Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Rigid Designators

1. One might expect terms for rigid designators to correspond in the following way: a “strongly” rigid designator would be obstinately rigid, referring to its object in all possible worlds. A “weakly” rigid designator would be one that refers to its object in just those possible worlds in which the object exists. It is plausible to suppose that the question over whether statements like ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’, or perhaps ‘If Hesperus exists then Hesperus = Phosphorus’, are strongly necessary or merely weakly necessary depends on whether ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are “strongly” rigid (obstinate) or merely “weakly” rigid in this sense. However, as Kripke has defined ‘strongly rigid’, ‘Hesperus’ cannot be a “strongly rigid designator”; that distinction is reserved for designators that designate a necessarily existing object (1980, pp. 48-9). Thus, given the truth of a classical tradition according to which God and entities like numbers exist and could not have failed to exist, ‘7’ or ‘God’ are “strongly rigid” in Kripke's sense: this is a special case of obstinate rigidity.

2. At least it is an account available to opponents of typical direct reference accounts. Questions might be raised about whether a modest version of the theory of direct reference remains tenable in virtue of the reference of ‘α’, say.

3. Often an association between causal grounding and rigidity is complicated by a further association between causal grounding and indexicality. Thus, Putnam, for example, calls causally grounded terms “indexical,” because they designate whatever has the underlying essence of samples around the speaker. ‘Water’ and ‘whale’ are supposed to be indexical; ‘hunter’ and ‘bachelor’ are not, since they have analytic definitions. According to Putnam “Kripke's doctrine that natural-kind words are rigid designators and our doctrine that they are indexical are but two ways of making the same point” (1975, p. 234). But these do not really seem to be two ways of making the same point. For further citations and discussion, see LaPorte 2000, §2; 2004, pp. 42-3.

4. Reference is not secured by way of causal grounding in the relevant respect, anyway: by way of ostension to an object in something like a causal baptismal ceremony. It is a different question whether some terms in the reference-fixing description are causally grounded. It is hard to come up with descriptions free from such terms (Stanley 1997a, p. 564; Devitt and Sterelny 1999, p. 60). If there are no such descriptions available, then every rigid designator for a concrete object may be said to be “broadly” causally grounded in the respect that it is either grounded in the primary way by means of ostension to an object in something like a causal baptismal ceremony or it is hooked to a description some terms in which are causally grounded in the primary way. In that case, of course, broad causal grounding is ubiquitous and not specially tied to rigidity: all singular concrete object designators, including non-rigid definite descriptions, are broadly causally grounded.

5. Presumably, the relevant possibilities could not include all metaphysically possible states of affairs: otherwise, it is hard to see how (1) and (4) could share the same content, at least without help from a sophisticated widescopism (Sosa shows how this could help even though there are no modal operators: 2001, pp. 34-5, note 7), which is supposed to be a distinct suggestion.

6. Stanley agrees, though he withholds his reasons: 1997b, p. 156.

7. As I have suggested above, one might maintain a related line that the notion of semantic content, assertion, proposition, and so on must be reevaluated in light of the distinction between assertoric content and ingredient sense: one might say therefore that Kripke is onto one explication and that assertoric content is yet another explication of the unrefined notion semantic content, assertion, proposition, and so on. Something like this position is adopted by Chalmers, who is a pluralist about content (Chalmers forthcoming-a, §1.4; what most interests Chalmers is the division between what is epistemic in Fregean sense and the modal phenomenon of rigidity: 2002, pp. 157-9; see the supplementary document: Two-Dimensionalism Against Materialism). Even Dummett might tolerate the above proposal that Kripke is onto one explication of semantic content, assertion, proposition, and so on: he resists a simple yes or no answer to the question whether ‘St. Joachim had a daughter’ expresses the same proposition as ‘the father of Mary had a daughter’: “The word ‘proposition’ is treacherous,” he cautions (p. 48). Stanley (1997b, 132, 140, 155), by contrast, is much less favorably disposed to say that Dummett's distinction could be said to bring to light more than one notion of semantic content, assertion, proposition, and the like.

8. Further, we might hold that the theory of direct reference is merely an empirical theory about natural language, and that even if it is true, there are other possible languages in which a name spelled and pronounced like ‘Petrarch’ is a disguised description meaning the same as ‘the famous humanist most closely associated in α with the Italian Renaissance’. For such a language, rigidity does the work one would expect. So the work, even with respect to names, is independent from the theory of direct reference not only epistemically (for all many philosophers know languages do not conform to the theory of direct reference and rigidity performs its work anyway) but metaphysically (it is metaphysically possible that languages do not conform to the theory of direct reference and rigidity performs its work anyway).

