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Medieval Mereology

First published Sat May 20, 2006; substantive revision Thu Jul 7, 2011

The term “mereology” is sometimes used to refer to any one of the formal languages that describe the part-to-whole relation. In this article, I will use the term more broadly to refer to any theoretical study (formal or informal) of parts, wholes, and the relations (logical or metaphysical) that obtain between them. In what follows I will survey some of the ways that philosophers in the medieval Latin West thought about parts and wholes. (There is very little contemporary scholarship on medieval Arabic mereology. However, many of the Latin notions and distinctions that I will survey most likely have correlates in the Arabic tradition.) The article will highlight many of the key medieval mereological concepts and principles, and it will outline some of the fundamental issues that confront mereologists in the Middle Ages. Specific philosophers and their doctrines will be used to illustrate some of these concepts, principles, and puzzles. Many of these concepts and principles may seem strange to the modern student of parts and wholes, but behind this alien veneer one will see that medieval mereologists share many of our concerns about wholes, their parts, and the metaphysical implications of mereology.

1. Forums for medieval mereology

One can find discussions of parts and wholes throughout the medieval philosophical and theological literature. But there are two forums where the student of medieval mereology can reliably look to find sustained reflections on parts and wholes as such, namely, treatments of division and the Topics. The main authority on division and the Topics is the Roman philosopher Boethius (c. 480–524 C.E.). Boethius is now most famous for his Consolation of Philosophy, but his influence on medieval philosophy is as much due to his commentaries on Aristotle's Categories and On Interpretation, his theological treatises, and his handbooks on logic (see Chadwick 1981 and Marenbon 2003). Boethius' treatment of division is found in his handbook On Division (De divisione). His treatment of the Topics is found in his handbook On the Topical Differences (De differentiis topicis) and in his commentary on Cicero's treatment of the Topics (In Ciceronis Topica).

1.1 Division

The methods of “division” (Greek: diairesis, Latin: divisio) and “collection” (Greek: sunairesis, Latin: collectio) have their roots in Plato's later dialogues, and they are common in Ancient Neoplatonic and Aristotelian treatises on logic. Plato tells us that collection and division provide us with a way to understand the relationships between some unity and some plurality (Phaedrus 265d-266b, and Philebus 16c-17a). Division is a process whereby any sort of unity is resolved into a plurality. Collection is the process whereby a plurality is collected into a unity.

For the Neoplatonists, division and collection are first and foremost applied to genera and species (such as Animal and Human), and instances of these universals (such as Brownie the donkey and Socrates). This primary mode of division is often interpreted as a logical exercise. In particular, it is a method for developing definitions of things, which can then be used in demonstrations. Collection is construed as a method for classification.

The primary purpose of division for Late Ancient philosophers is to determine the hierarchical relations between a universal and that which falls under it. But divisions are applied to a variety of other items. There is no single, canonical list of divisions (for an overview, see Magee 1998, xxxvii-xlix). The list presented by Boethius is the one bequeathed to the Latin West (On Division 877c-d). Boethius distinguishes between two broad categories: substantial divisions and accidental divisions. These divisions are divided further. Of the substantial divisions there are:

  1. The division of the genus into its species.
  2. The division of the whole into parts.
  3. The division of a word into its meanings.

Of the accidental divisions there are:

  1. The division of a subject into accidents.
  2. The division of accidents into subjects.
  3. The division of accidents into accidents.

The most important material for our purposes is Boethius' treatment of the first and second substantial modes of division.

1.2 The Topics

“Topic” is the standard translation for the Latin term locus. As Stump (1981 and 1982) and Green-Pedersen (1984) have pointed out, the notion of the Topic evolves over the course of its use in ancient and medieval logic, but in general, the study of the Topics helps one to discover a number of self-evidently true propositions, or “maximal propositions”, that can serve as warrants for arguments. For example, suppose that someone makes this inference:

If Socrates is human, Socrates is animal.

Students of the Topics claim that this inference is warranted by the following maximal proposition:

If a species is predicated of something, that species' genus is also predicable of that thing.

The student of medieval mereology will be extremely interested in the maximal propositions presented in treatments of the Topic from the whole and the Topic from the part.

Following a well-established Ancient tradition, the Topic from the whole is usually divided into two sub-Topics:

  1. The Topic from the universal whole.
  2. The Topic from the integral whole.

From the beginning, the best medieval philosophers are aware of the subtleties of ordinary language. In particular, they are mindful of the distributive function of the adjectival term “whole” (totus/tota/totum). That is, the term “totus” can act like a universal quantifier and, hence, the phrase “totus x” can mean “all the parts of x taken together” or “the entire x” (see Section 2 below). This sensitivity to the distributive sense of “totus” might be what motivates medieval logicians to add further refinements to the theory of the Topics. Specifically, by the thirteenth century, the Topic from the whole is routinely divided in a six-fold manner (see, e.g., Peter of Spain Tractatus V.11–18, pp. 63–67; and Radulphus Brito Quaestiones super libro Topicorum II, q. 9). In addition to the Topic from the universal whole and the Topic from the integral whole, there are these additional Topics:

  1. The Topic from the whole in quantity.
  2. The Topic from the whole in a respect (in modo).
  3. The Topic from the whole in place.
  4. The Topic from the whole in time.

The Topic from the whole in quantity classifies and considers propositions where the term is taken universally, such as “Every x is a y”, or “No x is a y”. The Topic from the whole in a respect considers a term in respect to some limiting qualification. So, for example, if x is white on its surface, then every part of x's surface is white. The Topic from the whole in place classifies propositions bounded by the term “everywhere” or its cognates. So, if water is everywhere, then water is here (where “here” designates a “part in place”). And, finally, the Topic from the whole in time considers inferences that one can make from propositions bounded by the term “always” or “never”.

A full account of medieval mereology would consider carefully the details of all six sub-Topics. But of special interest to us are the treatments of the Topic from the integral whole and of the Topic from the integral part. In these discussions, medieval philosophers usually consider whether the traditional maximal propositions associated with these Topics in fact describe the logical and metaphysical relations that hold between an integral whole and an integral part. Specifically, the maximal proposition that applies to integral wholes is:

If the whole is, then the part is.

The maximal proposition said to apply to the integral part in relation to its whole is:

If the part is not, the whole is not.

These maximal propositions are quite startling. They seem to entail, for example, that if Socrates exists, then his hand must exist, and if Socrates' hand ceases to exist, then Socrates ceases to exist. As we will see in Section 4.2, such consequences do not escape the notice of medieval philosophers, and much of interest regarding the metaphysical implications of the Topics and their maximal propositions ensues.

2. Wholes

Sometimes the phrase “x (est) totus” (“x is whole”) can mean that x is complete or not lacking anything. This is a sense of “whole” that Aristotle identifies in his Metaphysics and that he contrasts with the notion of being “mutilated” (kolobon) (Metaphysics 5.26 and 5.27, respectively).

Closely related to the sense of being complete, “whole” can have a distributive function and the phrase “totus x est y” (“whole x is y”) can mean all of x is y—that is, all the parts of x taken together is y. This is called the term's “categorematic” sense. In the Thirteenth and Fourteenth centuries logicians also distinguish a second distributive sense of “whole”, which they call the “syncategorematic” sense of the term (see, e.g., William of Sherwood Syncategoremata [1941, 54]; Ockham Summa Logicae II, ch. 6 [Opera Philosophica I, 267–69]; John Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 4.3.7–1; Albert of Saxony Sophismata 45). When “totus x est y” is interpreted syncategorematically, it means each and every part (quaelibet pars) of x is y.[1]

Finally, “whole” can signify a thing that is either composed of some things or divisible into some things. This is the sense of “whole” at work in discussions of collection and division.

