Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to God and Other Necessary Beings

1. The sort of necessity I have in mind here and throughout is necessity of the metaphysical or broadly logical sort (see Plantinga 1974a).

2. Unless otherwise specified, the abstract objects of which I speak in this essay are of the sort that exist necessarily (as opposed to, say, sets with contingent members). The reader also will notice that I'm assuming David Lewis' (1986) metaphysics of possible worlds is false.

3. See Leftow (1989) for helpful discussion of Leibniz on this matter.

4. See Plantinga (1982) for a contemporary rendering of this suggestion.

5. There is some possible nuance in the Cartesian position I ignore here. In particular, it might be claimed not that what is “necessarily true” could have been false on Descartes picture, but that what's necessarily true isn't necessarily necessarily true. See Plantinga (1980) for discussion of this. See also Conee (1991) for further discussion of a Cartesian conception of omnipotence.

6. See Plantinga (1980), Stump and Kretzmann (1985), Mann (1982), and Wolterstorff (1991). More recently, see Bergmann and Brower (2006). Bergmann and Brower themselves take the sorts of circularity worries raised later on in the present entry to tell in favor of divine simplicity.

7. See also Zagzebski (1990), Roy (unpublished), Yandell (1994), Mares (1997), Nolan (1997), Yagasawi (1988), and Davis (2006).

8. See Plantinga (1982) for a particularly clear statement of this view. See also Morris and Menzel (1987).

9. This is the sort of account that Thomas Morris and Christopher Menzel adopt, and they are the foremost contemporary proponents of the view that abstract objects depend on God. See Morris and Menzel (1987) and Menzel (1990).

10. See Morris and Menzel 1987, p. 184.

11. See Leftow 1990, Davidson 1999, and Bergmann and Brower (2006) for statements of this sort of objection.

12. This is Morris and Menzel's (1987) response to this objection.

13. Leftow (1990, pp. 201-203) sketches concerns for the theistic activist that there are problematically-circular dependence relationship between divine attributes and God's creating properties. He develops in more detail (pp. 202-205) an argument that God creates himself on a theistic activist picture. I think that the statement of the argument here that the theistic activist is committed to divine self-creation is less-open to replies from the theistic activist. In particular, I think that Leftow slides between reading relevant terms rigidly and non-rigidly in some of his counterexamples.

Bergmann and Brower (2006) also give an argument that there is a problematic circularity that the theistic activist must embrace. Put this way, it seems to me that the conclusion is correct. But they rely on the notion of "logical dependence" in their argument, and it's not at all clear to me what their "logical dependence" is supposed to be. (It's not entailment, for one.) Pursuit of in-depth criticisms of Leftow or Bergman/Brower is beyond the scope of this entry, however.

14. Or, we might make sense of the claim that a proposition depends on its constituents in the same sort of manner, if its constituents are properties, relations, and the like.

15. Necessarily, a property p is an individual essence iff (a) it is possible that p is exemplified; and (b) necessarily, if there is an x that exemplifies p, then (i) necessarily, if x exists, x exemplifies p and (ii) necessarily, if there is a y which exemplifies p, then x = y.

16. Though see Merricks (2007), Sider (2011), and Davidson (forthcoming) for further discussion of grounding.