Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Aristotle's Political Theory

Characteristics and Problems of Aristotle's Politics

The work which has come down to us under the title POLITIKA appears to be less an integrated treatise than a loosely related collection of essays or lectures on various topics in political philosophy, which may have been compiled by a later editor rather than by Aristotle. The following topics are discussed in the eight books:

I Naturalness of the city-state and of the household

II Critique of ostensibly best constitutions

III General theory of constitutions

IV Inferior constitutions

V Preservation and destruction of constitutions

VI Further discussion of democracy and oligarchy

VII–VIII Unfinished outline of the best constitution

This ordering of the books reflects, very roughly, the program for the study of constitutions which concludes the Nicomachean Ethics:

First, then, if any particular point has been treated well by those who have gone before us, we must try to review it; then from the constitutions that have been collected we must try to see what it is that preserves and destroys each of the constitutions, and for what reasons some city-states are well governed and others the reverse. For when these things have been examined, we will perhaps better understand what sort of constitution is best, and how each is structured, and which laws and customs it uses. Let us then begin our discussion. [X.9.1181b15–23]

However, scholars have raised problems with the Politics as we have it. The first concerns the intended order of its eight books. Some (including W. L. Newman) have questioned the traditional ordering, arguing that the discussion of the best constitution (books VII–VIII) should follow directly after book III. Indeed, book III concludes with a transition to a discussion of the best constitution (although this may be due to a later editor). However, cross-references between various passages of the Politics indicate that books IV–V–VI form a connected series, as do books VII–VIII, but these series do not refer to each other. However, both series refer back to book III which in turn refers to book I. Moreover, book II refers back to book I and refers forward to both series. With some oversimplification, then, the Politics is comparable to a tree trunk supporting two separate branches: the root system is I, the trunk is II–III, and the branches are IV–V–VI and VII–VIII. (The summary at the end of Nicomachean Ethics X.9 describes only the visible part of the tree.)

The second problem concerns the order in which the books were actually written. If they were composed at very different dates, they might represent discordant stages in the development of Aristotle's political philosophy. For example, Werner Jaeger argued that books VII–VIII contain a youthful utopianism, motivating Aristotle to emulate his teacher Plato in erecting “an ideal state by logical construction.” In contrast, books IV–VI are based on “sober empirical study.” Other scholars have seen a more pragmatic, even Machiavellian approach to politics in books IV–VI. A difficulty for this interpretation is that in book IV Aristotle regards the business of constructing ideal constitutions as perfectly compatible with that of addressing actual political problems. Although much ink has been spilled since Jaeger attempted to discern different chronological strata in the Politics, it has resulted in no clear scholarly consensus. Because there is no explicit evidence of the dates at which the various books of the Politics were written, argument has turned on alleged discrepancies between different passages.

This leads to the third problem, whether there are major inconsistencies of doctrine or method in the Politics. For example, Aristotle's account of the best constitution assumes his theory of justice, a moral standard which cannot be met by the actual political systems (democracies and oligarchies) of his own day. He does discuss practical political reforms in books IV–VI but more in terms of stability than justice. Some commentators view books IV–VI as a radical departure from the political philosophy of the other books, while others find a great deal of coherence among the books. Resolution of this problem requires careful study of the Politics as a whole.

Return to Aristotle's Politics [Section 1]
Return to Aristotle's Politics [Section 4]