The ancient practice of collection and division, and especially the proclivity to call both the products of collection and the things to be divided wholes, has a lasting influence on medieval mereology. For medieval philosophers a variety of items can be wholes. Universals, concepts, material objects, masses (such as water or gold), souls, and time can all be wholes—and this is only to mention some of the more common items studied by medieval philosophers. Thus, in general, anything that is composed out of other items or that can be divided into other items is a whole. But there are two important qualifications.

First, one should not assume that all wholes are mind-independent features of the world. Peter Abelard, for instance, argues that temporal wholes (such as days, weeks, or hours) and universal wholes are not things (res). Yet, provided that we do not reify these items, Abelard will allow us to treat items like days and hours as wholes consisting of parts, and he will allow us to talk about universals and their parts. (On temporal wholes, see Dialectica 554.14–23 and Logica Ingredientibus 2, 187.9–14. On universals, see Logica Ingredientibus 1, 10.8–16.18 and Logica Nostrorum 515.10–522.9. For a helpful overview of Abelard's anti-realist metaphysics, consult King 2004.)

Second, some medieval philosophers, again motivated by their metaphysical commitments as well as their understanding of what wholes must be, will prefer to distinguish between “true”, or “proper”, wholes and quasi-wholes. Ockham, for example, insists that individuals are not actually “parts” of species and species are not actually “parts” of genera. These items are merely “parts” in a figurative sense. Likewise, species and genera are “wholes” only in a metaphorical sense. Once this distinction is appreciated, however, Ockham is willing to allow us to speak of a genus or a species as a “whole of a sort” (quoddam totum), since there is a legitimate sense in which a species “contains” individuals and a genus “contains” its species (Ockham Expositio in librum Porphyrii de praedicabilibus ch. 2, [Opera Philosophica II, 54]).

With these caveats in place, we can begin to explore the basic mereological categories that one finds in medieval treatments of mereology. As was noted, all manner of items can be wholes, but generally speaking medieval philosophers believe that this motley group of wholes can be organized under three broad categories: integral wholes, universal wholes, and potential wholes. It will soon become apparent that the category of integral wholes is quite broad. Indeed, it is so inclusive that some philosophers will feel pressure to introduce a fourth basic category, substantial wholes. But more often, philosophers will suggest that an integral whole is divisible into two distinct kinds of parts, quantitative parts and substantial parts. For this reason, I will consider the issue of substantial wholes and substantial parts in Section 3.1.

2.1. Integral wholes

Much of what we encounter in the material world is, or can be considered to be, a whole. Cars, houses, plants, and human beings are all composed out of bits of metal, plastic, cellulose, or flesh and bone. Cars, house, plants, and humans are not only divisible into these components; they are divisible into other parts such as carburetors, doors, leaves, and hands.

Items such as cars, houses, plants, and humans are considered to be either continuous or contiguous integral wholes, depending upon a particular medieval philosopher's other metaphysical commitments. Following Aristotle's division of quantities into continuous and discrete quantities (Cat. 6), medieval philosophers divide the integral whole into continuous integral wholes and discrete integral wholes. Continuous wholes are wholes whose parts share a common boundary. Discrete wholes are wholes whose parts do not share a common boundary. The parts of discrete integral wholes can be either close to one another, or relatively scattered. Contiguous wholes consist of parts that are discrete, but spatially close together. Discrete wholes whose parts are relatively diffuse are “disaggregated” integral wholes. (For a fairly comprehensive catalog of the kinds of integral wholes, see Anonymous Compendium Logicae Porretanum III.12.)

Some early medieval philosophers only have artifacts like fences in mind when they talk about contiguous wholes. But others think that even more complicated man-made objects, such as wagons, clocks, and houses are contiguous wholes, not continuous wholes. For instance, both Abelard and Aquinas think that only substances, such as individual donkeys, palm trees, and human beings, are continuous wholes. Abelard thinks that this is true because only God can fuse parts together into a continuous unity. Humans operations, no matter how finessed, are only capable of placing parts in close proximity to one another (Dialectica 417.4–37; 419.35–420.6). Drawing upon Aristotle's reflections on form and matter (especially in his De Anima, Physics and Metaphysics), Aquinas thinks that only substances possess a substantial form, which inheres in each and every part of the whole. Artifacts possess an accidental form, for artifacts have a form that orders and arranges the parts of the whole, but that does not inhere in each and every part of the whole (Summa Theol. I, q. 76, art. 8). We can tell whether a form is substantial or accidental by attending to the effect of the form's existence on the functionality of the parts. A substantial form inheres in the hands of a human being because if the form were removed, that part would cease to function as a hand (Quaestiones de Anima q. 10, pp. 158–59). The carburetor of a car, in contrast, when the form is removed from the car can still be a carburetor. It can be placed in another car and continue functioning as a carburetor.[2]

In addition to artifacts and natural substances, some medieval philosophers expand the class of continuous integral wholes to cover homogeneous masses, such as some gold or some water, and the class of disaggregated integral wholes to include scattered mereological sums, such as the sum of this mountain and this dog. Abelard is one of the rare medieval philosophers who insist that any two items can constitute a discrete integral whole (see Dialectica 548.19–22). This puts Abelard in the company of many modern mereologists—for example, David Lewis (1991, 74; cf. Simons 1987, 108–12 and the subsection on unrestricted fusions in the Encyclopedia entry on mereology)—but it sets him apart from most medieval philosophers. (Indeed, we have records indicating that Abelard was attacked by some of his twelfth-century contemporaries for admitting that any two items can compose an integral whole (Anonymous Introductiones Montanae maiores, 69rb).)

It must be remembered that medieval philosophers are for the most part working within an Aristotelian framework, and like Aristotle, their paradigmatic examples of unified composite things are substances. If a thing is not unified by a substantial form, then that thing has a lesser kind of unity. Humans and dogs are more unified than houses and wagons. Houses and wagons, nonetheless, are unified by a form— namely, an accidental form—and so they have a unity of a sort. Moreover, this kind unity will be greater than the unity of a mere collection of things. Hence, as a general rule, the more gerrymandered a collection of parts is, the more likely it is that this composite's status as a whole will be called into question (see, e.g., Aquinas In Metaphysica expositio, lectio V, §§ 1102–4; Jean Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 8.1.4).

In addition to material beings, some medieval philosophers allow non-material items to be integral wholes. For example, Ockham thinks that complex mental acts can be wholes, and Aquinas insists that actions such as penance are integral wholes (Ockham Quaestiones in physicam q. 6 [Opera VI, 407–10]; In De Int. I, prooemium, 6 [Opera II, 354–8]; Aquinas Summa Theologiae III, q. 90, art. 3). Abelard insists that temporal items are not integral wholes, but he seems to be in the minority. Non-material integral wholes do not sit easily under either the continuous or the discrete category, since their parts cannot be related to one another with respect to location. If asked to pick, medieval philosophers tend to label temporal wholes and events as continuous wholes, but they are not continuous in the way that a bronze rod is continuous. Their parts to not share some spatial boundary; they come one after another in continuous succession. For this reason, these wholes are sometimes called “successive” wholes (Anonymous Compendium Logiae Porretanum III.12). In addition to aggregates of time, processes (that is, things that take time to unfold) are also sometimes considered to be successive wholes (see, e.g., Aquinas Summa III, q. 90, art. 3, ad 3).

