Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Aristotle's Natural Philosophy

1. Note, however, that the second half of Physics is less integrated than the first: it contains the apparently self-standing treatment of the unmoved mover and of the eternity of motion in bk. 8. Note, furthermore, that Aristotle, at Physics 8.5, 257a34f refers to a proof in bk. 6 as one from the general discussion of nature, i.e. as to something which featured in a different work.

Moreover, the way bk. 7 was joined to these discussions, is somewhat problematic: Aristotle's disciple, Eudemus, when putting together his own Physics, apparently did not discuss the material in bk. 7, although he followed the discussion of both Aristotelian inquiries, as Simplicius attests. Furthermore, unlike the other books, part of bk. 7 is transmitted in two significantly different versions.

We should note nevertheless that even if only later editors joined the two discussions into the single work known to us as the Physics, these later editors could rely on the example of Eudemus’ Physics.

2. De caelo contains two inquiries: the first two books discuss the problems of nature in the celestial domain, bks. 3 and 4 contain a discussion about the four sublunary elements.

3. Aitia and aition are distinguished by e.g. Chrysippus: the aition is a concrete object bearing causal responsibility, whereas the aitia is the account about the causal role of this cause. This distinction of concrete efficacy, and the account about this efficacy is not present in Aristotle. See the entry Aristotle on causality.

4. To this extent the form is at the same time a final cause for the potentialities which are present in order to make its emergence possible. This can justify, then, Aristotle's description in Physics 1.9 of form as an object of striving and matter as the entity which in so far as it is matter strives after form.

5. This is no mysterious pull, though, on the part of these final causes. Rather, final causes can be operative only in the context of conscious, or quasi-conscious aspirations (human or animal chases food, craftsman fashions artifact with an eye to its function as goal), and in goal-directed natural processes.

6. See e.g. De anima (On the Soul) 2.4, 415b8-28, where after the identification of the soul as substance (i.e. as form), and as moving cause, the passage specifies a meaning in which the soul is also a final cause as beneficiary (hôi) of the processes in the living being. The converse of the assertion that natures are goals as beneficiaries is also often asserted by Aristotle as a first assumption of natural science. Accordingly, nature is able to produce what is best for a particular kind, under the constraints of the given circumstances and the prevailing preconditions. In short, nature does everything best (see e.g. De incessu animalium [On the Progression of Animals] 2, 704b14-18, cf. Physics 2.7, 198b8-9). Clearly, this assertion presupposes that nature features here as a (goal-directed) efficient cause, otherwise it would not make sense that nature does anything.

7. This is so already at the end of the Categories, where motion features as one of the postpraedicamenta, and the kinds of motion—generation, perishing, growth, decay, alteration and locomotion—are articulated according to the categorical status of entities acquired (and replaced) through the motion.

8. Physics 5.1, 225b5-9. Position and possession (items (9) and (10) of the list of categories in the Categories) do not feature on this list. Moreover, time is also missing in the parellel version of the passage in Metaphysics bk. 11, in the text as read by Simplicius, and in some manuscripts.

9. Aristotle at some places distinguishes change (metabolê) and motion (kinêsis) and claims that changes in substance—generations and perishings—are not motions. This leads then at these places to a three-element list of motions. For the considerations leading to the exclusion of change in substance from the other motions see Physics 5.1-2, with the concluding doctrinal statement at 5.2, 226a23-25. Throughout this article I follow Aristotle's less rigorous terminology, where change and motion are not distinguished.

10. This does not mean that the inclusion of motions in the categories of action and passion would be necessarily wrong-headed. Something at least analogous to the categorical bifurcation of action and passion is strongly suggested by a remark of Aristotle in the course of the discussion whether effecting change and undergoing change have identical or different actualities. There Aristotle says that “it is unreasonable that two entities which are different in kind should have the same actuality” (Physics 3.3, 202a36-b2). This difference in kind can most naturally be taken as referring to some sort of difference, like the one mentioned about the different kinds of motions and of being in Physics 3.1 201a8-9, with the crucial difference that there the relevant categories are substance, quality, quantity and place, whereas here they are apparently action and passion. (See also note 12 below.)

11. Physics 5.2, 225b11-13. The claim, then, can be reformulated so that in all cases where there is a change in relation, some non-relational change has to take place in some of the entities which stand in relation to each other, hence there cannot be a strictly and exclusively relational component which solely by changing in and of itself would bring about relational change. Note that this thesis about relational change leaves relation as a category in a peculiar position: it turns out to be a dependent but ineliminable type of entity. It is dependent, as any predication in the category of relation presupposes corresponding predications in non-relational categories, but it nevertheless remains ineliminable: any analysis of a relation needs to mention alongside the more fundamental categorical items some relational entity as well.

