Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Anomalous Monism

Token-Identity and Minimal Materialism

As we have seen, Davidson's central claim is that what makes a mental event identical to a physical event is that the mental event has a physical description. It has been objected that this is an extremely weak condition, making token-identity too trivial a thesis to merit the label of even the most minimal materialism (Antony 2003; Latham 2003). In particular, it is argued that an event could receive a physical description even though it might, for all we know, include, as a part, the thinking of an immaterial mind. Antony (2003) claims that such a ‘hybrid’ event must count as ‘physical’, according to Davidson, because of the physical description, but it would seem to be counterintuitive to accept this label given the presence and behavior of the immaterial mind. Now, an initial and seemingly plausible response to this is that if all physical events have physical explanations, as Davidson clearly believes , then the thinking/existence of this immaterial mind could have no causal consequences. We couldn't, then, ever know of it, or have any reason to think it obtained, and it is not clear that its sheer conceivability (if it is conceivable — see below) should count against Davidson's monism.

Antony acknowledges the inclination not to take this kind of dualism seriously, but argues that such inclinations don't constitute arguments, and that if Davidson's monism doesn't rule it out it is an unacceptably weak conception of materialism. However, the impossibility of any evidence for such a position appears to constitute a rather strong argument against it. Antony also acknowledges the inclination not to consider such hybrid events as genuine events, but rather as clearly gerrymandered constructions like one incorporating this morning's rainfall with some distant supernova. However, Antony rejects this too, claiming that unlike such gerrymandered events, his imagined hybrid events are “perfectly unified”. This, however, seems clearly wrong. Consider what is intuitively offputting about the obviously gerrymandered constructions—they incorporate events that are spatially unconnected. Can Antony claim something different about his hybrids? Since their phenomenal components are supposed to be mental, it seems that they can't have spatial descriptions. But if so, they are indeed spatially unconnected to their supposed physical companion events. It's hard to see how this warrants counting hybrids as genuine events as opposed to gerrymandered ones. (Note that this is especially (though not only) the case given Davidson's later endorsement of the spatiotemporal criterion for event-individuation.) A connected worry relates precisely to what makes Davidson's restriction of his argument for monism to causally interacting mental events reasonable. If an event or subevent has no causal consequences, what grounds do we or could we have for believing in its existence? Without such grounds, it sounds less unmotivated than Antony suggests to not take such proposals seriously. Antony seems to anticipate this concern (2003, 11), claiming that his hybrid events do casually interact with physical events by virtue of their physical companions. But by Antony's own definition, the phenomenal component of the event is an event that does not causally interact with physical events (2003, 9). Hybrids enter into causal relations by virtue of the physical subevents only. This provides further grounds for doubting that they are genuine events that we could have evidence for. And this suggests that it is entirely reasonable not to take their possibility seriously as an objection to the strength of Davidson's materialism.