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Arabic and Islamic Metaphysics

First published Thu Jul 5, 2012

Among the philosophical disciplines transmitted to the Arabic and Islamic world from the Greeks, metaphysics was of paramount importance, as its pivotal role in the overall history of the transmission of Greek thought into Arabic makes evident. The beginnings of Arabic philosophy coincide with the production of the first extensive translation of Aristotle's Metaphysics, within the circle of translators associated with the founder of Arabic philosophy, al-Kindī. The so-called “early” or “classical” phase of falsafa ends with the largest commentary on the Metaphysics available in Western philosophy, by Ibn Rushd (Averroes). The following “golden” age of Arabic thought continues to be primarily concerned with metaphysics, turning from the effort of interpreting the intricacies of Aristotle's canonical text towards the process of assimilating the model of metaphysical science first outlined by al-Fārābī and then implemented by Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna). This impression of centrality is confirmed by the large number and great variety of works pertaining to metaphysics written in Arabic—translations of the basic Greek texts, different kinds of commentaries on the translated material, original works with various degrees of comprehensiveness and doctrinal depth, etc.—all of which provide clear evidence of the intellectual vivacity and the productive energy of this philosophical area. Such an intensive reflection on metaphysics leads to what represents the specific Arabic contribution to the history of this discipline, namely the progressive devising of a new standard of metaphysics, in which this discipline assumes the form of a comprehensive and articulated synthesis of the Greek heritage, undergoes a process of epistemological refinement—in terms of definition of scope, coherence of structure, rigorousness of arguments, etc.—and ascends to the role of cornerstone of philosophy. This process brings forth a real “second beginning” of metaphysics in the history of philosophy, whose model eventually prevailed in philosophical circles, despite occasional criticisms motivated by an anachronistic desire to defend the Greek legacy in its uncontaminated form. Non-philosophical forms of knowledge—above all revealed theology—also had to confront the challenge posed by metaphysics. The vigorous and long-lasting impact of this metaphysical paradigm in non-Arabic and non-Muslim cultural areas, like the Latin-Christian and the Hebrew-Jewish, attests to its great doctrinal and epistemological attractiveness.

1. The fundamental texts, the approaches, the issues

The above considerations show that the fate of metaphysics as a branch of philosophy in the Arabic speaking world and in Muslim societies coincides, by and large, with the reception, transmission and transformation of Aristotle's Metaphysics. The anti-Aristotelian tendencies of the early phase of Arabic philosophy, marked by the adoption of a decidedly Platonic stance in metaphysics and the consequent rejection of Aristotle's teaching, evident in the views of Abū Bakr Muḥammad Ibn Zakariyāʼ al-Rāzī (d. ca. 925), remained a local and short-lived phenomenon. In mainstream Arabic philosophy, the Metaphysics represented for centuries the centerpiece of the corresponding discipline. Aristotle's work is the only Greek work mentioned in connection with metaphysics in the Arabic classifications of the sciences. No other Greek metaphysical work was translated and commented upon in the same continuous, widespread and multiform manner, or quoted so often and extensively in original treatises. Other vehicles of Greek metaphysical thought, like the Theologia Aristotelis, whose avowed aim was to make Aristotle's work compatible with Islamic creationism by means of the Neoplatonic doctrine of emanation, stress from the outset the primacy of the Metaphysics as the fundamental text of metaphysics, and fictively portray Aristotle as the author of the adaptation of the Plotinian material by means of which the desired completion of the Metaphysics is performed. If the Metaphysics—as well as the entire Aristotelian corpus—underwent a gradual eclipse in post-Avicennian Arabic philosophy, this was not due to a decline of its prestige, but to the success of Avicenna's incorporation of the text and the doctrine of Aristotle's work in his new encyclopedia of the philosophical sciences, The Healing (Al-Shifā’) where he constantly stresses his reliance on the teaching of the “First Master” (Aristotle) and his disciples.

Schematically, Arab authors adopted three main ways of approaching the text of Aristotle's Metaphysics, corresponding to three different literary genres. The first approach, which can be called “taxonomical”, is found in classificatory essays whose goal is to outline the content of the Metaphysics and to clarify its place in the Aristotelian corpus, and to indicate the position of the discipline of metaphysics in the system of knowledge. The “exegetical” approach is represented by commentaries that aim at explaining, with different degrees of literalness and comprehensiveness, the content of the Metaphysics. The tendency to adaptation, finally, is visible in metaphysical treatises that reformulate the doctrine of Aristotle's work and are intended as original elaborations, regardless of the amount of dependence on their Greek model. All main authors who considered metaphysics approached Aristotle's Metaphysics, in different extents and degrees, from these various perspectives.

