Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Facts

Some Formal Theories in the Literature

Here we briefly present some existing formal theories of facts. (Vocabulary and results presented in section 2 are presupposed here.)

Suszko 1968

Suszko 1968 presents an axiomatic modal theory of situations which aims at partly systematizing the ontological views of the Tractatus, formulated in a language containing propositional quantifiers (which he sharply distinguishes from objectual quantifiers) and a binary identity operator ‘=’. Situations are not treated as objects. The appropriate mode of expression for talking “about” situations is to use locutions of type ‘it is a situation that p’, which Suszko defines as follows ‘it is a situation that p = (p = p)’. In order to discuss the theory in the light of what precedes, we shall nevertheless assume that situations are objects, designated by sentences.

In Suszko's theory, every sentence designates a situation. Thus situations have negations, and any finitely many situations can be combined conjunctively and disjunctively. We shall take the facts to be the possible situations (Suszko defines a non-rigid notion of fact, but we will use the one just defined).

Suszko defines a world as a fact such that for every situation p, it necessitates p or it necessitates the negation of p. All the situations which are necessitated by a world are possible, i.e. facts, and every fact is necessitated by some world. We take the domain of a world to be just the set of all situations it necessitates.

In the theory, Modal Criterion holds, as well as No Twins and Plenitude. As we saw, situations have negations, and any finitely many situations can be combined conjunctively and disjunctively. Thus there is an operation of negation on facts, and an operation of conjunction and one of disjunction as well, but restricted to finite collections of facts. This is certainly an accident due to the lack of expressive power of the language, and presumably unrestricted operations should be admitted in suitable extensions of that language.

The notion of a state of affairs is taken as a primitive. States of affairs are facts, they are neither necessary nor impossible, and the negation of a state of affairs is not a state of affairs. Suszko endorses the view that in every possible world, there is at least one obtaining state of affairs, and that every possible world is identical to a conjunction of state of affairs and of negations of state of affairs.

Suszko has an axiom which says that the set of all states of affairs is quasi-independent (our terminology): any finite set of states of affairs is independent in the sense of section 2.3. But the set of all states of affairs itself is not independent, since in every world there is an obtaining state of affairs. (It then follows that the states of affairs are infinitely many.) A theorem states that every situation is a disjunction of worlds, namely the disjunction of all worlds in which it exists. So the set F of all facts is generated by the set of all states of affairs via booleanization. Suszko's theory is thus a variant of t4, and is pretty close to T4: Suszko has quasi-independence where T4 has independence tout-court.

(Suszko discusses the inner structure of facts. He holds that states of affairs are complexes containing properties and objects, raises various questions but does not propose any definitive principles. Notice that Suszko's attempt at systematizing Wittgenstein's ideas on facts departs from Wittgenstein's thought on the matter. As we saw, the latter denies that facts combine by means of boolean operations, and holds that the set of all facts is independent tout court, not just quasi-independent. Finally, see Wolniewicz 1982 for a study partly stemming from Suszko's paper and Wolniewicz 1983 for a more general study, each of which employs an algebraic framework.)

Van Fraassen 1969

Van Fraassen 1977 contains a non-modal theory of facts which he uses to provide a semantic analysis of tautological entailments (Cf. Anderson and Belnap 1975). Here we shall present a modal theory based on it, focusing on facts themselves and their relations to propositions, which departs from the original theory but which retains the core of Van Fraassen's ideas and is of interest in itself.

With each world w we associate a domain Dw of individuals, and we assume that there is a collection of relations. We also assume that there is an operation, the complex-builder, which takes any n-ary relation R and any n members a1, …, an from any domain of individuals to yield a fact [R; a1, …, an]. The facts obtained that way are called complexes. We take for granted that each n-ary relation has a dual, namely that for each n-ary relation R, there is another n-ary relation S such that given any individuals a1, …, an existing in some world, the existence-set of [R; a1, …, an] is the complement of the existence-set of [S; a1, …, an]. We assume that each relation has a unique dual. Notice that the dual of the dual of a relation is the relation itself. Thus there is an operation of negation defined on the set of complexes. We finally take it that there is an operation c of conjunction defined on the set of all facts, and that the set of all complexes generates the set of all facts via conjunction.

Given all these assumptions, it is possible to use facts to formulate a theory of truth for certain kinds of propositions. Instead of working directly with propositions, we shall work with an artificial interpreted formal language whose sentences express all the propositions in question, and only them. The language is a first-order language with individual constants, whose basic predicates express relations and whose variables range over individuals, which verifies the following two conditions: (i) every relation is expressed by some basic predicate of the language, and (ii) every individual (taken from any world) is designated by some constant of the language.