12. Physics 5.2 submits at 225b13-16 that there is no motion of the agent and of the passive counterpart. The enumeration in the second half of this sentence—“neither is there motion of the moved and of the mover, because there is no motion of motion, or generation of generation, or change of change” shows that motions are linked to actions and passions in an intimate way.

13. Note that this argumentation does not address the category of time as a domain of change. This is so either because the list of relevant categories did not contain time in the first place, or because even though it was present at that point, claims for its housing change were dropped without explicit argumentation. Either way, this would mean that time has been tacitly discarded from the list of relevant categories at some stage by Aristotle. One obvious consideration could be the fact that time is involved in all the possible forms of motion (see e.g. Physics 5.4, 227b24-26 or 8.8, 262a2-5), so differences in time cannot be the distinguishing feature of a specific form of motion, the putative motion in time.

14. Nevertherless, by selecting between different types of actualisations, the restriction excludes some potentialities which do not have actualities in so far as they are potential. Metaphysics 9.6, 1048b18-35 contrasts (incomplete) motions and (complete) actualities, and asserts that the latter are realised in a non-processual manner. Potentialities corresponding to this latter type of actuality, then, cannot be actualised in so far as they are potential, they have only complete actualisations.

15. See e.g. Aristotle's elucidation of the definition of motion at Physics 3.2, 201a27-29, where the actuality of a potentiality in so far as it is itself (hêi auto) is contrasted to its actuality in so far as it is capable of undergoing motion (hêi kinêton).

16. Cf. the concept of possible (endechomenon, occasionally also dunaton) Aristotle commonly uses in his modal logic in the Prior Analytics. What is necessary, as Aristotle stresses there, can be said to be possible only in an equivocal sense (Prior Analytics 1.13, 32a18-21, cf. 1.3, 25a37-39). This means that in its canonical use the possible excludes necessity, although it does not exclude that the possible state of affairs is in fact the case (that the predicate holds—huparchei—of the subject of the proposition). Accordingly, use of an (as it were mere) potentiality (dunamis) in the definition of motion, which disappears once the corresponding property is actualised, should be viewed as introducing a further restriction along the same lines as the stipulations in the Prior Analytics about the possible. (Note, furthermore, that the claim would not need this further stipulation, and indeed it would have been trivially true if Aristotle had not spoken here about capacities for being in some particular state, but had referred to the special capacities for undergoing change, and not the ones for possessing attributes which characterize a state, reached as the end result of a change. After the completion of a change the capacity to undergo that very change will not be extant any longer: once someone has reached Athens she does not any longer possess the capacity to get there. That capacity can only be regained, upon leaving that location.)

17. Although this threefold scheme has obvious links to the hylomorphic analysis of entities into their matter and form, it is not identical with it for two main reasons. (1) What is identified in processes other than generation as form is not the form of the entity in the terms of a hylomorphic analysis, but a property of this entity. (2) Even in cases of generation, where the form acquired is the form of the entity, what Aristotle specifies as the substrate of the generation need not be the matter of the emerging entity: the matter of the entity can be coordinate with the form to the extent that that matter is also generated from the preexistent material during the process of generation. E.g. the material component in the generation of plants is the seed, but this and the additional nutrient is processed in the course of generation completely into the tissues forming the organs of the emerging plant. In a hylomorphic analysis the matter of the emerging plant is these tissues and organs, but they cannot precede the living organism, since they cannot exist outside the plant.

18. Cf., further, the definition of effecting motion, which cannot avoid referring to the entity being moved: “for the actuality in relation to it [to the movable entity], in so far as it is such [i.e. movable] is the same as effecting motion” (Physics 3.2 202a5-6).

19. This consequence can be mitigated by a mapping of physiological states onto psychological ones. In this case a physical property of the sleeping pill will produce a similar physical property in the body of the patient taking the pill, and the process then will be redescribable by the mapping of physiological to psychological states as a process causing the psychological state.

20. Note that Aristotle repeatedly contends that Plato's Forms are causally idle. Moreover a Platonic Form—e.g., knowledge itself, or motion—is, as Aristotle puts it, at most a potentiality when compared to a substance exercising the corresponding potentiality—e.g. a knowing thing, or a thing in motion (Metaphysics 9.8, 1050b34-1051a2).