From the doctrinal point of view, Arabic interpreters of the Metaphysics debated three basic theoretical issues. First of all, they reflected on the scientific configuration of the discipline presented by Aristotle in his work, with special focus on fundamental aspects such as its subject-matter (namely the issue of whether metaphysics is a philosophical theology, or an ontology, or both), structure, method, and position in the system of knowledge. This consideration of the epistemic status of metaphysics took into account an enlarged Aristotelian corpus, which included within theoretical philosophy a mathematics based on Euclid and Ptolemy (since Aristotle himself wrote no treatise on mathematics), and complemented the Metaphysics with pseudo-Aristotelian Neoplatonic metaphysical works (the Plotinian Theologia Aristotelis and the Proclean Liber de causis). The second concern is the investigation of specific doctrines related to the distinct issues within the Metaphysics. The prominent topics within the study of being qua being, or ontology, are the various aspects of the theory of essence, like the clarification of its relationship with form and substance, the discussion of the epistemological and ontological status of universals, etc. Of central importance in cosmology is the debate about the eternity vs. the origination of the world, and the mode of the universe's production by the First Principle, whether by way of emanation from Its own essence or creation ex nihilo. In philosophical theology, finally, the features that Aristotle ascribes to the divine Unmoved Mover, with particular regard to Its unity, necessity and intellectual nature, provide the starting-points for far-reaching developments. The third concern is the discussion of the relationship of the philosophical theology contained in Aristotle's Metaphysics with Islam, namely the assessment of the degree of compatibility between the rational conception of the divinity transmitted by Greek philosophy, on the one hand, and the image of God conveyed by Islamic prophetic revelation, on the other. The assumption of the oneness of truth, common among Arab philosophers, allows the metaphysical part of philosophy to provide a rational and coherent account of the same divine realm disclosed by revelation, thereby putting it in competition with Islamic theology. The results of these three doctrinal concerns are interconnected, since a certain view of metaphysics as a science, and a certain stand on specific doctrinal points, can enhance or reduce the affinity of metaphysics with Islamic religion and the possibility of its integration into Muslim culture. A conception of metaphysics that limits the scope of this science to philosophical theology and minimizes the relevance of the general doctrine of being is particularly apt to underscore its compatibility with Islam. By contrast, a view of metaphysics in which the ontological dimension, in addition to the theological, plays a prominent role, and in which the First Principle's properties are discordant, rather than congruent, with the Islamic divine attributes, goes in the opposite direction.

The different textual approaches and theoretical solutions to the aforementioned problems are assumed here as guidelines for the articulation of the history of the Arabic reception of the Metaphysics. On this basis, seven main chronological periods can be roughly distinguished. The first five phases culminate in the sixth, i.e., in Avicenna, who emerges, at the present stage of research, as the turning point of the history of Arabic metaphysics.

2. The Arabic translations of the Metaphysics

The translation activity regarding the Metaphysics continued uninterruptedly for three centuries (the ninth to the eleventh), with the production of several Arabic versions of Aristotle's text, some of which might have depended on Syriac intermediaries, and the involvement of a number of different translators, belonging to the main schools of Arabic philosophy. These translations display different degrees of inclusiveness (from integral versions of Aristotle's work to translations of its single books) and literalness (from strict word for word procedures to styles more akin to paraphrase). Cumulatively, the Arabic translations of the Metaphysics evidence the intention of making the entire text of Aristotle's work accessible to Arabic readers, extending the translation activity from the main bulk of the work towards more peripheral books, like Alpha Meizon (I) and Nu (XIV). Equally clear is the effort to provide an Arabic version increasingly faithful to the Greek original and more respondent to philosophical clarity, and a special focus on the repeatedly translated book Lambda (XII). Remarkable is also the inclusion in the translation activity of the main available Greek commentaries on the Metaphysics, namely those of Alexander of Aphrodisias and Themistius (less certain is the case of Syrianus' commentary), whose explanations of book Lambda (and, in the case of Syrianus, Beta (III)) were translated together with the corresponding books of Aristotle's work. Since also other Greek works intimately related to Aristotle's Metaphysics were translated into Arabic—like Theophrastus's On First Principles, the metaphysical section of Nicholas of Damascus's On the Philosophy of Aristotle, Alexander of Aphrodisias's On the Principles of the Universe, the De aeternitate mundi contra Aristotelem and other cosmological writings of Philoponus—the entire Greek exegetical tradition of the Metaphysics, from Aristotle's first disciples (Theophrastus) to his last interpreters/reformers (Philoponus), was available to Arabic-speaking scholars.

