Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Nonexistent Objects

1. This distinction can be interpreted in one of two ways: According to one interpretation, “exists” expresses one mode of being and “there is” another. (For a critique of modes of being distinctions see Reicher 2005a.) According to another interpretation, however, “exists” expresses the only mode of being and “there is” has no ontological import whatsoever.

2. Some claim that Meinongians (and even Meinong himself) are not ontologically committed to nonexistent objects (see, for instance, Priest 2005). Obviously, whether or not this is correct depends not the least upon the question of what exactly it means to be ontologically committed to something, which leads into a highly subtle, complex and controversial debate that cannot be pursued here. (For a contribution to this debate see Reicher 2005a.)

3. A similar view is held by the 18th century philosopher Thomas Reid (see Reid 1785). Reid's view is discussed and compared with the views of Brentano, Meinong, Findlay and Anscombe in Prior 1971.

4. Let's assume for the moment, in order to get a grip on the problem, that there is no difference between “Fs exist” and “there are Fs”.

5. This is not the place to enter a discussion about the merits and drawbacks of various versions of Free Logics. It must be sufficient for the present purpose to note that both (EG) and (PP) have an extraordinary degree of prima facie plausibility. Therefore, they should not be given up lightly.

6. Sometimes, advocates of the story operator strategy use an unspecified story operator “according to a story” (in the sense of “according to one story or another”).

7. Yet, (1′) may be taken to imply

(2′) According to the story S: There are flying horses.


(3′) According to the story S: Pegasus exists.

These implications, however, are unproblematic, for they do not contradict “There are no flying horses” and “Pegasus does not exist”.

8. A defense of a generalized operator strategy is to be found in Brock 2002. Brock's operator, however, is not a story operator but something one might call a “theory (or belief) operator”. It reads: “according to the realist's hypothesis” (where “the realist's hypothesis” is the assumption that there are fictitious objects). This strategy is not susceptible to the above objection, but it is doubtful whether it does justice to the intuitions that govern realism with respect to fictitious objects. The same holds true of the account in Everett 2005, which says that both authors and literary critics engage in some sort of “pretense”.

9. Throughout the whole entry, not annotated premises are what we take to be prima facie truths.

10. Graham Priest would even deny that 1 (“Pegasus is a flying horse”) implies “There are flying horses”. He would claim, instead, that 1 implies “For some x, x is a flying horse”. Whether this is more than a linguistic difference depends, of course, partly on how “there is” is interpreted. (See note 1.)

11. Note that analogous considerations hold for the principle of existential generalization. (EG) had been formulated as

(EG) Fb → ∃x(Fx)

and the following reading had been suggested:

(EGa) If b is F, then there is something that is F.

This reading can be (and is) accepted by a Meinongian. However, a Meinongian cannot accept

(EGb) If b is F, then Fs exist.

12. A proponent of a Meinongian solution to the problem of past and present objects is Mark Hinchliff, according to Markosian 2004.

13. At least, this is one of the possible interpretations of what the object called “blue” is, according to MOTo. Alternatively, one might interpret the object blue as ιxF(FxBF), i.e., as the object that has all and only those properties that are implied by the property of being blue (like being colored, for instance). It is difficult to decide whether Meinong, in the early version of his theory of objects, intended the object blue to be interpreted one way or the other. Since this question is of merely historical interest, we'll assume, for the sake of convenience, that according to MOTo the first interpretation is the correct one and leave the more complex interpretation for later (see section 5.2).

14. Incomplete objects violate the principle that for every property P and every object x, either x exemplifies P or x exemplifies the negation of P. However, incomplete objects do not violate the principle that for every property P and every object x, either x exemplifies P or x does not exemplify P.

15. The distinction between complete and incomplete objects resolves certain puzzles in connection with fictitious objects: How many hairs are there in Pegasus's tail? What was the shoe size of Sherlock Holmes' grand-grandmother? (We suppose that the respective stories do not give us any hint with respect to these questions.) — The Meinongian answer is simple and plausible: Pegasus is not determined with respect to the exact number of hairs in its tail. Sherlock Holmes is not determined with respect to the shoe size of his grand-grandmother. In general, fictitious objects are highly incomplete.

16. For Russell's criticism of MOTo see Russell 1973a, 1973b, and 1973c. Meinong defended himself in Meinong 1973. His reply to Russell can be plausibly interpreted as an anticipation of a revised version of MOTo (see Rapaport 1978), which will be delineated in section 5. For a detailed discussion of the Russell-Meinong debate see Smith 1985, Griffin 1985–86, and Simons 1992.

