Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Concepts of God

1. Note that Tillich's own use of “ultimate concern” is ambiguous, sometimes referring to the subject's psychological and existential attitudes toward the object of his or her devotion (see, e.g., Tillich 1957, 4-5) but at others—and more typically—referring to those attitudes qua directed toward what Tillich regards as their appropriate object, namely, Being itself (see, e.g., Tillich 1951, 21; 1957, 9-10). In the latter sense, ultimate concern has an ontological as well as a phenomenological dimension. I am employing the term in its first and purely phenomenological sense, and not the second. The suggestion that Tillich uses the term “ultimate concern” in two senses is further documented in Alston 1961, 12–26, and in Rowe 1968.