In short, an astounding variety of items can be integral wholes. Yet, no matter how large this category becomes, most medieval philosophers insist that the class of integral wholes does not exhaust the domain of those items that can be wholes. In particular, there are two types of item that require their own category: universals and souls.

2.2. Universal wholes

Many non-material items are considered to be integral wholes. But most medieval philosophers mark off one special sort of non-material object, the universal, and treat it as a separate type of whole.

It was noted in Section 1.1 that universals, and especially species and their genera, are related to one another hierarchically. For instance, the species Human Being and the species Horse both fall under the genus Animal. Additionally, individuals are related hierarchically to their species and genera. Hence, Socrates and Cicero fall under the species Human Being and the genus Animal. These relations between universals and individuals are often described in the terms of collection and division. Cicero and Socrates and all other humans are collected into the species Human Being, and the species Human Being and Horse and all other species are collected in the genus Animal. Correlatively, Animal is divided into its species, and Human Being is divided into individual humans.

This language of collection and division invites medieval philosophers to call the divisible items wholes, and the products of these divisions parts. Nevertheless, most ancient and medieval philosophers who use mereological language to describe the relations between universals and individuals are not tempted to think that universals are literally composed out of individuals or lesser species.[3] There are noteworthy exceptions. For example, an anonymous twelfth-century philosopher carefully articulates and spiritedly defends a version of what is often called the collection (collectio) theory of universals (Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus et speciebus §§ 84-153 [= Cousin 1836, 524–41]). But, in general, universal wholes are clearly marked off from other kinds of whole, and their behavior is thought to be distinct from the behavior of potential and integral wholes.

There is one significant complication. In his On Division, Boethius distinguishes between genera and wholes (877c-d, see also In Cic. top. 331.18-19). Under his treatment of wholes, he distinguishes between universal wholes, which would include species that have individuals as parts, and other types of whole. The reasons why Boethius distinguishes genera from other universals are not entirely clear, but it appears that he wants to distinguish two kinds of universals: universals that have other universals as parts, and universals that have individuals as parts. In order to make sense of this distinction, it must be noted that for late ancient philosophers “genus” and “species” are relative terms. Animal is a genus in relation to Human Being and Horse, but it is a species of Substance. In other words, the terms “genus” and “species” designate hierarchical relations between two universals. Only some universals are genera and not species (e.g. Substance), and only some universals are species and not genera (e.g. Human Being). These most specialized species (specialissima) can only stand over individuals, not other universals. These specialissima are universal wholes, but they are not the only universal wholes. If “Animal” were the name of that whole consisting of all individual animals, then Animal too could be a proper universal whole. This whole could be a universal whole because, as we will see below (Sections 3.2 and 3.3), wholes will be distinguished by the parts that they have and by the relations that obtain between these parts and their whole.

2.3. Potential wholes

In addition to integral wholes and universal wholes, Boethius introduces a third basic type of whole to medieval philosophers: the whole consisting of “powers” (potentiae) or “virtues” (virtutes) (On Division 888a). These wholes are often called virtual wholes or potential wholes.

Potential wholes are curious items. They are particulars, not universals. Yet unlike other particular wholes, potential wholes are not composed out of other items, and they are not separable into other items. Potential wholes, then, are in a sense part-less. However, they are divisible in one respect: this non-composite potential whole has different functions or powers that it performs.

The most common type of potential whole is a human soul. A human soul is not composed out of other items, nor can the soul be cut up into other items. Nevertheless, the soul manifests itself in different ways, and often in different regions of the body. The soul is not fully characterized by any one of its powers. The soul is characterized only by the complete set of its powers. While this set of powers does not literally compose the soul, they are considered to be parts of the whole soul. The soul would not be complete if it lacked one of these powers.

The concept of the potential whole is difficult to grasp as it is. Unfortunately, Boethius makes matters worse when he claims that the division of a potential whole into its powers resembles both the division of a genus and the division of a whole:

For given that the predicate “soul” follows upon the existence of any part of it, it is compared to the division of the genus, [since] each and every species of [the genus] necessarily entails the genus itself. However, given that not every soul is composed of all the parts but each one is composed differently, it is necessarily compared to the nature of a whole. (On Division 888c-d [Magee 1998, 40])

Some earlier medieval philosophers take Boethius' statement as an invitation to reduce the soul, and the potential whole in general, to either a genus or an integral whole. (One of the first attempts to place the division of soul under the division of the genus is found in a short letter from a mysterious ninth-century thinker identified only as “Master L”. The letter is preserved in the manuscripts of St. Gall, and is transcribed by De Rijk (1963, 75–78).) However, the attempt to reduce soul to either a genus or an integral whole appears doomed, for potential wholes do not fit well under either category. Souls are particular, and hence, they cannot be universals of any kind, let alone genera. On the other hand, souls do not have parts in the same way that other true wholes have parts: Socrates can be separated into his hands, feet, and so forth; a chemical mixture can be reduced back into its ingredients. Even a universal whole can be separated into independently existing parts, namely, the individuals that are its parts. But a soul is neither composed out of its powers, nor is it separable into freestanding parts: the powers must be powers of a soul.

By the middle of the twelfth century, philosophers propose an uneasy compromise. For example, in a commentary that has been attributed to the young Peter Abelard we learn that there are two definitions of soul: a “superior” one in virtue of which the soul “has an affinity with a universal whole”, and an “inferior” definition in virtue of which soul has an affinity with an integral whole (Abelard De divisionibus 194.8–29).

Many later medieval philosophers also seem to have some trouble understanding the nature of potential wholes. Buridan, for instance, suggests that mixtures—such as that of water and wine—are really potential wholes, because one cannot separate the mixture back into its starting ingredients (Summulae de Dialectica 8.1.5). Every actual portion of the mixture is watery-wine. The wine and the water are only present in the mixture potentially. Buridan, however, seems to be conflating two senses of “potentia”: “potentia” can mean “power”, or it can mean “a potentiality”. This second sense of “potentia” is connected to Aristotle's conception of actuality. (On Aristotle's notions of actuality and potentiality, consult the section on Actuality and Potentiality in the Encyclopedia entry on Aristotle's metaphysics.) But the relation of parts to whole that is captured in Buridan's claim that the water and wine are potentially in the mixture is not the same parts-to-whole relation that holds between the capacities of the soul and the soul. The water and wine were at one point separate beings, and even if humans cannot separate wine from water, in principle they could be separated by a sufficiently powerful being (e.g., God). In contrast, the faculty of reason never existed and never can exist separately from the soul. But not all medieval philosophers are perplexed by potential wholes. Aquinas, for example, understands that the potential whole consists of powers, not elements that potentially exist in the whole. He treats potential wholes as a third primitive type of whole which is “intermediate between” the universal and the integral whole (Summa Theologiae I, q. 77, art. 1, ad 1). Aquinas places potential wholes between integral and universal wholes because the parts of potential wholes behave in one manner like the parts of universals and in another manner like the parts of integral wholes. Thus, in order to gain a better understanding of potential wholes, it is necessary to explore the relation of integral parts to integral wholes and the relation of the parts of universals to universal wholes.