17. Originally, this distinction has been made by Ernst Mally, a disciple of Meinong, and Meinong adopted it for the mature version of object theory. Terence Parsons and Dale Jacquette are two contemporary proponents of this strategy. See Meinong 1972, Parsons 1980, Jacquette 1996, and also Routley 1980.

18. This strategy too has been introduced first by Ernst Mally (see Mally 1912). It is used by Hector-Neri Castañeda, Peter van Inwagen, William J. Rapaport, Edward N. Zalta, and others. See, for instance, Castañeda 1972, van Inwagen 1977, Rapaport 1978, Zalta 1983 and 1988. Meinong never adopted it.

19. Priest's book has been widely received and there has been a considerable amount of discussion about his theory. See, for instance, the Book Symposium in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 76 (2008), which consists of contributions by Daniel Nolan, Frederick Kroon, and, of course, Priest's replies.

20. Although Priest does not say so explicitly, one might suggest that they have properties like being round in some non-actual world, being a detective in some non-actual world etc. If so, his solution becomes structurally similar to the dual copula strategy. The problem of the underdetermination of nonexistent objects in the actual world is also broached in Nolan 2008 (191–193). Nolan argues that this problem is particularly pressing for objects of mathematics. Priest replies to this in his Priest 2008.

21. Priest claims that non-actual worlds themselves are nonexistent objects. This view, together with what has been said above, seems to entail (although Priest does not say so explicitly) that nonexistent worlds are constituted (partly) by existent objects. For Pegasus, for instance, exists in those worlds which are such as described in Greek mythology. Seemingly, it will not do to say that Pegasus does not “really” exist in those worlds (since those worlds are nonexistent), because Pegasus is said literally to have existence-entailing properties in those worlds, and if existence in a nonexistent world were not “real” existence, it seems that, consequently, objects existing in a nonexistent world could not literally have existence-entailing properties.

22. However, there is no complete agreement among advocates of the nuclear-extranuclear distinction as to which properties are extranuclear. In contrast to Parsons, Dale Jacquette classifies intentional properties as nuclear. (Jacquette 1996, 73f.)

23. I use the superscripts ‘n’ and ‘e’ to indicate whether the properties in question are nuclear or extranuclear.

24. If we set aside the constitutive-consecutive distinction, we may interpret the object called “blue” as ιxFn(FnxFn = Bn). This object has exactly one nuclear property, namely the property of being blue. But this object too has infinitely many extranuclear properties, among them the property of having exactly one nuclear property. Thus the paradox is avoided in the same way as with ιxFn(FnxBnFn).

25. This doctrine raises a difficult question: What is the difference between an extranuclear property and its nuclear counterpart? For a discussion of this problem see Reicher 2005b.

26. However, MOTne may be made stronger by assuming that not only there is a nuclear counterpart to every extranuclear property but that there is also an extranuclear counterpart to every nuclear property. (This assumption is made in Parsons 1980, see p. 167.) Of course, this makes the problem of how to distinguish nuclear from extranuclear properties even more pressing. But given that all properties come in nuclear-extranuclear pairs, one might say: The round square exemplifies only nuclear roundness and squareness, while every existent square exemplifies extranuclear squareness. The (nonexistent) golden mountain exemplifies only nuclear goldenness and mountainhood, whereas every existent mountain exemplifies extranuclear mountainhood. One might argue that the principle of contradiction concerns extranuclear properties only and that a thing's nuclear mountainhood does not entail that the thing can be perceived and is located in space, since a thing that exemplifies only nuclear mountainhood is not a mountain in the usual sense. Such an extension of MOTne would bring MOTne very close to the dual copula theory (see next section).

27. Van Inwagen applies this distinction exclusively to objects of fiction (in the narrower sense, connected to the ontology of art), but in its function and spirit it seems to be analogous to the ones of Mally and Castañeda.

28. According to the interpretation adopted here, properties of the form “encoding being F” can be exemplified by abstract objects only. Alternatively, one might assume that, for instance, an existent “real” human being exemplifies both the property of being human and the property of encoding the property of being human, while something that encodes being human without exemplifying this property must be an abstract object.

29. Contributions to a discussion of the topics mentioned below are to be found in Reicher 2001 and Reicher 2005b.