On account of its long duration, the high rank of the scholars it engaged, and the breadth of its scope this area of the overall translation movement from Greek into Arabic cannot be reduced to a mere preliminary phase of the Arabic reception of the Metaphysics, but rather provides a specimen of the main trends that characterized the first centuries of its history.

3. Al-Kindī and his school

Al-Kindī (d. after 870) engaged in a primeval taxonomic approach to Aristotle's corpus, on the basis of a number of unidentified Greek sources of Neoplatonic ascendance (Treatise on the Quantity of Aristotle's Books and What is Required to Attain Philosophy, Risāla fī kammiyyat kutub Arisṭāṭālīs wa-mā yuḥtaǧu ilayhi fī taḥṣīl al-falsafa). In this treatise, he expresses an ambivalent view of the place of the Metaphysics in the corpus, by presenting Aristotle's work as the culmination of a four-fold division of philosophy into mathematics, logic, physics, and metaphysics, but also as preliminary to the knowledge of ethics. The description of the content of the Metaphysics is limited to the part of this work dealing with philosophical theology (the study of immaterial things), and contains explicit references to Islamic tenets such as God's oneness, the divine names, and providence.

Due to the loss of what might have been a specific commentary on the Metaphysics (attested under the title of Inclusive Philosophy, Falsafa dāḫila), the exegetical tendencies of al-Kindī can only be guessed. His extant works on metaphysics indicate the adoption of the paraphrase as explanatory technique, and a special attention to book Alpha Elatton (II, the first book of the Metaphysics in the Arab tradition), intended as introductory to the theological themes of book Lambda.

Al-Kindī's main metaphysical treatise (Book on First Philosophy, Kitāb fī l-falsafa al-ūlā, only partially extant) displays monotheistic concerns (the insistence on the theme of God's unity, with recourse to a model of the God-world relationship reminiscent of the Neoplatonic metaphysics of Theologia Aristotelis and Liber de causis), and the adoption of the doctrine of the creation of the universe in time (derived from Philoponus). The explicit encomiastic references to Aristotle occurring at the beginning (with extensive paraphrastic excerpts of Metaphysics Alpha Elatton) and the abrupt switch to the themes of Book Lambda (albeit treated in an un-Aristotelian vein) confirm that the one-sided theologizing approach to the Metaphysics is directed at showing the compatibility of Greek metaphysics with Islamic religion. Thus, al-Kindī often portrays philosophy in general, and metaphysics in particular, as the discipline deputed to give full articulation and rational explanation to the miraculous conciseness of the prophetic message (besides the central section of On the Quantity of Aristotle's Books, see also the Epistle on the Explanation of the Prosternation of the Extreme Body and its Obedience to God, Risāla fī l-Ibāna ʿan suǧūd al-ǧirm al-aqṣā wa-ṭāʿatihī li-llāhi).

The view of metaphysics as essentially a science of the divine being, rather than of being in general, and the intent of underscoring its affinity, once assimilated with philosophical theology, with Islam, was also characteristic of al-Kindī's direct disciples and the “school” of authors inspired by his teaching or dependent on his same sources. This is evident both in classifications of the sciences (Qusṭā ibn Lūqā d. 912; Ibn Farīġūn, 10th century, the Rasāʼil of the Iḫwān al-Ṣafāʼ, written around 961–986; Miskawayh, d. 1030), and in independent treatises related to metaphysics (see Abū Sulaymān al-Manṭiqī al-Siǧistānī, d. ca. 985, and his school; Abū l-Ḥasan Muḥammad ibn Yūsuf al-ʿĀmirī, d. 992).

4. Ṯābit ibn Qurra

According to historical sources, Ṯābit ibn Qurra (d. 901) might have revised the translation into Arabic of Themistius' paraphrase of Metaphysics Lambda. More importantly, this author wrote the first known extant Arabic commentary on the Metaphysics, still glossed by Ibn Taymiyya (d. 1328) four centuries later, according to the method of concise exposition (talḫīṣ), i.e., isolating the most relevant points of the commented text. This commentary shares with al-Kindī's works a special regard for the place of philosophical theology within metaphysics, since it focuses on book Lambda of Aristotle's Metaphysics. Also Kindian is the effort to accommodate Islamic monotheism, by insisting on the oneness and willful action of God, and by adopting the Porphyrian theme of the harmony between Aristotle's and Plato's teaching. At variance with al-Kindī, by contrast, is Ṯābit's endorsing of the doctrine of the eternity of the world, rather than its creation in time, against Philoponus, and the minimal reliance on Neoplatonic writings. The background of the commentary is decidedly Aristotelian, with some possible influence of the Peripatetic commentators (most notably Themistius, who however is never mentioned); nonetheless, Ṯābit revises some crucial tenets of Aristotle's philosophical theology, by understanding, for example, the First Mover as the first cause not only of the motion of the universe, but also of its existence.

