we saw in the preceding section, something in potency is not really distinct from that same thing in act. This followed from James' reading of Simplicius' account of qualities in the latter's commentary on Aristotle's Categories. For instance, seminal reasons are not really distinct from the fully-fledged forms that proceed from them, nor are intellective “propensities” really distinct from the fully actualized cognized forms. Hence, James concluded, the powers must be really distinct from the soul's essence.

6. Ethics

6.1 Freedom of the Will

The question of the will's freedom was of paramount importance to the scholastics. Unlike modern thinkers, for whom establishing that the will is free is tantamount to showing that its act falls outside the natural nexus of cause and effect, showing that the will is free, for medieval thinkers, usually involved showing that its act is independent of the apprehension and judgment of the intellect. Although the scholastics generally granted that a voluntary act results from the interplay between will and intellect, most of them preferred to single out one of the two faculties as the principal determinant of free choice. Thus, for Henry of Ghent, the will is the sole cause of its free act (Quodl. I, q. 17), so much so that he tends to relegate the intellect's role to that of a sine qua non cause. For Godfrey of Fontaines, by contrast, it is the intellect that exercises the decisive motion (Quodl. III, q. 16). Although James of Viterbo sometimes claims to want to steer a middle course between Henry and Godfrey (Quodl. II, q. 7), his preferences clearly lie with a position like that of Henry's, as can be gathered from his most detailed treatment of the question in Quodl. I, q. 7.

James' thesis in Quodl. I, q. 7 is that the will is a self-mover and that the object grasped by the intellect moves the will only metaphorically. His main challenge is to show is that this position is compatible with the Aristotelian principle that whatever is moved is moved by another.

As we saw in the previous section, James believes that the soul is made up of what he calls “aptitudes” or “propensities” (idoneitates), which are the similitudes of all things knowable and desirable, “before [the soul] actually knows or desires them” (Quodl. I, q. 7, p. 91, 407 – p. 92, 408). The pre-existence of such aptitudes implies that the soul is neither a purely passive potency nor made up of fully actualized forms, but rather an “incomplete actuality” or, perhaps more correctly, a set of “incomplete actualities,” which James describes as being “naturally inserted in [the soul], and thus, remaining in it permanently, though sometimes in an imperfect state, sometimes in a state perfected by the act” (Quodl. I, q. 7, p. 92, 419–24).

In order to show how this view of the soul is compatible with Aristotle's postulate that every motion requires a mover distinct from the thing moved, James introduces a distinction between two sorts of motion: efficient and formal. Efficient motion occurs when motion is caused by a thing that possesses the complete form of the particular motion caused; formal motion occurs when the moving thing has the incomplete form of the thing moved. Heating is given as an example of the first kind of motion; “gravity” or rather heaviness, i.e., the tendency of heavy bodies to fall, is cited as an example of the second kind of motion. Aristotle's principle applies only to the first kind of motion, James asserts, not the second. Things which possess an incomplete form naturally—i.e., in and of themselves without an external mover—tend to their completion and are prevented from reaching it only by the presence of an external obstacle. For instance, a heavy object naturally tends to move downward and will do so unless it is hindered. Such, mutatis mutandis, is the case of the soul and especially of the will: the will as an incomplete actuality naturally tends to its completion; in that sense, that is, formally but not efficiently, it is self-moved. The difference between it and the heavy object is that whereas the object moves upon the removal of an obstacle, the will requires the presence of an object; it requires, in other words, the intervention of the intellect in order to direct it to a particular object. However, once again, the intellect's action is viewed by James as being merely metaphorical, that is, extrinsic to the will's proper operation.

6.2 Connection of the Virtues

Like Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas, James of Viterbo holds that the moral virtues, considered as habits, i.e., virtuous dispositions or acts, are connected. In other words, he believes that one cannot have one of the virtues without having the others as well. The virtues he has in mind are what he calls the “purely” moral virtues, that is, courage, justice, and temperance, which he distinguishes from prudence, which is a partly moral, partly intellectual virtue. In his discussion in Quodl. II, q. 17 James begins by granting that the question is difficult and proceeds to expound Aristotle's solution, which he will ultimately adopt. As James sees it, Aristotle proves in Nicomachean Ethics VI the connection of the purely moral virtues by showing their necessary relation to prudence, and this is to show that just as moral virtue cannot be had without prudence, prudence cannot be had without moral virtue. The connection of the purely moral virtues follows from this: they are necessarily connected because (1) each is connected to prudence and (2) prudence is connected to the virtues (Quodl. II, q. 17, p. 187, 436 – p. 188, 441).

