Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Curry's Paradox

1. Where Tr(x) is our given truth predicate and [A] an appropriate name of A, the Release rule for truth sanctions the inference (or step, or etc) from Tr([A]) to A, for all sentences A. (The corresponding Capture rule goes the other direction.) In so-called naive truth theory, one not only has Capture and Release in rule form, but one also has the corresponding biconditionals (often called 'T-biconditionals').

2. One might think that semantical properties just are sets, and so think that USP and UA are the same. One reason for doubt comes from Russell's paradox. It is reasonable to axiomatize away Russell's paradox for sets, where sets are whatever mathematics needs them to be. If mathematics doesn't require sets (or, for that matter, classes or whathaveyou) corresponding to every meaningful predicate, then so be it. Semantics, on the other hand, seems to be different, where a principle like USP is harder to give up. (Notably, Gödel apparently drew a distinction between sets and semantical properties, thinking that Russell's paradox is really a paradox for the latter but not the former. See Myhill's opening remarks in Myhill 1975.)

3. An alternative approach, recently championed by Alan Weir (2005), in effect gives up on the general transitivity of implication (or validity). (The approach gives up the so-called Cut rule.) Weir's approach falls into neither the paracomplete nor paraconsistent camps. (Author's note: I hope to add discussion of Weir's approach in a future edition of this entry.)

4. Lukasiewicz's continuum-valued conditional is suitable in the given sense, and has the attraction of being a familiar operator on values (‘truth-functional’, in a familiar sense). As Restall (1992) and, in more generality, P. Hajek et al. (2000) showed, this conditional gives rise to omega-inconsistency in Peano arithmetic. As a result, both paraconsistent and paracomplete truth theorists have looked elsewhere.

5. Stronger such logics may be achieved via the ternary relation familiar from (link: relevant logics), due to Routley and Meyer (1973), Priest and Sylvan (1992), and also Restall (1993). For a (‘transparent’) truth theory utilizing one such logic, see Beall (forthcoming). [NB: The logics discussed by Restall (1993) are too strong for purposes of truth theory; they don't give a suitable conditional in the going sense, since they yield Curry-generating contraction.]

6. I should note that Field's relevant work spans from about 2000 forward. Instead of citing the individual papers, I point only to his chief work on the subject (viz., 2008), which cites the earlier work but presents the overall framework in a fuller context. My aim here is not to present the full philosophical motivation or theory involved in Field 2008, but only sketch one way of thinking about Field's suitable conditional. Again, see Field 2008 for full details.

7. Actually, there is something strange in Priest's suggestion (1992). Unlike Field (or, relatedly, Beall forthcoming), Priest thinks of the given (suitable) conditional as entailment, a connective that, as Priest suggests, is supposed to express laws of logic. But, as Colin Caret (in conversation) has emphasized, this seems to be the wrong idea for what is going on. In particular, while Priest's semantics (either the given approach above or more sophisticated approaches) validates Modus Ponens in rule form, it fails (as it must, due to Curry) what Restall calls pseudo modus ponens, namely,

A & (AB) → B

But, then, the given conditional fails to express the given ‘law’ concerning the validity of Modus Ponens. So, Priest's suggestion seems to be problematic. But I leave this for future debate.