Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Mereology

1. Actually, the calculus of individuals had variables for classes; a class-free, purely nominalistic version of the system appeared later in Goodman (1951). On the link between mereology and nominalism, see Eberle 1970.

2. This choice of logic is not without consequences. Particularly when it comes to the mereological operators of sum, product, etc. defined in Section 4.1, a free logic would arguably provide a more adequate background (see Simons 1991). However, here we shall go along with the simplifications afforded by the assumption of a classic logical background (with descriptive terms treated à la Russell).

3. The labels and nomenclature follow Casati and Varzi 1999, ch.3, with which the present text has some overlap.

4. Bunge (1966) holds that there are several null items. However, his definition departs from the isual one: a null item is not something that is part of everything, but something which, when added to a second thing, yields the latter. This is obviously incompatible with (P.3). Martin (1943) defines the null item as “that which is not part of itself”, and Efird and Stoneham (2005) as “that which remains when an object is subtracted from itself”. Such definitions are also incompatible with (P.1), if intelligible at all.

5. If the condition is not satisfied the fusion may not exist, in which case the standard treatment of descriptive terms that we are assuming implies that the corresponding instances of the principles that follow are false. Strictly speaking, (36)-(41) should therefore be in conditional form. For instance, (36) should read

(36′)    ξxxx = x + x.

On this understanding, we use the non-conditional form for perspicuity. Ditto for (43)-(44) below.

6. Universalism is also known as ‘conjunctivism’ (Van Cleve 1986, Chisholm 1987) or ‘collectivism’ (Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 1999); other authors call (P.17) the principle of ‘unrestricted composition’ (Lewis 1986), or the ‘general fusion principle’ (Casati and Varzi 1999), or simply the ‘fusion principle’ (Heller 1990). In the presence of U, the principle is also closely related to the ‘doctrine of arbitrary undetached parts’ attacked by van Inwagen (1981), though the latter doctrine is limited to the material content of occupiable regions of space.

7. Strictly speaking, Parsons relies on the notion of suma, hence unrestricted minimal uper bounds, but the argument applies also under the other construals of that notion examined in Section 4.2.

8. Strictly speaking, Smith works woth a notion of (concrete) part that involves a double world-time index, but for the simple principles under discussion here both indexes can be omitted as irrelevant.