6.3 Love of Self vs. Love of God

Since the time of Augustine, theologians had agreed that man needs the gift of grace in order to love God more than himself, and that he cannot do so by natural means. However, in the early thirteenth century, theologians raised the question of whether, at least in his pre-lapsarian state, man did not love God more than himself. That this was in fact the case was the belief of Philip the Chancellor as well as Thomas Aquinas. Other authors, such as Godfrey of Fontaines and Giles of Rome, argued further that to deny man the natural capacity to love God more than himself, while allowing this to happen as a result of grace, was to imply that the operations of grace went counter to the those of nature, which was contrary to the universally accepted axiom that grace perfects nature and does not destroy it. By contrast, James of Viterbo famously argues in Quodl. II, q. 2, against the overwhelming consensus of theologians, that man naturally loves himself more than God. He has two arguments to show this (see Osborne 1999 and 2005 for a detailed commentary). The first is based on the principle that the mode of natural love is commensurate with the mode of being and, hence, of the mode of being one. Now a thing is one with itself by virtue of numerical identity, but it is one with something else by virtue of a certain conformity. For instance Socrates is one with himself by virtue of his being Socrates, but he is one with Plato by virtue of the fact that both share the same form. But the being something has by virtue of numerical identity is “greater” than the being it has by reason of something it shares with another. And given that the species of natural love follows the mode of being, it follows that it is more perfect to love oneself than to love another (Quodl. II, q. 20, p. 206, 148 – p. 149, 165). The second argument attempts to infer the desired thesis from the universally accepted premise that “the love of charity elevates nature” (Quodl. II, q. 20, p. 207, 166–67). This is true both of the love of desire and the love of friendship. In the case of love of desire, grace elevates by acting on the character of love: by natural love of desire we love God as the universal good. Through grace God is loved as the beatifying good. Regarding love of friendship, James explains that God's charity can only elevate nature with respect to its “mode,” that is, with respect to the object loved, by making God, not the self, the object of love. In other words, James is telling us that if we are to take seriously the claim that grace elevates nature, there is only one way in which this can occur, namely by making God, not the self, the object of greatest love, which implies that in his natural state man loves himself more than God.

James' opposition to the consensus position on the issue of the love of self vs. the love of God would not go unnoticed. In the years following his death, such authors as Durand of Saint-Pourçain and John of Naples criticized him vigorously and attempted to refute his position (Jeschke 2009).

7. Political Thought

Although James touches briefly on political issues in Quodl. I, q. 17 (see Côté, 2012), his most extensive discussions occur in his celebrated De regimine christiano (On Christian Government), written in 1302 during the bitter conflict pitting Boniface VIII against the king of France Philip IV (the Fair). De regimine christiano is often compared in aim and content with Giles of Rome's De ecclesiastica potestate (On Ecclesiastical Power), which offers one of the most extreme statements of pontifical supremacy in the thirteenth century; indeed, in the words of De regimine's editor, James' goal is “to formulate a theory of papal monarchy that is every bit as imposing and ambitious as that of [Giles]” (De regimine christiano: xxxiv). However, as scholars have also recognized, James shows a greater sensitivity to the distinction between nature and grace than Giles (Arquillière 1926). 

De regimine christiano is divided into two parts. The first, dealing with the theory of the Church, is of little philosophical interest, save for James' enlisting of Aristotle to show that all human communities, including the Church, are rooted in the “natural inclination of mankind.” The second and longest part is devoted to defining the nature and extent of Christ's and the pope's power. One of James' most characteristic doctrines is found in Book II, chapter 7, where he turns to the question of whether temporal power must be “instituted” by spiritual power, in other words, whether it derives its legitimacy from the spiritual, or possesses a legitimacy of its own. James states outright that spiritual power does institute temporal power, but notes that there have been two views in this regard. Some, e. g., the proponents of the so-called “dualist” position such as John Quidort of Paris, hold that the temporal power derives directly from God and thus in no way needs to be instituted by the spiritual, while others, such as Giles of Rome in De ecclesiastica potestate, contend that the temporal derives wholly from the spiritual and is devoid of any legitimacy whatsoever “unless it is united with spiritual power in the same person or instituted by the spiritual power” (De regimine christiano: 211).

James is dissatisfied with both positions and, as he so often does, endeavors to find a “middle way” between them. His solution is to say that the “being” of the temporal power's institution comes both from God—by way of man's natural inclination—in “a material and incomplete sense,” and from the spiritual power by which it is “perfected and formed.” This is a very clever solution. On the one hand, by rooting the temporal power in man's natural inclination, albeit in the imperfect sense just mentioned, James was acknowledging the legitimacy of temporal rule independently of its connection to the spiritual, thus “avoid[ing] the extreme and implausible view of [Giles of Rome]” (Dyson 2009: xxix). On the other hand, making the natural origins of temporal power merely the incomplete matter of its being was a way of stressing its subordination and inferiority to the spiritual order, in keeping with his papalist convictions. Still, James' very choice of analogies to illustrate the relationship between the spiritual and temporal realms showed that his solution lay much closer to the theocratic position espoused by Giles of Rome than his efforts to find a “middle way” would have us believe. Thus, comparing the spiritual power's relation to the temporal in terms of the relation of light to color, he explains that although “color has something of the nature of light, (…) it has such a feeble light that, unless there is present a more excellent light by which it may be formed, not in its own nature but in its power, it cannot move the vision” (De regimine christiano: 211). In other words, James is telling us that although temporal power does originate in man's natural inclinations, it is ineffectual qua power unless it is informed by the spiritual.


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Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Giles of Rome | Godfrey of Fontaines | Henry of Ghent