3. Parts

Many kinds of item can be wholes, and many kinds of item can be parts of these wholes. In general, any item that composes a whole is a part, and any item that is a product of a division of some whole is a part of that whole. The only clear restriction on what can be a part is that no part is identical to its whole. In other words, no medieval philosopher countenances what contemporary mereologists call improper parts. (On the contemporary notions of part, or improper part, and proper part consult the entry on contemporary mereology, and also Simons 1987, 9–11.)

We will first consider the kinds of things that can be parts of integral wholes (Section 3.1). We will then turn to the parts of universals (Section 3.2). As it will turn out, some of the parts of universals can also be parts of integral wholes. This will prompt us to consider several criteria that medieval philosophers use to distinguish universal wholes from integral wholes (Section 3.3). Finally, we will return to consider potential wholes in light of these criteria for distinguishing universals from integral wholes (Section 3.4).

3.1. Parts of integral wholes

Consider the paradigmatic integral whole Socrates. Socrates is composed out of a soul and a body. His body is composed out of flesh, bone, and blood. And the flesh, bone, and blood in turn are ultimately created by combining the four basic elements, Earth, Air, Fire, and Water. All these components of Socrates can be considered integral parts of Socrates.

Socrates is also divisible into a number of other parts. We can cut Socrates in half, and thereby create the top half of Socrates and the bottom half of Socrates. We can also divide Socrates into his hands, feet, torso, heart, and so forth. All these products of the divisions of Socrates can be considered integral parts of Socrates.

Medieval philosophers separate this plethora of integral parts into a number of distinct categories. The top and bottom halves of Socrates are often called quantitative parts, since they divide Socrates solely with respect to a quantity, or measure. Flesh, bone, and blood, as well as the elements that compose these components are often called quantitative parts as well, for they comprise Socrates' matter, and matter is often associated with quantity.

Not all medieval philosophers think that the elements are parts of Socrates. Abelard, for example, believes that the elements are ingredients, but not every ingredient is a part. Strictly speaking, only those items that compose some whole and remain in that whole after composition are parts of the whole (Dialectica 575.18–36). Hence, even though the flour is an ingredient of the bread, the flour is not a part of the bread. The flour has been altered by a chemical change, and so it does not remain once the bread is baked. Likewise, while the elements combine into a chemical mixture that becomes flesh, the earth and water that make up flesh are no longer present. Only the crumbs and flesh are properly parts of the bread and Socrates respectively. Aquinas effectively agrees with Abelard on this point, but he articulates his position in terms of Aristotle's distinction between actuality and potentiality (In Metaphysicorum expositio, lectio V, § 1102). The elements that composed my body only exist in actuality when my body has been dissolved back into elemental matter. Aquinas adds that many other quantitative parts of integral wholes only exist potentially in their wholes. For example, this half of a bronze rod does not exist in actuality until the rod is cut in two and thereby ceases to be a continuous whole.

Medieval philosophers also like to draw a distinction between the homogeneous and heterogeneous parts of Socrates' body. Heterogeneous parts are such that, if they are themselves divided, their constituents are not of the same type as the original. For example, a hand is composed out of fingers, knuckles, and a palm. It is also, from another viewpoint, composed out of muscles, skin, and sinews. No part of the hand is a hand. However, some of the hand's parts are homogeneous. Muscle, skin, and blood are each homogeneous, since every bit of muscle is muscle, every bit of blood is itself blood, and every bit of skin is also skin.

The distinction between heterogeneous and homogeneous parts is bequeathed to medieval philosophers by Aristotle and Boethius. Aristotle imposes a loose hierarchy on these types of parts, claiming that the heterogeneous parts are composed out of homogeneous parts (History of Animals 486a13–14). This in turn suggests that the division of a whole into its parts is best initiated by dividing it into its heterogeneous parts, and only then into its homogeneous parts. Boethius is less explicit, suggesting that there may be many equally acceptable ways to begin to divide up a thing into its parts (On Division 888a-b).

Many of the heterogeneous parts of Socrates are best defined in terms of their function, not their measure. For example, hands are discriminated from feet based on what functions they perform for an animal. Many medieval philosophers believe that these functions are provided either by the form or the soul of the animal. For this reason, many medieval philosophers call functionally defined parts “formal parts”, or parts secundum formam, but in order to avoid any confusion, I will refer to parts of this sort as functional parts. The fourteenth-century philosopher Walter Burley tells us that the functional parts “remain the same so long as the whole remains the same and complete” (De toto et parte, 301). In other words, so long as Socrates' soul occupies his body, and provided the hand is not cut off, Socrates' hand remains a hand. Burley contrasts functional parts with material parts, and he places homogeneous parts such as flesh, bone, and blood under this category. Socrates' material parts are in constant flux; Socrates is constantly losing and replacing bits of flesh and blood.

In addition to the functional parts, which get their being from the form, Socrates' form (which is usually identified with his soul) and his matter (either his prime matter or his proximate matter en masse) can be considered parts of Socrates. But here there is some question as to whether form and matter are integral parts of Socrates. What Boethius says is ambiguous.

There is also a division of the whole into matter and form. For in one manner the statue is constructed out of its parts, and in another manner out of matter and form—i.e. out of bronze and its shape (species). (On Division 888b [Magee 1998, 40])

It is striking to learn that the form and the matter of the statue are not “parts”, especially since they are products of a division. Moreover, if a core meaning of “part of x” is “that out of which x comes to be” (cf. Boethius' On the Trinity 2), then the form and the matter of a thing ought to be the primary parts of that thing. Bronze without its form is merely bronze, not a statue; Socrates' matter without Socrates' substantial form is not a human. Clearly, then, Boethius cannot mean that form and matter are not parts in any sense.

The task, then, is to determine what kind of parts form and matter are, and especially what kind of parts substantial form and matter are. Aquinas routinely distinguishes between the “quantitative” parts of a thing and the form and the matter, which he calls “parts of the essence” (Summa Theologiae I, q. 8, a. 2, ad 3; I, q. 76, art. 8; III, q. 90, a. 2). However, he does not provide a clear answer to the question whether the part of an essence is a type of integral part, or whether it is a distinct kind of part. Other philosophers present a less ambiguous line: only parts that make up some quantity can be integral parts (see, e.g., Lambert of Auxerre Logica 126; Peter of Spain Tractatus V, 14; Albert of Saxony Sophismata 45). Accordingly, many medieval thinkers will propose that in addition to potential, subjective, and integral parts, there is a fourth kind of part, which I will call a substantial part.[4]

There are other good reasons why medieval philosophers might be motivated to distinguish the integral parts of a thing from the substantial parts of the same thing. Firstly, the form does not behave like the integral parts of the thing, for the form has the unique capacity to be present “as a whole” in each material part of the thing. Integral parts, by contrast, are thought to be unable to be present in more than one place at the same time, and for this reason, the integral parts of a thing are said to sit side-by-side, or “part outside of part” (pars extra partem). Secondly, substantial parts require something else to perfect them (see Albert of Saxony Sophismata 49). Matter by itself is incomplete; it is only potentially this or that thing. Matter needs a form in order to actually be this or that thing. Form, too, is in need of matter in order to exist perfectly. A dog's form is in need of some matter in order to actually be the form of this dog. Finally, distinguishing between substantial parts and integral parts captures an important intuition about substances: Socrates can lose and gain matter without compromising his existence. But if Socrates were to lose either his matter in total or his substantial form, he would cease to exist.