5. Al-Fārābī

Besides more traditional overviews of the works of Aristotle and the place of the Metaphysics among them (What Ought to be Premised to the Learning of Aristotle's Philosophy, Mā yanbaġī an yuqaddama qabla taʿallum falsafat Ariṣṭū; Aristotle's Philosophy and Its Parts, Falsafat Arisṭūṭālīs wa-aǧzāʼ falsafatihī), al-Fārābī (d. 950) also provided taxonomic accounts in which the Metaphysics is related to the system of the philosophical and Islamic sciences, rather than to the Aristotelian corpus of writings. In the most important and influential essay of this type, the Enumeration of the Sciences (Iḥṣāʼ al-ʿulūm), he portrays metaphysics as a discipline having a precise method (demonstration) and an articulated structure, in which a full-fledged ontology (the study of being qua being) in its different aspects precedes, first, a part dealing with the foundation of the other sciences and, second, a philosophical theology concerned, among other things, with Islamic issues such as God's attributes, divine names and actions. In all these classificatory treatises, the position of the Metaphysics with respect to the other works of Aristotle, or of metaphysics with respect to the other philosophical disciplines, is not stable, but varies according to the particular perspective that al-Fārābī adopts: significantly, in some of them metaphysics is presented as the culmination of the entire system of knowledge, for example, in The Philosophy of Aristotle.

The consideration of the entire Metaphysics, and the view of metaphysics as universal science, are the pivotal elements of the short introduction to the Metaphysics written by al-Fārābī, following the model of the Prolegomena of Greek Late Antiquity and the teaching of Ammonius Son of Hermeias and his Aristotelian school in Alexandria. This essay, On the Goals of the Sage [= Aristotle] in Each Treatise of the Book Marked by Means of Letters [= Metaphysics] (Maqāla … fī Aġrāḍ al-ḥakīm fī kull maqāla min al-kitāb al-mawsūm bi-l-ḥurūf), represents the first integral exegesis of the Metaphysics extant in Arabic and reveals al-Fārābī's dependence on the epistemology of the newly translated Posterior Analytics. Fārābī's use of a style of exegesis stemming from the Peripatetic tradition is a manifestation of his affiliation with the coeval school of Baghdad Aristotelians. The main point of the work is that metaphysics is more encompassing than, and not reducible to, the philosophical theology of book Lambda. Following this aim, al-Fārābī first rejects the attempts to interpret Aristotle's work along Neoplatonic and monotheistic lines (in this he has probably in mind al-Kindī's theologizing conception of metaphysics), and advocates a type of explanation akin to that of the Greek commentators (Alexander of Aphrodisias and Themistius). Then he derives from the universal nature of metaphysics, understood as the science having being qua being as its subject-matter, indications regarding its scope (it incorporates a part on philosophical theology, namely on the doctrine of the first causes of being), as well as on its oneness as an universal science (there cannot be more than one universal science), its name (by being more general than physics it is also “after” physics) and its overall content. Finally, he concludes with a brief description of each of the books of Aristotle's work known to him, in which the content of book Lambda is summarized with no religious overtones. In this way, al-Fārābī extracts from Aristotle's work a coherent and all-encompassing outline of an “ideal” science of metaphysics; this project will guide the following generations of Arabic metaphysicians, in particular Avicenna, to build a new science of metaphysics according to Farabian parameters.

