Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Deontic Logic

A Puzzle Surrounding Kant's Law[1]


(1) I'm obligated to pay you back $10 tonight.
(2) I can't pay you back $10 tonight (e.g., I just gambled away my last dime).

Since this puzzle typically involves some notion of possibility, let us represent the above sentences in KTd, which includes SDL, but also has a possibility operator:

(1′) OBp
(2′) ~◊p

(1) and (2) appear to be consistent. It seems to be a sad fact that often, people are unable to fulfill their financial obligations, just as it seems to be a truism that financial obligations are obligations. But in KTd, it is a theorem that OBp → ◊p. So we derive a contradiction from this symbolization and the assumption that (1′) and (2′) are true.

A variant example is:

(1) I owe you ten dollars, but I can't pay you back.
(2) I'm obligated to pay you ten dollars, but I can't.

(2) seems to follow from (1), and (1) hardly seems contradictory, since owing money clearly does not entail being able to pay the money owed. Thomason 1981b suggests a distinction between deliberative contexts of evaluation and judgmental contexts, where in the latter context evaluations such as (1) above need not satisfy Kant's law since, roughly, we go back in time and evaluate the present in terms of where things would now be relative to optimal past options that were accessible but no longer are.

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