Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Facts

On the History of Philosophies of Facts

1. Facts as True Propositions

Frege is an influential friend of the view that facts are true truth-bearers. He writes in 1918 that a “fact is a thought that is true” (Frege 1988 p. 35; Ramsey 1931). Dummett comments: “Facts, as true thoughts, … belong, not to the realm of reference, but to that of sense” (Dummett 1973, p. 442; Ducasse 1968, Dodd 2000). Did Frege think that all true thoughts are facts? He had earlier reserved the term “fact” for non-provable, non-general truths (Frege 1950 §3, cf. §77; Levine 1996). But the founder of modern semantics has almost no use for the category of facts understood as anything other than true thoughts or for the category of states of affairs. (“Almost” because in his Begriffsschrift Frege refers to circumstances, for example the circumstance that a perpetuum mobile is possible (Frege 1964 §5; on this exception, see Frege 1964 pp. 117-118, Gardies 1985 ch. 7).) Frege's great predecessor, Bolzano, had no use for facts or states of affairs, nor did Frege's great successor, Tarski.

2. Facts as Exemplifications

F. H. Bradley used the word “fact” as a technical philosophical term towards the end of the nineteenth century. It seems very likely that he did not use the word to refer to obtaining states of affairs. But just what a Bradleyan fact amounts to is by no means clear. Bradley says that “[e]very kind of fact must possess these two sides of existence and content” where “content” refers to what Bradley calls the “complex of qualities and relations” a fact contains. But he also says that one class of facts, in addition to existence and content, have meaning (Bradley 1928 Vol. I, p. 3). Bradley calls a fact an event or something else which is immediately experienced (Bradley 1893 p. 317) and he rejects disjunctive facts (Bradley 1922 pp. 46-7). Whatever a Bradleyan fact is, influential arguments to the effect that facts must be allowed if Bradley's regress is to blocked can perhaps be traced back to Bradley (1893; see the supplementary document Bradley's Regress in the entry on States of Affairs). Bradley's conception of facts as primitive qualified existents seems to be also one main source of the view here described as the view that facts are exemplifications of properties.

Russell identifies some particular facts with occurrences such as the death of Socrates and others with what he calls “conditions”, for example the condition of the weather in 1918 (Russell 1990 p. 40, Russell 1967 p. 227, p. 268, p. 288; cf. Wisdom 1931, Austin 1970). Such particular facts, he also says, consist in the possession of qualities or properties by things (Russell 1990 59). In 1921 McTaggart, too, conceives of facts as sui generis entities in which objects possess qualities or stand in relations:

If I say “the table is square” the only thing which can make my assertion true is the fact that the table is square — that is, the possession by the table of the quality of squareness (McTaggart 1921 Vol. I, §9 p. 10).

Indeed he “defines” a fact as “either the possession by anything of a quality, or the connection of anything with anything by a relation”. Substances, qualities, relations and facts are existents and McTaggart does not seem to think of qualities or relations as parts of facts (McTaggart 1921 Vol. I, §10 p. 11).

Facts so conceived might be called B-Facts, in honour of Bradley or of the many British philosophers who espoused such creatures (Wisdom 1931, 1970), were it not the case that by far the most powerful defence of such facts is due to the Australian philosopher, David Armstrong. An Armstrongian state of affairs (or fact) exists “if an only if a particular (at a later point to be dubbed a thin particular) has a property or, instead, a relation holds between two or more particulars. Each state of affairs, and each constituent of each state of affairs, meaning by their constituents the particulars, properties, relations and, in the case of higher-order states of affairs, lower-order states of affairs, is a contingent existence” (Armstrong 1997 p. 1; for an ontology of facts some of which contain substantial universals, see Johansson 2004; one of Armstrong's critics argues that Armstrong's 1997 account of facts as truthmakers implicitly appeals to an ontological kind he seeks to avoid: states of affairs as possibilia, which are facts only if they obtain (Hochberg 1999)).

3. Facts as obtaining states of affairs

The category of obtaining states of affairs is prominent in the writings of Husserl and Meinong, and of their numerous followers. Meinong speaks of obtaining objectives, rather than of obtaining states of affairs, since, as he correctly points, out the term “Sachverhalt” connotes factuality in ordinary language (Meinong 1902 GA IV p. 101). Husserl in 1901 calls “an objective state of affairs” a “fact” (Husserl 1973 V §33, p. 623)). According to Meinong in 1902, “an objective, which obtains, is also called [a] ‘fact’ ” (Meinong 1902 189; 1977 GA IV 69). Husserl and his followers employ the term “fact” for obtaining states of affairs only infrequently and typically employ the term to refer to contingent matters of fact. Meinong and his followers, on the other hand, devote a great deal of attention to what they call factual objectives and facts in their theories of semantics and of modality (Sierszulska 2006).

As already noted, Wittgenstein announces in 1921 that the world is the totality (Gesamtheit) of facts, that all facts are contingent and that a fact is the obtaining or non-obtaining of a state of affairs. Black comments:

Against the background of earlier metaphysics, the outstanding innovation of Wittgenstein's ontology is his characterisation of the universe ('the world’) as an aggregate of facts, not of things…This sets him off sharply from Aristotle, Spinoza, Descartes — indeed from any of the ‘classical philosophers' who come readily to mind…(Black 1971 27)

Although Husserl, like Meinong, thinks that there are contingent and non-contingent facts, in one early passage he conceives of the world — the Great Matter of Fact — in the same way as Wittgenstein: “For the world is nothing more than the unified objectual totality (gesamte gegenständliche Einheit) corresponding to, and inseparable from, the ideal system of all truths about matter of facts (Tatsachenwahrheit)” (Husserl LU P §36 (6)). “truths about matters of fact” here means truths about Humean matters of fact. But the “totality” Husserl refers to is the totality of facts, in the functorial sense, which corresponds to the system of all truths about matters of fact.