In al-Fārābī's main works on political philosophy, philosophical theology is the only part of metaphysics that functions as preliminary—together with human noetics, man's destiny in the after-life, and prophecy—to the account of the organization of the ideal state (Principles of the Opinions of the Inhabitants of the Virtuous City, Mabādiʼ Ārāʼ Ahl al-Madīna al-Fāḍila). Other works of his, on the other hand, deal specifically with ontological themes. Among them, the Book of Letters (Kitāb al-Ḥurūf, which is not, properly speaking, a commentary on the Metaphysics, despite the title echoing one of the Arabic names of Aristotle's work) follows a pattern analogous to that of Book Delta (V) of the Metaphysics; the treatise On One and Unity ( l-wāḥid wa-l-waḥda) is thematically linked to Book Iota (X); the refutation of Philoponus' criticism of Aristotle is a reassessment of the thesis of the eternity of the world. Scattered references to the Metaphysics, with regard to distinct topics, surface also in the famous Book on the Agreement of the Opinions of the Two Sages, the Divine Plato and Aristotle (Kitāb al-Ǧamʿ bayna raʼyay al-ḥakīmayn Aflāṭūn al-ilāhī wa-Arisṭūṭālīs), which resumes the Porphyrian theme of the harmony between Aristotle's and Plato's views, that had been taken up by al-Kindī and Ṯābit ibn Qurra, but seems alien to Fārābī's conception of the history of philosophy. For this and other reasons, the Farabian authorship of this treatise, despite the manuscript evidence, has been repeatedly questioned in recent scholarship.

The view that metaphysics is the universal science of being qua being, and thus exceeds the boundaries of philosophical theology by including it as one of its parts, functions in al-Fārābī to underscore the irreducibility of metaphysics to Islamic religion: at the level of content, metaphysics ranges over a thematic spectrum wider than the Muslim creed; on epistemic grounds, the demonstrative method of metaphysics (and of philosophy in general) is superior not only to the rhetorical and poetical character of the prophetic discourse, but also to the dialectical procedures of Islamic theology (kalām). This helps to explain why al-Fārābī does not indulge in the philosophical explanation of the Qurʼān, and why in the political works does he treat topics pertinent to religion from a strictly philosophical point of view, with no concession to religious terminology or theological motives.

6. The Baghdad Aristotelians

The Metaphysics held an undisputable importance for the school of Christian Aristotelians that flourished in Baghdad during the X–XI centuries, who took over from the Aristotelian scholars of Alexandria the project of providing a systematic commentary on Aristotle's works. Many members of this school—starting from its founder, Abū Bišr Mattā ibn Yūnus (d. 940), through to its later leader, Abū Zakariyāʼ Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī (d. 974), and to one of its last representatives, ʿĪsā ibn Zurʿa (d. 1008)—contributed decisively to the translation of the Metaphysics into of Arabic. Moreover, some of these authors are credited with the translation into Arabic of parts of the main Greek commentaries on the Metaphysics (Alexander of Aphrodisias and Themistius on book Lambda, by Abū Bišr Mattā), or they were reported to be familiar with the Arabic translation of further Greek commentaries on Aristotle's work, as well as with treatises on metaphysics by some of Aristotle's immediate disciples (for example, Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī, was said to be familiar with the commentary on book Beta by Syrianus and the original treatise on metaphysics by Theophrastus of Eresus). Finally, numerous literal commentaries on the Metaphysics, following in the footsteps of Alexander of Aphrodisias' exegetical style, were produced within the school. Thus, later sources inform us that Abū Bišr Mattā commented on books Alpha Elatton, Βeta (III) and Theta (VIII) of the Metaphysics; he is also quoted in Avicenna's exegesis of book Lambda (XII). Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī's commentary on book Alpha Elatton is extant. Abū l-Faraǧ ibn al-Ṭayyib's (d. 1043) commentary on the Metaphysics, preserved in fragments in Hebrew translation, is famous for its length and its extremely detailed character, an exegetical style decidedly resented by Avicenna.

The literal style of exegesis allowed Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī to introduce religious concerns into his Metaphysics commentary. The broadly speaking “Platonic” theories of some of his treatises devoted to ontological issues, like the postulation of divine forms within the discussion of the mode of existence of universals, can be seen as Platonizing solutions to Aristotelian problems, rather than signs of affiliation to non-Aristotelian philosophical traditions.

7. Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna)

Outlines of metaphysics, of various lengths, can be found in Avicenna's treatises on the classifications of the sciences, as well as in the surveys of the different branches of philosophy interspersed in many of his other works. These epistemological sketches are substantiated in his summae, a literary genre of which he can be considered the inventor. In all these “encyclopedias” of philosophy—addressed to different audiences and displaying various formats, methodologies and styles—metaphysics constitutes, together with logic and natural philosophy, a permanent and pivotal part of philosophy. In those written in Arabic, after the propaedeutic treatment of logic, the sequence of theoretical disciplines is given—along traditional lines—as natural philosophy, mathematics, and metaphysics, or simply as natural philosophy and metaphysics, with mathematics frequently omitted. By contrast, in the Persian summa, Philosophy for ʿAlāʼ al-Dawla (Dānišnāmah-yi ʿAlāʼī), and possibly also in the incompletely extant Eastern Philosophy (Al-Ḥikma al-mašriqiyya), the order is reversed and, as Avicenna himself avows, much more original: metaphysics constitutes the beginning, rather than the end, of theoretical philosophy. These two opposite arrangements are in fact compatible and underscore complementary aspects of the primacy of metaphysics within theoretical philosophy.