If one draws a sharp distinction between integral parts and substantial parts, the next natural thought would be to distinguish between integral and substantial wholes. The trouble is that in many cases the same thing seems to be both an integral whole and a substantial whole. Socrates, for example, has a quantity, and he is surely divisible into smaller quantities. It seems to follow that Socrates is an integral whole. But Socrates is also composed of matter and substantial form. So, he is a substantial whole. One could reject the notion that Socrates is an integral whole. But, then, what is it that has Socrates's size? Socrates' size is supposed to be an accident of Socrates, not of a part of Socrates. It is perhaps for this reason that some medieval philosophers try a different approach. Walter Burley, for example, prefers to draw a distinction between the whole considered in relation to its matter (secundum materiam) and the whole considered in relation to its form (secundum formam). Socrates considered formally—i.e. as a unity of this form with some matter—persists through time and change. Socrates considered materially is constantly in flux. That is, Socrates on Monday is not the same whole materially as Socrates on Friday, because the sum of material parts belonging to Socrates on Monday is not identical to the sum of material parts on Friday (De toto et parte, 301). The distinction between the whole considered formally and the whole considered materially will play a role in some medieval theories of persistence, and we will pursue this use of the distinction in short order (see Section 4.2). But, first, we must consider the parts of universals and the special problems that the parts of universals entail.

3.2. Parts of genera and universal wholes

Genera are divisible into their subordinate species, whereas universal wholes are divisible into their subordinate individuals. These subordinate items are said to be “subjective” parts of the universal whole or the genus, since the part is a subject and the whole is predicable of the part. Socrates is a subjective part of Human Being and a subjective part of Animal, and for this reason Human Being and Animal are predicable of Socrates. That is, Socrates is a human being, and Socrates is an animal. However, to be a true subjective part, not only must the name of the whole be predicable of the part, the definition of the whole also must be predicable of the part. A statue of Socrates could in some contexts be called a human. For example, suppose someone points to the statue and says, “That's a man.”, and then she points to another statue and says, “And that's a horse.”. This person is saying something intelligible, but the statue of Socrates cannot be a subjective part of Human Being, since the statue is not a rational mortal animal. Socrates, however, is a subjective part because he is a human being and a rational mortal animal.

Genera and universal wholes both consist of subjective parts, but they differ with respect to what items are their subjective parts. This fact might explain why Boethius places universal wholes under the broader class of true wholes. Boethius offers four criteria for distinguishing between genera and true wholes (On Division 879b-d):

  1. The genus is divided by means of a qualitative difference, whereas the whole is divided by means of a quantitative difference.
  2. The genus is naturally prior to its species, whereas the whole is naturally posterior to its parts.
  3. The genus is the matter for its species, whereas the parts are the matter for the whole.
  4. The species is always the same thing as its genus, while the part is sometimes not the same thing as its whole.

Some of these criteria could be interpreted in a manner such that the universal consisting of individuals falls under the category of true wholes. Consider, for example, criterion (a). The genus Animal is divided by considering what sort (qualis) of animal something is. Human Being is a rational animal, Horse is an irrational animal. In contrast, Human Being is not divided with respect to what sort of human being Socrates is. Socrates and Cicero are both rational animals. The difference between Socrates and Cicero is due to the fact that this bit of matter which makes up Socrates is different from that bit of matter which makes up Cicero. A difference in matter is typically considered to be a quantitative difference. Hence, the parts of the universal whole Human Being appear to be distinguished by quantity rather than quality.

However, some of the other criteria do not clearly mark genera off from universal wholes. Consider, for example, the second criterion. Boethius seems to have something like this in mind when he articulates difference (b): the parts of a genus are dependent upon the genus, whereas the whole is dependent upon its parts. In other words, if there are no animals, there can be no dogs or humans. In contrast, the house depends upon its parts. If you take away the roof and floor, the house ceases to exist. But universal wholes seem to behave like genera, not houses. If we annihilate all individual humans, we do not eliminate the universal Human Being. Therefore, difference (b) does not cleanly demarcate genera from universal wholes.

The third and fourth criteria present their own special problems, since it is far from clear how to interpret these differences, let alone whether the universal whole behaves like the genus or the true whole.

Thus, it is not clear that Boethius's four criteria adequately separate universals that consist of universals from universals that consist of individuals. It may be that the better division is that between universal wholes and integral wholes, not genera and true wholes, and indeed many medieval philosophers seem to take this route.

The reduction of genera and species to one category, the universal whole, is a minor revision compared to the problem to be explored in the next section. It seems that the same items can be both subjective parts of a universal whole and integral parts of an integral whole. This curious fact threatens to collapse the distinction between integral wholes and universal wholes. In other words, all wholes might be reducible to integral wholes.

3.3. Distinguishing universals from integral wholes with respect to their parts

Consider all the human beings on the planet. These individuals taken together are the integral whole composed of all human beings. Granted, this is a very large and diffuse discrete whole. But if we allow crowds and flocks to be integral wholes, there seems to be no principled reason to reject the existence of the sum of all humans. At the same time each of these human beings is a subjective part of the universal Human Being. If wholes are distinguished by the type of parts that they have, it seems that the universal Human Being is the same as the integral whole composed of all human beings.

Peter Abelard reports that there were some medieval philosophers who drew this very conclusion. Abelard describes and attacks this collection theory of universals in his Logica Ingredientibus (1, 13.18–15.22). For fuller presentations and evaluations of Abelard's critique, one should consult Henry (1984, 235–59), Freddosso (1978), and Tweedale (1976, 113–15). Here I will give only one objection: Abelard thinks that the collection theory gets the relation of dependence between the universal and the individuals backwards. According to Abelard, the collection theory is committed to the view that when Socrates dies, the universal Human Being is changed, and if one believes, as Abelard does, that a discrete integral whole is identical to the sum of its parts, then the Human Being that has Socrates as a part is not identical to the Human Being without Socrates. There is a new Human Being. But this, Abelard insists, is contrary to the orthodox understanding of universals, which states that while the individuals that fall under a universal are impermanent, the universal itself is permanent. Indeed, Human Being would exist even if every human being were annihilated.

The difference between integral wholes and universal wholes cannot be defined in terms of the kinds of items that are parts of the whole. Rather, the difference must be due to the way in which these items are parts of the whole.

Some medieval philosophers prefer to focus on the fact that every part of a universal whole admits the predication of the name and the definition of the whole. In other words, the universal only consists of subjective parts. Hence, there is this difference between the integral whole that consists of all human beings and the universal Human Being: only whole human beings are parts of Human Being. Socrates and Cicero are parts of Human Being, but Socrates' finger and Cicero's head are not parts of Human Being. Socrates and Cicero are parts of Human Being because Socrates is a human being and Cicero is a human being. The parts of Socrates and Cicero are not parts of Human Being because Socrates' hand is not a human being and Cicero's head is not a human being. In contrast, some parts of the integral whole consisting of all human beings do not meet the criterion for being a subjective part. The integral whole consisting of all human beings contains all human beings plus all the parts of human beings. Socrates, Cicero, Socrates' hand, and Cicero's head are all parts of the integral whole consisting of all human beings.

Oftentimes medieval philosophers illustrate this difference between the universal whole and the integral whole by focusing on precisely how the whole is predicated of its parts (Aquinas Summa Theol. III q. 90, art. 3; Walter Burley De toto et parte, 302; and Buridan Summulae 8.1.4). This is due to the fact that the name and definition of the integral whole are, after all, predicable of the integral part, but not in the same way that the universal is predicable of its part. The universal whole's name and definition is predicable of each of its parts taken singularly. For example, Socrates and Plato are both parts of the universal whole Human Being, and Human Being is predicable of both Socrates and Plato. That is,

Socrates is a human being, and Socrates is a rational, mortal animal.


