Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Doing vs. Allowing Harm

1. This issue is relevant also to the debate over abortion, the debate over capital punishment, and the more theoretical debate over consequentialism. See Scheffler (1982), Smart (1973) and Williams (1973). See also Haydar (2010)

2. See also Tooley 1972, Singer 1979, and Unger 1996.

3. See Malm (1992) for a response to Kagan. See Asscher (2007) for more interesting criticisms of the contrast strategy.

4. See Thomson (1986) and Foot (1978) for early statements and reactions to the Trolley Problem. See Fischer and Ravizza (eds.) (1992) for a representative sample of reactions to the problem. See Thomson (2008) for Thomson's most recent treatment of the problem. See also Sartorio (2008) for another example of the contrast strategy.

5. We talk about allowing the tree to fall, but we do not talk about “doing the tree fall”. We do of course talk about “making the tree fall” and “causing the tree to fall,” but these terms are to be avoided because they suggest that allowing the tree to fall is not a way of causing it to fall, and, as will be argued below, this is wrong.

6. See, for example, Callahan (1989).

7. This idea, which has its roots in Hume's writings, is developed in Lewis, 1986. Note that the definition mentioned in the text represents the gut idea of the counterfactual account of causation. Subsequent versions are much more complicated, but they all imply that letting die is a kind of causing.

8. See Mackie (1974). According to “transference” accounts of causation, causation consists in the transfer of energy or momentum from one object to another at the point of contact between the objects. Such accounts would indeed imply that allowing was not causing. See Aronsen (1971) . But it seems then that a different premise in the argument for the moral insignificance of the distinction would be in trouble. The thought that one cannot be morally responsible for what one is not causally responsible for now seems dubious. It seemed correct, before because, on the counterfactual accounts, it is very close to the principle that ‘ought’ implies ‘can’. If the transference account of causation is correct, then lack of causal responsibility does not imply inability to make a difference.

9. Or “ if the agent had never existed.” See Kagan (1989), p. 94ff for this version.

10. It might be objected that, had Franz been absent, the death would not have occurred, because the victim would have died a different death, since he would have been killed by Hans rather than by Franz. It seems to me that this response fails, since it is simply asserting the very point at issue: that the counterfactual account implies that Franz killed.

11. See Munthe (1999), for an interesting attack on the claim that the counterfactual distinction is morally significant. Munthe argues that if true, this claim would violate the rule that ‘ought’ implies ‘can’.

12. Quinn uses the expression, “harmful positive agency” for doing harm and “harmful negative agency” for allowing harm. This idea can be traced back at least to Anscombe and Davidson; see Anscombe (1958) and Davidson (1980).

13. Note that Quinn's argument for the moral significance of the distinction doesn't seem to hang on his account of the distinction.

14. See Strudler and Wasserman (1995) for an interesting critique of this point.

15. This nutshell leaves out much important detail. See the original.

16. For example, Dinello (1971). Quinn makes a similar point in (1989).

17. If you feel that whether this counts as a killing depends on other factors such as what the agent knows or desires, add whatever features will make it seem most favorable to me. My point is simply that sometimes an agent can kill while remaining completely immobile. Robin Dillon helped me to see this point. Bennett offers several other reasons for thinking that the immobility objection is not decisive against him. See Bennett (1995), p. 98ff.

18. This objection was suggested by remarks of Paul Wagoner. Note that Skeeter bears obvious resemblances to Harry Frankfurt's famous counterexample to the Principle of Alternative Possibilities. See Frankfurt (1969). It is importantly different from that example, however.

19. In correspondence.

20. For an interesting variation on Bennett's ideas, that may help with the Skeeter case, see Woollard (2008).

21. Does every case of this sort have a victim? It is arguable that every upshot consists in a state or event occurring in some object or objects. Let that object or objects be the ‘victim’ with which, directly or indirectly, the agent interacts.

22. Jonathan Schaffer pointed out that firing a gun is a safety net case—that most triggers work by removing a barrier and “allowing” pent-up energy to release the bullet. This example suggests that we had better put safety net cases on the positive side of the line.

23. It is important to note that the agent is not identical with X. Without this qualification, some very standard cases of allowing would count as positive relevance, since the agent might be said to act on herself to prevent herself from saving the victim. I'm not sure that it even makes sense to talk of an agent acting on herself, or of forces running from her to herself, but if it does, let us exclude such cases.

24. Bernard Williams discusses a case like this. See Williams (1973), pp. 98-99.

25. See Isaacs (1995) for a powerful critique of McMahan. See also Persson and Savulescu (2005) for a critique of McMahan.

26. Matthew Hanser argues that we should recognize a third category here: preventing someone from being saved. I think this treatment of “safety net” cases can be seen as confirming my point about the tissue of overlapping distinctions. Clear cases of killing fall on the positive side of all of the candidate distinctions, clear cases of allowing death fall on the negative side of all the distinctions; indeterminate cases fall on one side of one distinction and on the other side of another distinction. Treating these as a third category is just another way of making the same point. See Hanser (1999). See also Hall (2008) and Woollard (2010) for more suggestions as to how to make three or more distinctions out of the original two.