9. Other examples of the necessary a posteriori made famous by Kripke may be accepted by direct reference theorists. Whether these examples owe anything to rigidity may be contested (e.g., when the examples concern kinds: see §4.2). Here I leave complications to the reader to pursue, having pointed out the vicinity and general nature of the complications.

10. Talk about an essence is not as common as talk about the essence, but it is preferable since many properties apply to Cicero and only Cicero in all possible worlds: see Plantinga 1985, pp. 85-7; 1977, pp. 254-6. Plantinga's definition of an essence is given in the section on Individual Essences in the entry actualism.

11. The debt may be mutual: those who put rigidity to work in certain areas may find themselves committed to two-dimensionalism (for a discussion of Kripke's possible commitment to two-dimensionalism, see the supplementary document, Two-Dimensionalism Against Materialism, especially note 2 and the corresponding text).

12. Thus, for Chalmers (forthcoming-b, §3.1) it is one of just a few “core claims of two-dimensionalism,” as recent authors understand it, that apriority obtains if and only if the primary intension (indicated on the diagonal) is true at all scenarios.

13. There are complications here: if the horizontal intension is a “secondary intension” as Chalmers, for one, understands it, then it is debatable whether the intension is an infallible guide to whether a term is rigid. According to a venerable tradition, there is an omniscient agent x, and it is impossible that either x should have failed to be an omniscient agent or that any being y such that yx should have been an omniscient agent. Something similar can be said for ‘the simplest agent’. This makes ‘the omniscient agent’ and ‘the simplest agent’ rigid designators. However, neither ‘the omniscient agent’ nor ‘the simplest agent’ appears to designate the same thing in all worlds along Chalmers' secondary intension. It would appear that ‘the omniscient agent = the simplest agent’ has a contingently true or false secondary intension, even if tradition is right and the relevant designators are actually rigid. But if tradition is right and these designators are actually rigid, then ‘the omniscient agent = the simplest agent’ is not contingently true or false. So the range and power of two-dimensionalism may be limited by this sort of case (a similar case is discussed, with some qualifying details that might apply here, in the supplementary document: Two-Dimensionalism Against Materialism). Even so, where two-dimensionalism successfully captures the status of an identity statement as necessary or contingent, it would appear to owe this to rigidity: the horizontal intension successfully mirrors rigidity or lack thereof in these cases.

14. Does ‘watery stuff’ nonrigidly designate the property or kind H2O, whether horizontally or diagonally, by virtue of applying to stuff that is H2O with respect to some worlds and not others? Or does ‘watery stuff’ rather fail to designate the property H2O at all, though the expression applies to stuff that is H2O, since it fails to apply to stuff that is H2O with respect to some worlds? There is no need here to answer these questions, which gesture toward some of the complications with treating property terms as rigid (see §4.2).

15. Possible replies to a general version of this objection are discussed in §2.3.3. Of course, any or all of those replies might undermine a general statement of the objection while failing to apply to this or that specific version, e.g., Soames', with its particular context or nuances.

Notes to Supplement: Two-Dimensionalism Against Materialism

1. Chalmers offers a further argument that is supposed to make use only of the diagonal intension, ignoring the horizontal intension: there is no need to elaborate here. Further, I ignore here complications concerning intensions for expressions for physical phenomena, like ‘c-fiber firing’, and in particular the possibility that primary and secondary intensions for these expressions diverge in accordance with what Chalmers calls “type F monism” (1996, pp. 134-6; cf. §11 of Chalmers 2003). Throughout, I have also ignored world-centering, which may be overlooked so long as the possible worlds considered do not present certain complications in far-off places, as we may assume (Chalmers 1996, p. 60).

2. In addition to what follows in the text corresponding to this note, see Kripke (1980, p. 59, note 22), where Kripke characterizes the meaning of a designator as a function from worlds (considered counterfactually) to values. In other places, when he is less interested in distinguishing modal matters from epistemic ones and more interested in accounting for apparently non-modal contributions that words can make to a statement, Kripke seems more open to the possibility of non-modal content (cf. Kripke 1979, p. 273, note 10). And, as section (2.3.3) of the main entry Rigid Designators indicates, there are considerations in favor of two-dimensionalism that could perhaps move Kripke. As we have seen, Kripke holds ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’ to be a priori and ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ to be a posteriori. If sentences like this are to have such differing epistemic status, and if the claim that they have such differing status is to be interpreted as a claim about semantic content (as it might not: see §3.1 of the main entry Rigid Designators), then Kripke will have to embrace a form of content that is distinct from the content relevant to the metaphysics of modality. With respect to content relevant to the metaphysics of modality, the two sentences share the same status (they are true or false at just the same worlds) because ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are rigid designators for the same thing.