We let the product of some given sets of facts G, H, … be the set of all conjunctions {x, y, …}c for xG, yH, … The set Vw(A) of verifiers of sentence A at world w, and the set Fw(A) of falsifiers of A at world w are sets of facts are defined as follows:

  1. For F a n-place predicate and n1, …, nn constants,
    Vw(F(n1, …, nn)) = {[R; a1, …, an]} and Fw(F(n1, …, nn)) = {[S; a1, …, an]},

    where R is the relation expressed by F, S is the dual of R, and each ni designates the corresponding ai;

  2. VwA) = Fw(A), and FwA) = Tw(A);
  3. Vw(A&B) = the product of Vw(A) and Vw(B), and Fw(A&B) = the union of Fw(A) and Fw(B);
  4. Vw(∀xφ(x)) = the product of all the sets Vw(φ(n)) for n a name of some member of Dw, and Fw(∀xφ(x)) = the union of all the sets Fw(φ(n)) for n a name of some member of Dw.

It is then easy to verify that for every sentence A of our language, A is true in world w iff some verifier of A relative to w exists in w, and A is false in world w iff some falsifier of A relative to w exists in w.

Fine 1982

Fine (Fine 1982) distinguishes between two conceptions of facts, the propositional and the worldly. On the propositional view, facts are derivative upon propositions, the identity of a fact depends on the identity of a given proposition. On that view, every fact is obtained by applying a fact-forming operation to a given proposition. On the worldly conception, facts are not derivative upon propositions. Fine takes it that these two conceptions correspond to two genuine categories of objects, and calls the first truths and the second circumstances. He also distinguishes between two other, orthogonal conceptions of facts, objectualism and anti-objectualism. Objectualism is the view that facts have an internal structure, that they are composed by objects in a certain way, and anti-objectualism the opposite view.

Fine presents three theories of facts framed in the language we have been using here: two anti-objectualist theories, one for truths (F(A)-Cond) and one for circumstances (C-Cond), and a theory of truths under the objectualist view (F-Cond). F-Cond has niceties which make it difficult to present here. F(A)-Cond is just W4 + Modal Criterion, and C-Cond is B2 + B4 + W1 + Modal Criterion. The first theory thus admits of all boolean operations on facts, and the second admits conjunction.

Theory F(A)-Cond is supplemented by the principle according to which there is a 1-1 correspondence C between the facts and the propositions which can be true, such that for any such proposition p and any world, p is true at that world iff the corresponding fact exists in that world, which entails P1. No such principle is introduced to extend C-Cond, but in the informal part of the paper Fine suggests that P2 is the right candidate.

Zalta 1991

Zalta 1991 contains an axiomatic theory of situations, worlds and states of affairs, in the framework of Zalta's theory of abstract objects. Zalta defines situations as abstract objects which encode certain properties, namely properties expressed by predicates of type ‘being such that p’, for ‘p’ a sentence, and only such properties. A situation is part of another one iff every property the first encodes is encoded by the second. States of affairs are what is expressed by sentences. Zalta define worlds as situations of a certain kind: a world is a situation w which is possibly such that it encodes being such that p iff it is the case that p, for any p. We may define the domain Fw of a world w as the set of all situations which are part of that world. On the theory, every possible situation belongs to the domain of some world.

There are two interpretations of the theory. We may take facts to be possible states of affairs, or alternatively, we may take facts to be possible situations and understand ‘state of affairs' as ‘proposition’.

Let us assume the first view. The theory then licences fact-negation, and fact-conjunction and fact-disjunction restricted to finite sets of facts. These restrictions arise from the limited expressive power of the language in which the theory is formulated, it seems that on a natural extension of the theory, the restriction should vanish, in which case the theory would be a variant of t4. No Twins holds, but not Modal Criterion.

Let assume now the second reading of the theory. There is then a theorem which says that each world belongs to its own domain and to it only, so W2 holds. B4 holds, Modal Criterion fails, and there is no negation or disjunction operation on facts. There is an operation of conjunction on facts, restricted to finite collections of facts, due to limitations in expressive power. Again, a natural extension of the theory should drop the restriction, in which case the theory would be a variant of t3. Principle P1 of truthmaking trivially holds: given any proposition p which can be true, the (possible) situation which encodes just the property of being such that p is part of a world (in Zalta's system, this means that the world encodes the property of being such that p) iff the situation is part of that world.