Plato is a human being, and Plato is a rational, mortal animal.

This is true of every part of Human Being. In contrast, an integral whole is not predicable of its parts taken singularly. That is, one cannot say that

This piece of wood is a house.

Integral wholes are only predicable of their parts taken all at once.

This wood and this stone and these other parts taken together are a house.

The case of the integral whole consisting of all human beings is only a little trickier. As it turns out, some of the parts of the sum of all human beings will accept the predication of the name of the whole. But if one examines the matter carefully, it turns out that the definition of the sum of all human beings is not the same as the species, for the sum of all human beings is not itself a rational, mortal animal.

As popular as this appeal to subjective parts is, many philosophers understand that by itself, this criterion will not work. This is due to the fact that some integral wholes are composed of homogeneous parts. Boethius illustrates the problem with the example of a golden rod, which he believes is a homogeneous substance (On Division 879d). Recall that if something is a homogeneous substance, then every part of that thing is also the same substance. That is, if y is a homogeneous whole and x is a part of y, the name and definition of y is also predicable of x. Every portion of gold can take both the name and the definition of gold, and hence, it seems that every part of the gold rod meets the standard of being a subjective part. Therefore, it seems that the gold rod is a universal, which is clearly absurd.

Boethius resolves the puzzle of the rod and its parts by noting that while it is true that each portion of gold is gold, it is not true that a portion of the original quantity of gold is that original quantity of gold (Boethius On Division 880a) Boethius' solution is often repeated (Abelard De divisionibus 169.33–36; Albertus Magnus Commentarii in de Div. tract. 2, ch. 5 [1913, 35]; and Radulphus Brito In de Top. II, q. 9 [1978, 45]; cf. Aquinas Summa Theologiae I, q. 3, art. 7).

The solution points to another difference between integral wholes and universals. As Abelard puts it, every integral whole “draws together” (comprehendere) some quantity (Dialectica, 546.21–27). The suggestion is that when some items compose an integral whole, that whole will be measurable with respect to some quantity or other. The integral whole that is measured by some quantity need not be composed out of material elements. Consider the mereological sum of the angel Gabriel and the angel Michael. If this sum is a whole (and there seems to be no reason to deny this), it seems it is an integral whole. However, there are some integral wholes which do not seem to embrace any quantity, namely, thoughts and actions. So there is need to locate yet another difference between universal wholes and integral wholes.

The last difference that we will consider is this: Universals, like Human Being or Horse, are not literally composed out of their species. Integral wholes, such as Socrates or a house, are composed out of their parts (John Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 6.4.4; Ockham Expositio in librum Porphyrii 2.16 [Opera II, 54]). Composites are dependent upon their components. Socrates is composed of his body and his soul. If these components did not exist and combine to form Socrates, Socrates would not exist. Components are often, but not necessarily, temporally prior to the whole that they compose. For example, the house is composed by bits of wood, stone, and iron, and these parts existed prior to the existence of the house. Universal wholes are neither dependent upon their parts, nor are the parts of a universal temporally prior to it. The species existed long before Socrates or Cicero, and will exist long after Socrates and Cicero. Indeed, Human Being can exist, even if no individual human being exists.

Unlike the appeal to quantity, the composition criterion can be applied to thoughts and actions, for a complex thought requires the simpler concepts that compose it, and penance requires that the actions that constitute penance occur.

On the other hand, it appears that a universal is also a composite. Every universal except for the most general of genera, can be said to be “composed” out of a genus and a differentia. These parts are sometimes called “essential” parts of the universal since the genus and differentia together constitute the essence of the universal (Aquinas Summa Theologiae I, q. 8, art. 2, ad 3; and I q. 76, art. 8), although to avoid confusion we perhaps ought to call them definitional parts. The essence of a universal is usually encoded in its definition. For example, the definition of Human Being is rational mortal animal. Animal is the genus, and rationality and mortality are the differentiae.

Many medieval philosophers try to dampen this criticism by suggesting that the universal is, strictly speaking, not composite; it merely mimics composition (see the mention of Ockham in Section 2 above). Perhaps this is a viable response, but there is another problem with the composition requirement: it does not tell us why all the parts of integral wholes are integral parts. It was already observed in passing that not all parts of an integral whole are plausibly components of their wholes. Consider Socrates. The elements are strictly what compose Socrates. It is only when Socrates is composed that other parts, such as his hands and feet, come into existence. Or put another way, it is false to say that one makes a human being by cobbling together hands, feet, and head. Such a creature would be Frankenstein's monster, not a human being.

In sum, a number of proposals are offered for how one can distinguish universal wholes from integral wholes. But perhaps no single proposal is universally embraced because of the bewildering variety of items that are integral wholes. An obvious solution would be to reduce the number of items that can be integral wholes or integral parts, and as we have seen already, some philosophers in fact do this.

3.4. Parts of potential wholes

Potential wholes add further complications. Like genera, and unlike integral wholes, potential wholes are not literally composed out of their parts. Potential wholes are items that are fundamentally simple. But, in another respect, the parts of the potential whole behave like parts of an integral whole. Specifically, the potential whole is not predicable of the potential part taken singularly.

Aquinas separates potential wholes from both universals and integral wholes by considering two parameters: the presence of the whole in the part with respect to the whole's essence, and the presence of the whole in the part with respect to the whole's power (Summa Theologiae I, q. 77, art. 1, ad 1). The universal whole “is present to each of its parts in its entire essence and power”. It is for this reason that each part of the universal is a subjective part. In contrast, the integral whole is not in each of its parts either in respect to its entire essence or in respect to its power. Hence, the integral whole is not predicable of any one of its parts taken singularly. Finally, the potential whole is present to each of its parts with respect to its entire essence, but not with respect to its full power. This is why, even though one's soul is non-composite and cannot be cut up, one does not think with one's hands.

4. Mereology and metaphysics

Medieval philosophers are well aware that the study of wholes and their parts has numerous applications in metaphysics. I will conclude this survey by examining two applications. First, I will look at how theorizing about parts and wholes informs medieval reflections on identity at a time. Second, I will consider how mereology influences medieval theories of persistence through time and survival through change.

4.1. Identity

Medieval philosophers think that no part is identical to its whole.[5] The reasons why this is true are as varied as the types of parts and wholes themselves. If x is a quantitative part of y, then x is lesser in quantity than y. A donkey's form is not identical to the donkey, because this donkey is a composite of the donkey's form and something else, namely, the donkey's matter. Socrates' soul is not identical to the human being who is Socrates, for the human being is a composite of body and soul. Socrates is not a universal, even though he is a human being. And the extension of Animal is greater than the extension of Human Being.

However, there is another question that does divide medieval philosophers. Consider an integral whole. An integral whole is composed out of its parts. But is it true that an integral whole is no thing other than the sum of these parts? Some philosophers, such as Abelard and Ockham, argue that the whole is no thing other than the sum of its parts. Others, such as Duns Scotus, argue that the whole is some thing which is really distinct from the sum of its parts. (On the debate between Ockham and Scotus, see Cross 1995, Cross 1999, and Normore 2006). The former philosophers perhaps base their position on passages from Boethius' treatments of mereology such as this:

Every thing is the same as the whole. For example, Rome is the same as that which is the whole citizenry. Each and every thing is also the same as all its parts when they are gathered together into a unity. For example, a man is the same as the head, throat, belly, feet, and the rest of the parts gathered together and conjoined into a unity. (In Cic. top. 285.24–28)

Those who claim that the whole is not identical to its parts often appeal to Aristotle. For example, an anonymous commentator on Aristotle's Sophistical Refutations argues that “the five are not the two and the three” on the grounds that Aristotle has shown in his Metaphysics that “the composite, in general, is something other than its component parts” (Quaestiones super Sophisticos Elenchos q. 831 [1977, 346]; cf. Aristotle Metaphysics 8.6, 1045a9–10).