21. In the case of the generation of elements, Aristotle describes their generator as “that which produces weight,” or “that which produces lightness”. But elements are also exhaustively characterised by the pair of elemental properties hot-cold and dry-moist, and these are also causally operative in processes of assimilation, when an elemental mass transforms another element in its vicinity.

22. Cf., furthermore, the case of perception, which is described in terms of an external causally efficacious agent, the object of perception, and as an internal switch from first to second actuality. The fact that perception is accounted for through the combination of these two different explanatory frameworks can be meant to capture its intentional nature, its inherent activity, even though it is a passive process, receptive of the form of the object of perception.

23. For a related fundamental difference between locomotion and the other changes see Physics 8.7, 261a19-23 (cf. furthermore Metaphysics 9.8, 1050b19-30).

24. Note, furthermore, that when in De generatione et corruptione 1.5 Aristotle gives a more thorough description of what happens in quantitative change, the process is not described in terms of the operation of a synonymous cause: it is not large objects which confer a large extension on an entity that was initially small. Quantitative change remains describable in terms of assimilation (or discrimination) of entities, but these processes will be substantial changes as far as the assimilated or dissimilated and segregated entities in the process are concerned (see esp. De generatione et corruptione 1.5, 322a11-13, where the causally efficacious entity in the growth of flesh is located in the growing entity itself, and it produces flesh in actuality out of the nutriment, which is flesh in potentiality).

25. Cf. Metaphysics 12.3, 1070a4-5, announcing the principle of synonymy about substantial items only, and De generatione et corruptione 1.5, 320b17-21, where the principle of causal synonymy is relaxed to the almost non-committal requirement that in some cases it is an entity in actuality of the same sort or of the same kind as the effect which is causally efficacious, whereas in other cases the cause is an actuality, but not an entity of the same kind as the effect. Aristotle's example for the latter is the process effecting rigidity: this does not require a cause which would be rigid in actuality. (Note that the example is removed from the text by Joachim. The text without the example, then, can also be understood as introducing a distinction of causal types—one, entities of the same kind as their effects, the other the causally salient factors or characteristics of such causes, e.g. their forms. These are not the same kind of entities as their effects, but they are actualities nevertheless, so Alan Code in de Haas – Mansfeld, p. 178.)

26. Moreover, another cluster of cases where form is transmitted—the transmission of sensible form through the medium in the process of perception—may also conform to this pattern. Color effects a change in (“moves”) the transparent medium, and in turn the medium effects a change in the sense-organ. As a result of this process the form of the object of sensation (without its matter) is transmitted to the sense. Note, however, that this account does not necessarily require that the perceptible form needs to be present in the medium in the same way as it is present in the object of sense or in the sense-organ (the relationship between these latter two modes of the existence of the perceptible form is a further issue of contention, see the entry on Aristotle: Psychology).

27. Aristotle can refer to the causally operative form in the mind of the craftsman as identical to the form of the emerging artificial object, but this is clearly a partial description only (Metaphysics 7.7, 1032b11-14, for a restricted, more circumspect identification of form and craft see Metaphysics 12.4, 1070b33 and Metaphysics 12.10, 1075b10): the form of the object in the craftsman's mind needs to include all the relevant information of the rules of the trade how to effect this particular form in the matter, it has to be embedded in (a workable portion of) the craft itself (see Physics 2.7, 193b12-17 for the difference of the forms of the cause and of the effect in artificial change).

28. As a rule, this contact is mutual, and hence the causal interaction goes both ways: the entity effecting change is in its turn exposed to the influence of the moved entity, it is being moved by it, albeit in another respect (Physics 3.2, 202a5-9). This requirement of mutual contact between mover and moved holds for most cases of locomotion, hence the need for the complicated machinery in the explanation of projectile motion in Physics 8.10. It can be relaxed in two ways: either by the introduction of intermediaries (the medium in the case of perception, the pockets of air propelling the projectile on when it is no longer in contact with the original source of motion, and the tools in the hands of the craftsman), or it can even be downgraded into a one-directional contact, as the one between the unmoved movers and the objects moved by them.

29. Generation involves the other kinds of change according to Metaphysics 9.1, 1042b3-5. Aristotle stresses (Physics 8.7, 260b30-261a7) that these considerations are not refuted by the fact that in the individual history of each entity generation necessarily precedes any locomotion performed by the entity, or furthermore by the fact that living beings undergo qualitative and quantitative changes before they could possess their specific form of locomotion. What comes in the individual history last can be the most fundamental form of change, similarly to the claim that the fully developed living being in actuality is causally prior to all the imperfect stages in the actual generation of the member of a species.