In Avicenna's literal commentaries on the philosophical corpus, most of which are lost, metaphysics represents the section about which we are best informed by either Avicenna himself or his disciples (e.g., The Available and the Valid, Al-Ḥāṣil wa-l-maḥṣūl), or by the surviving portions (e.g., Book of the Fair Judgment, Kitāb al-Inṣāf). Judging from the extant fragments, conciseness and selectiveness appear to have been the stylistic and methodological hallmarks of Avicenna's exegesis of the Metaphysics.

Avicenna's original adaptation of the Metaphysics can be best appreciated in the metaphysical sections of his summae of philosophy, which approach Aristotle's work according to a perspective that combines taxonomy, exegesis and adaptation. In virtue of their format as a collection of the different branches of philosophy, these works give metaphysics a specific position in the system of the philosophical disciplines. At the same time, they provide an explanation of Aristotle's text by incorporating it, according to a modified formulation and arrangement, into Avicenna's own discourse. Finally, they enrich the doctrine of the Metaphysics with theories that are taken from other authors and works within the Aristotelian tradition, or from the fruits of Avicenna's own mind.

Among Avicenna's summae, the most extensive, influential, and, by the author's own admission, the most dependent upon Aristotelian sources is the Book of the Cure (Kitāb al-Šifāʼ). The metaphysical section of The Cure, The Science of Divine Things (Ilāhiyyāt), exhibits two radical aspects of Avicenna's modification of the Aristotelian Metaphysics. Avicenna changes, first of all, the “form”, i.e., the scientific profile, of Aristotle's work. Accordingly, he also modifies its “content”, namely the disposition and doctrinal purport of the individual treatises of the work. The changes regarding the “form” affect four main areas: the subject-matter of metaphysics, its structure, its method, and its relationship with the other sciences. The content of the Metaphysics, on the other hand, is reworked by means of a different arrangement of its parts, the integration of Aristotle's thought with subsequent metaphysical speculation, both Greek and Arabic, and the introduction of some original doctrines.

In the context of the first aspect of formal revision, Avicenna shows that the subject-matter of the science of metaphysics corresponds coherently to all the different ways according to which Aristotle portrays this discipline in the Metaphysics. Thus, metaphysics is, on the one hand, a study of the First Causes and God (cf. Metaph. Α, 1, 981b28–29; Α, 2, 982b9–10), since the First Causes and God are its “goal”. But it is also, on the other hand, a study of “the existent” (cf. Metaph. Γ, 1, 1003a20–26), since “the existent qua existent” is its subject-matter. Finally, metaphysics is a study of immaterial and motionless things (cf. Metaph. Ε, 1, 1026a13–23), since both the First Causes and God, on the one hand, and “the existent qua existent”, on the other, are realities of this kind. This harmonization of Aristotle's different points of view is undertaken with the intent of conforming metaphysics to the epistemological canons of the Posterior Analytics, which posit the subject-matter as the fundamental element of every science. The other aspects of the scientific reform of metaphysics introduced by Avicenna are also the result of applying the epistemological requirements of the Posterior Analytics to this discipline. In this way, Avicenna bestows on metaphysics an articulated and coherent structure, a method that is as apodictic as possible, and a position of eminence with respect to all other philosophical disciplines.

Within the framework of metaphysics, Avicenna introduces some original doctrines which, in virtue of their fundamental and all-encompassing character, are able to connect and unify the multiplicity of themes and sources of the Ilāhiyyāt. Most notorious among them is the distinction between essence and existence in created beings, which represents the real cornerstone of Avicenna's ontology. This distinction underlies many themes of Avicenna's metaphysics: it justifies, for instance, the difference between the primary concepts “thing” (i.e., “item having an essence”) and “existent” (i.e., “item having existence”) at the beginning of the work; it grounds the theory of universals (universality is an attribute that belongs to an essence not as such, but when this latter exists in the human mind, abstracted from the things in which it is instantiated); and it leads to the fundamental characterization of God as the only being that has no essence apart from existence, or that has an essence that is totally identical to existence.