Peter Abelard provides one of the most sophisticated solutions to this problem. Abelard emphatically asserts that the whole is no thing other than the sum of its parts (Dialectica 344.34–5, and 550.6–7; cf. 560.34–561.2). But this is surely false. Consider a house. A house is composed out of a specific sum of boards and bricks. Yet these boards and bricks could be sitting together on the building site without being arranged as a house. Hence, it is hard to see how the house is no thing other than the sum of the parts.

Abelard would respond by drawing a distinction between the essentia, or concrete being, of a thing and the “conditions” (status) which a thing may possess or be in. True, the sum of boards and bricks must possess the appropriate arrangement in order to be a house (Logica Ingredientibus II, 171.14–17; and Dialectica 550.36–551.4). But when the sum takes on a specific structure it does not take on an extra part. Whatever they are, Abelard makes it very clear that structures and arrangements like those found in houses are not things (res), and only things can be parts. The imposition of a structure upon the sum of the boards and bricks does not add a part to the thing that is that sum, and hence, the sum of the boards and bricks is the same in essentia as the house—they are the very same thing. Nevertheless, there can be different “conditions” (status) in which this thing is. When the sum of boards and bricks are arranged in one way, they are in the condition of being a house. When they are arranged in other ways, they are not in this condition. In short, to claim that the house is no thing other than the sum of its parts does not imply that the sum is in the state of being a house when the sum of the house's parts exists.

Abelard's solution, of course, will only work if he can motivate the claim that a thing in a condition or having a condition is not a new thing. And medieval realists went after such reductivist programs in much the same way that some contemporary realists do. Specifically, they often presented truth-maker challenges, or “anti-Razor” arguments (Maurer 1984): If at one time this sum of boards and bricks is not a house and at another time it is a house, then there must be some thing that is absent at the former time and present at the later time.

Abelard's notion of the essentia of a thing is informed by his appreciation of the notion of mereological overlap (see the section on Basic Principles/Other Mereological Concepts, in the entry on mereology). His appreciation of mereological overlap in and of itself is a watershed, since he is one of the first (and perhaps one of the few) medieval philosophers to clearly understand this phenomenon.[6] Abelard's appreciation of the notion of overlap is in evidence in his account of numerical sameness and difference (Theologia Christiana III, § 139 and §148 [1969, 247 and 250–1]; for discussion see Brower 2004, 226–34). According to Abelard, x is the same in essentia as y if and only if every part of x is a part of y and every part of y is a part of x. In other words, x is the same in essentia as y if and only if x and y mereologically coincide. If x is the same in essentia as y, then x is numerically the same as y. However, if x is not the same in essentia as y, it does not follow that x is numerically distinct from y. This is because x and y could overlap—that is, share at least one part—even if they do not coincide.

Abelard's characterization of numerical sameness and difference seems to give us the tools to answer a common medieval puzzle which I will call the Problem of the Many Men. Versions of this problem can be found in a number of medieval works (see, e.g., Abelard Theologia Christiana III, § 153 [1969, 252]; Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus §§ 22–25 [= Cousin 1836, 511–13]; Albert of Saxony Quaestiones in Physicam I, qq. 7–8, and his Sophismata 46, 25va-vb). The puzzle can easily be generated using a crude understanding of numerical sameness. Assume that Socrates' body is perfectly intact: he has all his limbs, and their parts. Now consider every part of Socrates' body except one finger. Call this whole W. W is not numerically the same as Socrates, so it appears that they must be numerically distinct. Socrates' whole body is imbued with the soul of a man. But it also happens that W is imbued with the soul of a man. So, there are now two numerically distinct men where it initially appeared there was one. But it gets worse. Considering the body apart from one finger was only one of an indefinite number of such considerations. And by the same reasoning, these other bracketed wholes composed from Socrates' body are also men. Hence, it is easy to generate an indefinite number of numerically distinct men where commonsense tells us that there is only one.

Abelard, it seems, can easily unravel this puzzle by employing his distinction between difference in essentia and numerical difference. True, there are many overlapping men, each of which is different in essentia from the others. But this does not entail that there are an indefinite number of numerically different men. One might, however, wonder whether Abelard has completely dispelled the hint of paradox generated by the initial puzzle. After all, it would be nice to know which of these overlapping, but non-coincident wholes is Socrates. All that Abelard's theoretical tools allow us to do is to say that while there is this whole which is imbued by Socrates' soul and there is that whole which is imbued by Socrates' soul, these wholes are not numerically many and, thus, there are not numerically many men where intuitively we thought there was only one (see Normore 2006, 749).

Most medieval philosophers tackled the Problem of the Many Men in another manner. Albert of Saxony, for example, resolves the puzzle by claiming that nothing which is a part of something else can be a numerically distinct existing being (Quaes. in Arist. Physicam I q. 8, 131–32; Sophismata 46, 25vb; cf. Fitzgerald 2009). Socrates' body less the finger is not a distinct thing, let alone a man, since it is a part of Socrates. Therefore, there are not many distinct men present where we thought that there was only Socrates.

4.2. Persistence

Medieval philosophers also worry about the identity of objects over time and through change. Medieval examinations of identity over time, or persistence, are often occasioned by reflection on the maximal proposition associated with the Topic from the integral whole, which states:

If the whole is, the part is.

This maximal proposition, however, implies

If the part is not, the whole is not.

But this seems to entail that if Socrates' hand does not exist, Socrates does not exist.

There is an innocent interpretation of this Topical maxim. Recall that “the whole x” can mean the complete x. Accordingly, to say that the whole is destroyed if the part is destroyed, is merely to say that the whole is incomplete or “mutilated” if a part is removed. It might also be the case that “the whole x” merely signifies all the parts of x taken together. On this reading, the maximal proposition would merely imply that, if x does not exist, then the whole consisting of x and some other parts does not exist. And, indeed, Boethius seems to mean only this:

For if a part of the whole perishes, the whole—namely, the [whole] whose one part was destroyed—will not exist. (On Division 879c [Magee 1998, 14]).

Boethius' assertion that the whole consisting of x and all the rest will perish when x perishes leaves it open whether the remaining parts are still, say, Socrates or a house. Naturally, the creative parts had to be present in order to create Socrates or the house. For example, this sum of wood, cement, and nails is the sum of the creative parts of a house. If there had been no nails, wood, or cement, there would have been no house. Still, commonsense tells us that the creative parts need not remain present after the house has been created. Some boards and some nails may be replaced in the house, but this does not compromise the existence of this house.