30. For this Aristotle relies on a principle of modal plenitude: whatever is always possible, needs to be actualised at one point of the history of the world. (See also the article Aristotle: Logic.) This principle is discussed in detail in De caelo 1.12, at the end of a book arguing for the thesis that the eternal heavens need to be composed of a special celestial stuff, which is exempt from coming to be, perishing or change, and performs the celestial revolutions as its natural motion. See further Metaphysics 9.4.

31. For the discussion of the introduction of unmoved movers see the next Section. In Metaphysics 12.8, Aristotle opts for both the uniqueness and the plurality of the unmoved celestial movers. Each celestial sphere possesses the unmoved mover of its own—presumably as the object of its striving, see Metaphysics 12.6—whereas the mover of the outermost celestial sphere, which carries with its diurnal rotation the fixed stars, being the first of the series of unmoved movers also guarantees the unity and uniqueness of the universe.

32. The serial infinity in the case of humans is asserted at Physics 3.6, 206a25-27, alongside with the serial infinity of time or of successive divisions of magnitudes.

33. De caelo 2.7, 289a19-35, and recall the special case of the physician's rub causing heat in the body of the patient in Metaphysics 7.9, which will turn out to be analoguous to the most fundamental interaction between the celestial and the sublunary domains.

34. See Metaphysics 12.5, 1071a14-17, where Aristotle also mentions that these latter moving causes are not instances of the same form as their effects, i.e. the principle of causational synonymy does not hold in their case. For an almost crypticly shorthand form of the same example see Physics 2.2, 194b13.

35. Commentators of late antiquity will assert that the uppermost sublunary region, composed of a material analogous to fire, hence already at its natural place, performs its circular motion under the influence of the celestial spheres neither by force nor according to its nature, and they label such motions as ones superadded to nature (huper phusin). Note, moreover, that Aristotle's account of heavenly motions also requires a class of locomotions of such an intermediate status, because he holds both that there is no forced motion in the celestial domain, and at the same time that planetary motions are the result of the composition of the rotations of several different spheres, each of these spheres performing a component of these motions as its own, whereas the other component is as it were superadded to it (De caelo 2.12, 293a9-11, cf. Metaphysics 12.6, 1072a10-18).

36. Note that even without the principle that natural and forced motions come in pairs of contraries Aristotle could establish the existence of an eternal celestial element, which performs the eternal heavenly revolutions as its natural motions (De caelo 1.2, 269b2-12, and see 1.3, 270b11-16 and b4-11). Such an eternal element would be removed from the sublunary processes of changes, and by a principle of modal plenitude announced in De caelo 1.12, all the distinguishing properties of the celestial element could be established. Nevertheless Aristotle would not be entitled to run the argument in the other direction and claim that it is the special, contrary-less status of circular motion which exempts from all other changes the element performing the revolutions as its natural motion.

37. The centrality of what is natural can be further stressed by two considerations: in the case of nested natures the natural tendencies of a component can be overruled by the natural motions of the complex entity, or on occasion these tendencies of the embedded nature may gain the upper hand (Physics 8.4, 254b17-24). In a similar manner deviations from the natural course of events—say, the generation of monstrosities—also have natural causes, or as On the generation of animals 4.4, 770b15 puts it “even what is contrary to nature is in some way according to nature” (cf. Descartes’ considerations about “defective natures” in his Sixth Meditation, p. 84f. Adam-Tannery).

38. See the previous Section for the exposition what the finitude of these causal chains amounts to, and how it is compatible with the existence of infinite causal chains.

39. Why unmoved? Causal chains can terminate in unmoved movers or in self-movers. If the celestial spheres are not self-movers, they might still be moved by moved movers. But then at an ultimate remove their movers will have to be self-movers, or be moved by unmoved movers, otherwise the cosmos will depend on an infinite chain of causes.

40. Accordingly, Physics 8.6, 259b20-24 asserts that the prime mover has to be unmoved both in itself and also accidentally, contrasting it thereby to the souls of sublunary living beings. Even though these souls are unmoved movers, nevertheless they move themselves in an accidental manner through the motion they induce in the living body.

41. The word used here for power is dunamis, but as the unmoved mover is nothing but actuality it cannot refer to an intrinsic infinite potentiality of the mover.

42. Note the way Theophrastus Metaphysics 8-9, 5a28-5b10 uses the fact that the mover of the celestial revolutions is an object of striving as a basis for a clear distinction between the transcendental mover and the souls of the celestial bodies, which strive after this entity.