The argument about mind in consideration here does not require two-dimensionalism, though: it is about an identity statement's modal status as necessarily false. Epistemic matters are not even mentioned in its formulation in section (3.4) of the main entry Rigid Designators. To the extent that epistemic matters could enter in answering objections (“But couldn't ‘P = C’ be true a posteriori just as ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is?”), various responses are possible that dispense with epistemic or other non-modal content in accordance with the strategy discussed in the paragraph corresponding to this note. One response is to rule out aposteriority for both ‘P = C’ and ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’. Another is to recognize aposteriority for the latter statement and not the former but to treat the aposteriority as applicable to the statements rather than their content (again, see §3.1 of the main entry Rigid Designators).

3. Direct reference theorists are unsurprisingly unsympathetic to a two-dimensionalism that appeals to epistemic content in order to recognize a difference in truth value between ‘It is a priori that Hesperus = Hesperus’ and ‘It is a priori that Phosphorus = Hesperus’.

As for complications surrounding ambiguity and its alternatives, Chalmers for the most part denies that the two kinds of intension give rise to ambiguity (2002, p. 166; a stronger denial is in forthcoming-a, §3.10). But two-dimensionalism does occasionally drive Chalmers to appeal to ambiguity. For example, he would claim that ‘With respect to w2, Water = H2O’ is not straightforwardly true, since on one reading it is false: the statement “is ambiguous between readings that invoke epistemic and subjunctive intensions” (Chalmers 2002, p. 165; see Marconi 2005 for a detailed and critical examination of this territory; w2 is a world discussed in Table 2 from §3.5 of the main entry Rigid Designators). In any event, it seems clear that these two kinds of intension do not give rise to any ordinary ambiguity. ‘Phosphorus’ is ambiguous (or used to be, when chemical terms were capitalized). It could designate the planet or the chemical. But on each of these readings the ambiguous term would have both kinds of intension, for two-dimensionalists. Thus, ‘Phosphorus’, when used as a planet term, takes Venus as its value for all possible worlds according to the subjunctive intension even though ‘Phosphorus’, when used as a planet term, takes other planets like Mars as its value for some other possible worlds according to the epistemic intension. Something similar would hold for ‘Phosphorus’ when it is used as a chemical term instead of a planet term.

Genuine, familiar ambiguity poses no trouble for direct reference theorists: for them, the semantic value of ‘Phosphorus’, when that term is used for the planet, is just Venus. But Chalmers' epistemic and subjunctive intensions do spell trouble for direct reference theorists (and are accordingly rejected: see, e.g., Soames 2005. Much the same can be said about Jackson's A-intensions and C-intensions: see, e.g., Jackson 1998, pp. 85-6). Both intensions for ‘Phosphorus’ perform genuine semantic work when the term is used for the planet, since not only the subjunctive intension but also the epistemic intension, whose value is something other than Venus at some worlds, performs work that is responsible for determining the truth value of sentences (Chalmers forthcoming-a, §3.10): so the term's semantic value is not simply Venus, contrary to direct reference theorists.

4. At least Kripke does not say anything that would commit to this position about “secondary intensions” as they are understood here. If secondary intensions are understood to be functions from worlds to genuine extensions, rather than, as they are understood here (see also note 13 in the main entry Rigid Designators), something that will fall short of this in the event that our epistemic access to necessity in some sort of ideal circumstances (e.g., after the scientists have discovered the relevant microstructural compositions of our substances, so that we are free to associate our vernacular terms like ‘water’ with theoretical essences like H2O) is wanting, then Kripke and everyone else is committed to saying that all statements with contingent secondary intensions are in fact metaphysically contingent. But this alternative understanding of “secondary intensions” would add complications that Chalmers' clean two-dimensional framework avoids.

5. Chalmers rejects the Kripkean argument for token non-identity: 1996, pp. 147-8. Two-dimensionalists like Chalmers would seem to be committed to Kripkean arguments against type identity, like ‘Pain (the kind) = c-fiber firing (the kind)’. But their focus is on the failure of constitution; the importance of type-identity failure may accordingly be downplayed (Chalmers 1996, pp. 131, 148).