The philosophical theology of the Ilāhiyyāt includes a series of themes of religious relevance (the existence of God, His attributes, providence, theodicy, man's destiny in the afterlife, prophecy etc.), which are treated by means of examples, terminology and scriptural quotations of clear Islamic provenience. This, together with the theological views debated throughout the work, indicates Avicenna's intention to show that the rational underpinnings of Islamic religion are congruent with the philosophical world-view expressed in metaphysics. The same intent surfaces in the specific essays that Avicenna devoted to the philosophical interpretation of some Qur'anic verses.

In Avicenna, all the previous trends of the Arabic tradition of the Metaphysics converge and find their synthesis. This is particularly manifest in the philosophical theology that invariably concludes his accounts of metaphysics in the summae. In this section, Avicenna reiterates the connection between Metaph. α, 2 and Λ, 6–10 that is typical of al-Kindī's selective way of approaching the Metaphysics, while also incorporating procedures of explanation ad litteram and by way of questions (per modum quaestionis) that are reminiscent of the Baghdad Aristotelians' exegetical method, and discussing a sequence of themes that mirrors the structure of the theological philosophy of al-Fārābī's political treatises. The Aristotelian core of this section is then expanded by means of accretions taken from Alexander of Aphrodisias' and Themistius' works on metaphysics (the Aristotelian commentators mentioned by al-Fārābī and translated into Arabic by the Baghdad Aristotelians), and from the pseudo-Aristotelian, Neoplatonic works that were commonly appended to the Metaphysics in Arabic philosophy, i.e., the Plotinian Theologia Aristotelis and the Proclean Liber de Causis, produced within al-Kindī's circle. As a result, Avicenna's metaphysics harmonizes al-Kindī's emphasis on the theological component of the Metaphysics with al-Fārābī's vindication of the foundational role of ontology; by the same token, Avicenna reconciles al-Fārābī's view of metaphysics as a science modeled on the epistemology of the Posterior Analytics with the Baghdad Aristotelians' project of an integral explanation of Aristotle's text. In this way, the congruence of metaphysics with Islamic theology is not realized in a “Kindian” way, i.e., by limiting the scope of this discipline to a part of the Metaphysics, but depends, in a more “Farabian” vein, upon the entire work of Aristotle once its inner structure has been properly underscored. Likewise, the task of conforming metaphysics to the methodological standards of the Posterior Analytics is accomplished at the same time as the goal of elucidating the textual obscurities and the interpretative problems of the Metaphysics.

Besides the overall treatment of metaphysics in the summae, Avicenna investigates particular metaphysical areas in specific treatises, such as the Book of Provenance and Destination (Kitāb al-Mabdaʼ wa-l-maʿād). Various issues pertaining to metaphysics are extensively debated in works that contain his reflections on key philosophical themes, such as the Notes (Taʿlīqāt), or that derive from the teaching activity and the dialectical practices performed within his circle, i.e., the Discussions (Mubāḥaṯāt).

8. Post-Avicennian period

The pivotal position of Avicenna in the history of Islamic philosophy emerges in all clarity if we consider that the three approaches to Aristotle's Metaphysics considered here (classification, commentary, adaptation), as well as the main schools of thought of the formative period (the Kindian, on the one hand, and the Farabian-Baghdadian, on the other), ended or began to wither with the rise of Avicenna's metaphysics. Although the text of Aristotle's Metaphysics continued to circulate in Arabic after the eleventh century, the metaphysical works of Avicenna gradually superseded the Metaphysics as the text to be copied, commented upon, and evaluated (either favorably or critically), until Avicennism replaced Aristotelianism by incorporating it. The reception of Avicenna's philosophy in subsequent Arabic thought is multifaced and has yet to be explored in detail. However, three main attitudes towards Avicenna's metaphysics in post-Avicennian Arabic philosophy can be tentatively outlined; they correspond respectively to the integral acceptance, the critical revision, and the radical rejection of Avicenna's standpoint.