The phenomenologist Max Scheler argues that the question whether the world consists of things or of facts should receive one answer in the world-view of ordinary life and another in the world-view of science. One major difference between the natural world-view of ordinary life (of natural language and natural perception), on the one hand, and the non-natural scientific world-view (and the observations on which it is based), on the other hand, is the difference between the roles of things and obtaining states of affairs. In the former things are prominent, in the latter facts are prominent (Scheler 1973).

Facts as obtaining states of affairs might well be dubbed “Austrian facts” or “A-Facts”, since Husserl, Meinong and Wittgenstein were Austrian philosophers (Morscher 1986).

One of the two most careful accounts of obtaining states of affairs in the tradition which begins with Husserl and Meinong is that given by the German philosopher, Reinach, in 1911 and later. States of affairs, Reinach argues, are either positive or negative, particular or general, contingent or non-contingent and either obtain or do not obtain. Propositions, unlike states of affairs, are true or false. If a state of affairs does not obtain, then the contradictorily opposed state of affairs obtains. The concept of a state of affairs, like that of a process, is indefinable. Objects, (non-repeatable) properties and relations are “elements” or “members” of states of affairs. But not all states of affairs contain objects; an impersonal state of affairs such as the obtaining state of affairs that it is raining does not contain objects. Logic is in the first place the logic of states of affairs and only secondarily the logic of propositions. The logic of propositions is grounded in the logic of states of affairs. Reinach's philosophy of states of affairs, then, is about as baroque as such a philosophy can be. Like Husserl and Meinong, he argues that states of affairs are the primary bearers of modality and that obtaining states of affairs are what explain and what is explained (Reinach 1982; cf. Smith 1989, Meixner 1997). Like Husserl, Meinong and Wittgenstein, he distinguishes between the existence of complexes and their parts, on the one hand, and the obtaining of states of affairs. Reinach's defence of obtaining negative states of affairs and Russell's defence of negative facts were both made public in 1911. Reinach's defence is examined and rejected by another realist phenomenologist, Ingarden (Ingarden 1965 §53), the author of the second of the two most careful accounts of obtaining states of affairs in the phenomenological tradition. Whereas Husserl and Reinach thought of things, processes, states and punctual events as ontologically more fundamental than facts, Ingarden argues that processes and punctual events can be constructed out of states of affairs, objects, properties and relations.

Many phenomenologists and pupils of Meinong claim in passing that obtaining states of affairs or their ilk are what make truth-bearers true (just as many Cambridge philosophers, from Stout to McTaggart, claim in passing that facts as exemplifications make truth-bearers true). But the first explicit theory of truthmaking is given by the German realist phenomenologist, Pfänder, in 1921. According to Pfänder, every true truth-bearer is made true by the obtaining of a state of affairs. This principle of factualist, truthmaker maximalism is itself, he argues, grounded in the essences of truth-bearers and of truth — and of all this we have a priori knowledge (Pfänder 1921, Mulligan 2006).

Husserl initially claimed that truth-bearers and judgings represent states of affairs. But as he became impressed by the argument that, for example, neither the judgement nor the proposition that Sam is sad employ the concept of state of affairs (or the concept of truth) he came round to the view that obtaining states of affairs make propositions true and judgements correct but are not properly speaking represented by these. Every truth-bearer “corresponds” to but does not represent a state of affairs, every state of affairs “belongs to” a proposition and either obtains or does not obtain (Husserl 1913; Husserl 1973 Prolegomena §6, I §12; Husserl 2001).

Many pupils of Husserl, such as Reinach, as well as Wittgenstein, Carnap and Searle endorse versions of the view that truth-bearers represent or stand in some other semantic relation to states of affairs (Wittgenstein 1961 4.1, 4.022, Carnap 1959, Searle 1983).

Russell examines the view that to judge that p is to stand in a relation to an objective which may or may not obtain or exist in 1910 and rejects the view (Russell 1976). In the same year, in Principia Mathematica, Whitehead and Russell (1910 p. 44) claim that “an elementary judgement is true when there is a corresponding complex, and false when there is no corresponding complex”; a complex is any such object as “a having the quality q” or “a and b and c standing in the relation S”; it is anything which occurs in the universe and is not simple. 1910 is also the year in which the view that facts are obtaining states of affairs found one early friend in England: Stout argues that in true judgement there must be an agreement with some reality the mind intends or means; what is before the mind is “a possible alternative” and “what is required to make the judgement true is the identity of this with the actualised alternative”, an “actual fact” (Stout 1910-1911).

The Austrian philosopher G. Bergmann initially defended the view that facts are what are here called exemplifications and later the view that there are actual and potential facts (Bergmann 1992; on Bergmann’s different views and some rivals, see Tegtmeier 1992, Hochberg, H. 2001).

4. Medieval Facts

Investigation of medieval accounts of what it is to be a state of affairs (status rerum), of states of affairs which exist, of states of affairs as bearers of modalities, of facts and of entities which, from the point of view of many twentieth century philosophies, combine properties of states of affairs, of propositions and of sentence meanings, is in its infancy (Elie 1937, Smith 1992, Olson 1987 ch. 2, Berger 1999, Schmutz 2000, Cesalli 2007).

5. Aristotelian Facts

For the view that Aristotle countenanced states of affairs, see Simons 1988 and Crivelli 2004.