Despite the appeal of commonsense, there were some medieval philosophers who took the maximal proposition to imply that if Socrates loses a finger, Socrates ceases to exist. Peter Abelard, at least at one point in his career, seriously entertains the radical reading of the maximal proposition (Arlig 2007). And even if Abelard later revised his view (Martin 1998), evidence suggests that Abelard's followers, the so-called Nominales, did wholeheartedly embrace the extreme interpretation of the maximal proposition (see, e.g., Ebbesen 1999, 397). This extreme interpretation is derived from the judgment that each whole is the same thing as a unique set of parts. This house must be composed out of these nails, these boards, and this cement. If I use other nails or other boards, I could make a house, but not this very house. This premise is no doubt controversial, but Abelard has principled reasons for holding it. Abelard believes that the ultimate pieces of the universe are tiny, indivisible bits of matter, souls, and perhaps some forms. The items that we experience are composites of these elements. Each element is self-identical. Composite beings are individuated by the elements that make them up, and in the case of complex, composite beings—such as artifacts and substances—by the arrangement that these bits have. Given such a universe, it is quite plausible to assume that the identity of a composite item is solely determined by its parts. It would then easily follow that the removal or addition of a composing element entails that the new whole is not identical to the old whole. Another whole similar to the original might exist after the mereological change take place, but strictly speaking the two wholes are not identical.

Most medieval philosophers are not as extreme as Abelard or the Nominales, and yet, interestingly, it generally does not occur to them to resort to the innocent interpretation of the maximal proposition considered above. Rather, they draw a distinction between those parts that are required to keep the whole intact and those parts that can be lost without compromising the integrity of the whole. The basic idea is this: If we were to amputate Socrates' right hand, Socrates would not cease to exist. He would merely lack a hand. Still, there are some parts that would, upon removal, bring about the annihilation of Socrates. The parts required to keep a whole intact are called “principal”. Ones that could be lost without compromising the integrity of the whole were called “secondary” parts (Anonymmous Introductiones maiores Montane 71va-72rb; Albertus Magnus Commentarii in De div. tract. 2, ch. 5 [1913, 33–4]; Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 6.4.4). Examples of principal parts would be the foundation of the house, the heart of a cat, and the brain of Socrates. Examples of secondary parts are a brick in the house, a strand of hair belonging to the cat, and a fingernail of Socrates.

In the Twelfth century there was a heated debate about how to determine whether this or that part is principal (see Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus §§ 6-20 [= Cousin 1836, 507–10]), for as Abelard pointed out the following account is insufficient:

x is a principal part of y if and only if the removal of x entails the destruction of y.

Abelard reminds his audience that even he can accept this account of principal parts; the only difference is that on his account every part is a principal part (Dialectica 549–52). The best answer that twelfth-century thinkers come up with is that a principal part of x is that which, when removed, compromises the form of x (Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus §§ 23–6 [= Cousin 1836, 511–12].

Later medieval philosophers generally accepted this twelfth-century answer and they usually understood the maximal proposition pertaining to the integral whole to be restricted to principal parts. Hence, they find persistence far from troubling. The form is the metaphysical glue that holds an object together as it changes material components. For example, we have already seen that Burley draws a distinction between the whole secundum formam and the material whole (section 3.1). The whole considered formally persists so long as the form persists. The whole considered materially is the only whole compromised by changes in material parts (De toto et parte, 301). Most commonsense objects are identified with a whole considered with respect to form, and so there would be no reason to think that these things are substantially compromised by material changes.

This basic Aristotelian picture is complicated (if not outright altered) by several fourteenth-century authors, including Ockham and Buridan.[7] We will consider Buridan's theory of identity over time and change (Quaestiones super De generatione et corruptione 1.13; Quaestiones in Physicam 1.10). According to Buridan, there are three senses of numerical sameness: (1) x is “totally” the same in number as y, (2) x is “partially” the same in number as y, and (3) x is numerically the same as y in a “less proper” way. Something is totally the same in number if all its parts remain the same and it neither acquires nor loses any parts. In this strictest of senses, no corruptible thing whatsoever persists through mereological change. Something is partially the same in number if its “most principal part” remains numerically the same. This is the sense that allows us to claim that Socrates is numerically the same man now as that man ten years ago. In particular, it is Socrates' intellective soul which is the principal part and guarantor of persistence through change. Finally, something is less properly the same in number if there is merely a continuous succession of beings that maintain a similar shape, disposition, and form. This less proper mode of numerical sameness allows us to claim that the Nile River here today is numerically the same river as the Nile back in Herodotus' time. While it is probably not a surprise to learn that rivers are the same in number only in a less proper sense, it is striking that Buridan goes on to assert that plants and non-rational animals too can only be numerically the same in this less proper sense (Quaestiones super De gen. 1.13 [2010, 114–15]). Buridan's reason for thinking this is that non-rational creatures do not have the sort of soul that can act as a guarantor of less proper identity; rather, non-rational souls are themselves altered when the material parts are altered. Thus, over the span of a normal lifetime, neither the matter nor the form of a horse or an orchid remains numerically the same in anything other than a less proper sense.

On the one hand, Buridan's account might be in conflict with orthodox Aristotelian doctrine, for he appears to be committed to the view that the addition or subtraction of parts can bring about substantial change. In contrast to a more orthodox Aristotelian, who thinks that the same horse persists through changes, Buridan seems to be claiming that strictly speaking we do not have one horse, but rather a succession of horses unified by three facts: these successive beings have some of the same parts, this line of succession is continuous, and each member in the line of succession is a horse.

On the other hand, we should not read more into Buridan's account than is actually there. Buridan is not, for example, distinguishing between a strict, philosophical sense of identity and a loose, or vulgar, sense of identity. All three of his senses of numerical sameness are meant to be philosophically respectable. It should be recalled that in 1277 a list of condemned propositions was circulated at the University of Paris. One of these forbidden propositions was the assertion that “a man through nourishment can become someone else, both numerically and individually” (Hissette 1977, prop. 87). Buridan, like all teachers at the University, would not want to be seen as endorsing a forbidden proposition. In his questions on the Physics, Buridan announces that by distinguishing these three senses of numerical sameness we can easily answer the question “whether Socrates is today the same thing that he was yesterday”. If the only legitimate sense of numerical sameness were the “total” sense, then we would have to assert the forbidden proposition. Fortunately, there are other senses in which something can be numerically the same as something else.

Some modern readers might be disappointed that Buridan did not conclude that there really is only one sense of numerical sameness and that sense is the strict, total sense. (After all, this seems to be the sense that has the best chance of conforming to Leibniz's Laws for identity.) But perhaps the lesson to take away should instead be this: Buridan has shown us that there are legitimate senses of being numerically the same which nevertheless allow that some things will change their parts (and even the particular instances of their forms).

5. Concluding remarks

Medieval philosophers study a variety of wholes and parts, and they often do so with a remarkable degree of sophistication. To be sure, some aspects of medieval mereology are idiosyncratic, but many of the puzzles that medieval philosophers wrestle with are recognizably perennial. Medieval philosophers are particularly attuned to the relationship between mereology and various problems in metaphysics, and many of their solutions to puzzles of identity and survival are embraced by philosophers in other periods. Even the idiosyncratic aspects of medieval mereology reveal a sophisticated appreciation of three fundamental questions in mereology, namely, what items are wholes, what items are parts, and under what conditions is one item a part of another item. This survey can only hint at the richness of medieval mereology. In part, this is due to the overwhelming number of medieval authors who say something or other, somewhere or other, about parts and wholes. But it is also due to the fact that there are still more texts to be unearthed, properly edited, and studied with care. Based on what we have already discovered, we should be confident that we will find many more interesting reflections on parts and wholes and that we will uncover further connections between medieval mereology and more recent theories of parts and wholes.


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Abelard [Abailard], Peter | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | Buridan, John [Jean] | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | identity | identity: over time | medieval philosophy | mereology