A “conservative” reaction to Avicenna's metaphysics (and to Avicenna's philosophy in general) was represented by the efforts of reinstating the pre-Avicennian status of this discipline. This goal was pursued in various ways. Some, like Šihābaddīn al-Suhrawardī (d. 1191) and the fabricators of Arabic Pseudo-Platonica in the twelfth century, took Pythagoras' and Plato's thought as true philosophy, thus supplanting the Aristotelian tradition to which Avicenna belonged. Others, like Ibn Rušd/Averroes (d. 1198), whose three commentaries on the Metaphysics contain recurrent criticisms of Avicenna, redirected attention to the Aristotelian Metaphysics itself, with the aim of restoring the original purport of Aristotle's foundational text against Avicenna's innovations. Still others, such as ʿAbd al-Laṭīf al-Baġdādī (d. 1231), conceived metaphysics as a mere juxtaposition of the Kindian and Farabian perspectives on metaphysics, where Aristotle's Metaphysics inaugurates a curriculum of works that include the Liber de causis and the Theologia Aristotelis, as in al-Kindī, but also has an ontological dimension, as in al-Fārābī, so that the Avicennian synthesis is reduced to its constituents. In addition to these anachronistic attempts that surface both in the East and in the West of the Muslim world and are advanced by philosophers in the strict sense, there were also the attacks launched against philosophy in general, and metaphysics in particular, by Muslim theologians, most famously by Abū Ḥāmid al-Ġazālī (d. 1111) in The incoherence of the philosophers (Tahāfut al-Falāsifa). Significantly, however, all the critics of Avicenna, regardless whether philosophers or theologians, are also indebted to his thought, and in their eyes Avicenna's metaphysics represents metaphysics tout court.

In contrast to these critical attitudes, a decidedly pro-Avicennian camp is represented by a network of scholars encompassing at least three generations of school members and students who explicitly connected themselves with Avicenna's teaching. Moreover, numerous abridgments, commentaries and supercommentaries were written upon Avicenna's metaphysical works, the most famous among which are the commentaries of Faḫr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (d. 1209) and Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī (d. 1274) on Avicenna's Pointers and Reminders (Al-Išārāt wa-l-tanbīhāt), and those of Ṣadrā al-Dīn (Mullā Ṣadrā) al-Šīrāzī (d. 1640) and Muḥammad Mahdī ibn Abī Ḏarr al-Narāqī (d. 1794/5) on the Ilāhiyyāt of The Cure. By the same token, the copying and dissemination of manuscripts of Avicenna's works on metaphysics continued for nine centuries, from the fifth until the fourteenth century of the Islamic era, that is to say, from a few decades after Avicenna's death until a few decades ago.

A third line of influence, which is the one that ultimately prevails, is the adoption of Avicenna's metaphysics in the theological works of Muslim theologians or mutakallimūn. This trend—which possibly starts in the cultural environment in which al-Ġazālī was formed, and in which the same al-Ġazālī seems to have partaken—represents the most interesting type of reception of Avicenna's thought, since it requires a thorough revision of Avicenna's original stance in order to adapt it to a theological context. Together with the previous two trends this tendency covers a period that is incomparably longer than the chronological span of the other authors and school considered above. Rather than representing the conclusion of the current historical account, it will predictably constitute the core of the entire investigation of the Arabic fate of metaphysics in future research.

9. Conclusion

The study of Arabic metaphysics can be approached from a variety of interconnected perspectives. On the one hand, a group of historical issues emerges, such as the ways according to which the Metaphysics was transmitted into Arabic and integrated in the culture of its new environment, the synergy of its transmission with the Arabic reception of other fundamental works of Aristotle (above all the Posterior Analytics, but also the Categories), and the continuation in Arabic philosophy of the main Greek paradigms of interpretation of the Aristotelian corpus, such as the Athenian background of al-Kindī's philosophy vs. the Alexandrian heritage of the Aristotelians of Baghdad, or the purer Peripatetism of al-Fārābī vs. the Platonizing Aristotelianism of Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī and his followers. On the other hand, the epistemological reflection on metaphysics as a science undertaken by Arabic philosophers, in the effort to transform Aristotle's still imperfect discipline into a full-fledged and rigorous scientific discourse, discloses a theoretical area of investigation that produces a progressive switch of attention from the Metaphysics (with capital “M”) to metaphysics (with lower-case “m”). Outside the narrower scope of philosophy and its history, it is interesting to note how the introduction of a foreign pagan discipline, like metaphysics, into a monotheistic social context, like the Islamic one, determines either the accordance or the antagonism between philosophical theology and revealed theology, or, in other words, between the quintessence of falsafa, on the one hand, and the speculation of kalām, on the other. The study of the ways in which this confrontation took place in the Islamic culture of the Middle Ages may shed light on the contemporary debate on the relationship between reason and faith and contribute to the promotion of dialogue among different cultures.


Texts and Translations

Arabic translations of the Metaphysics

Al-Kindī and his school

Ṯābit ibn Qurra

Al-Fārābī and the Baghdad Aristotelians

Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna)

Post-Avicennian period


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