Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Sep 8, 2003; substantive revision Thu Mar 17, 2011

Zombies in philosophy are imaginary creatures used to illuminate problems about consciousness and its relation to the physical world. Unlike those in films or witchraft, they are exactly like us in all physical respects but without conscious experiences: by definition there is ‘nothing it is like’ to be a zombie. Yet zombies behave just like us, and some even spend a lot of time discussing consciousness.

Few people think zombies actually exist. But many hold they are at least conceivable, and some that they are possible. It is argued that if zombies are so much as a bare possibility, then physicalism is false and some kind of dualism is true. For many philosophers that is the chief importance of the zombie idea. But the idea is also of interest for its presuppositions about the nature of consciousness and how the physical and the phenomenal are related. Use of the zombie idea against physicalism also raises more general questions about relations between imaginability, conceivability, and possibility. Finally, zombies raise epistemological difficulties: they reinstate the ‘other minds’ problem.

1. The idea of zombies

Descartes held that non-human animals are automata: their behavior is wholly explicable in terms of physical mechanisms. He explored the idea of a machine which looked and behaved like a human being. Knowing only seventeenth century technology, he thought two things would unmask such a machine: it could not use language creatively, and it could not produce appropriate non-verbal behavior in arbitrarily various situations (Discourse V). For him, therefore, no machine could behave like a human being. He concluded that explaining distinctively human behavior required something beyond the physical: an immaterial mind, interacting with processes in the brain and the rest of the body. (He had a priori arguments for the same conclusion, one of which foreshadows the ‘conceivability argument’ discussed below.) If he is right, there could not be a world physically like the actual world but lacking such minds: human bodies would not work properly. If we suddenly lost our minds our bodies might continue to run on for a while: our hearts might continue to beat, we might breathe while asleep and digest food; we might even walk or sing in a mindless sort of way (so he implies in his Reply to Objections IV). But without the contribution made by minds, behavior could not show characteristically human features. So although Descartes did everything short of spelling out the idea of zombies, the question of their possibility did not arise for him. The nearest thing was automata whose behavior was easily recognizable as not fully human.

In the nineteenth century scientists began to think that physics was capable of explaining all physical events that were explicable at all. It seemed that every physical effect has a physical cause: that the physical world is ‘closed under causation’. The developing science of neurophysiology was set to extend such explanations to human behavior. But if human behavior is explicable physically, how does consciousness fit into the story? One response — physicalism (or materialism) — is to insist that it is just a matter of physical processes. However, the phenomena of consciousness are hard to account for in those terms, and some thinkers concluded that nonphysical items must be involved. Given the causal closure of the physical, they were also forced to conclude that consciousness has no effects on the physical world. On this view human beings are ‘conscious automata’, as T. H. Huxley put it: all physical events, human behavior included, are explicable in terms of physical processes; and the phenomena of consciousness are causally inert by-products (see James 1890, Chapter 5). It eventually became clear that this view entailed there could be purely physical organisms exactly like us except for lacking consciousness. G. F. Stout (1931) argued that if epiphenomenalism (the more familiar name for the ‘conscious automaton’ theory) is right,

it ought to be quite credible that the constitution and course of nature would be otherwise just the same as it is if there were not and never had been any experiencing individuals. Human bodies would still have gone through the motions of making and using bridges, telephones and telegraphs, of writing and reading books, of speaking in Parliament, of arguing about materialism, and so on. There can be no doubt that this is prima facie incredible to Common Sense (138f.).

What Stout describes in this passage and finds prima facie incredible is a zombie world: an entire world whose physical processes are closed under causation (as the epiphenomenalists he was attacking held) and exactly duplicate those in the actual world, but where there are no conscious experiences.

Similar ideas were current in discussions of physicalism in the 1970s. As a counterexample to the psychophysical identity theory there was an ‘imitation man’, whose ‘brain-states exactly paralleled ours in their physico-chemical properties’ but who felt no pains and saw no colors (Campbell 1970). It was claimed that zombies are a counterexample to physicalism in general, and arguments were devised to back up the intuition that they are possible (Kirk 1974a, 1974b). Other kinds of systems were envisaged which behaved like normal human beings, or were even functionally like human beings, but lacked the ‘qualia’ we have (Block 1980a, 1980b, 1981; Shoemaker 1975, 1981). (Qualia are those properties of experiences or of whole persons by which we are able to classify experiences according to ‘what they are like’ — what it is like to smell roasting coffee beans, for example. Even physicalists can consistently use this expression, although unlike dualists they take qualia to be physical. The most systematic use of the zombie idea against physicalism is by David Chalmers (1996), some of whose contributions to the debate will be discussed below.

If zombies are to be counterexamples to physicalism, it is not enough for them to be behaviorally and functionally like normal human beings: physicalists can accept that merely behavioral or functional duplicates of ourselves might lack qualia. Zombies must be like normal human beings in all physical respects, with the physical properties that physicalists suppose we have. (For the use of a different kind of zombies in epistemology, see Lyons 2009.) This requires them to be subject to the causal closure of the physical, which is why their supposed lack of consciousness is a challenge to physicalism. If, instead, their behavior could not be explained physically, physicalists would point out that in that case we have no reason to bother with the idea: there is plenty of evidence that our movements actually are explicable in physical terms, as the original epiphenomenalists realized (see e.g. Papineau 2002).

The usual assumption is that none of us is actually a zombie, and that zombies cannot exist in our world. The central question, however, is not whether zombies can exist in our world, but whether they, or a whole zombie world (which is sometimes a more appropriate idea to work with), are possible in some broader sense.

2. Zombies and physicalism

A good way to make the apparent threat to physicalism clear is by adapting a thought of Saul Kripke's (1972/80, pp. 153f.). Imagine God creating the world and deciding to bring into existence the whole of the physical universe according to a full specification P in purely physical terms. P describes such things as the distribution and states of elementary particles throughout space and time, together with the laws governing their behavior. Now, having created a purely physical universe according to this specification, did God have to do something further in order to provide for consciousness? Answering yes to this question implies there is more to consciousness than the purely physical facts can supply. If nothing else, it implies that consciousness requires nonphysical properties in the strong sense that such properties would not exist in a purely physical world: it would be a zombie world. Physicalists, on the other hand, are committed to answering no to the question. They have to say that by fixing the purely physical facts in accordance with P, God thereby fixed all the mental facts about the organisms whose existence is provided for by P, including facts about people's thoughts, feelings, emotions, and experiences.

For physicalists are committed to the view that the physical world (assumed here to be specified by P) is all there is. If they are right, then other true factual statements are alternative ways of talking about that same world: redescriptions of it. To show that zombies are possible after all would therefore, it seems, be to show that mental truths are not redescriptions of the physical facts, and physicalism is false.

Unfortunately the vocabulary of possibility and necessity is slippery. When Kripke (1972/80) writes of ‘logical’ and ‘metaphysical’ possibility he seems to use those words interchangeably (Yablo 1999, p. 457n.), and some use‘logical’ where others prefer ‘conceptual’ (Chalmers 1999. p. 477); compare Latham 2000, pp. 72f.). In what follows these adjectives will be avoided except in quotations: when ‘possible’ is used without qualification it is to be taken to mean just that the worlds, situations or states of affairs in question involve no contradiction, no matter how indirectly. This use has the advantage that it makes the metaphor of God's creation very apt: God is supposed to be able to do anything short of what involves a contradiction. It also suggests one reasonably clear sense for the word ‘supervenience’: we can say that if a contradiction would be involved in the idea of a zombie world, then in that sense consciousness ‘logically supervenes’ on the physical facts. So the last paragraph supports the view that if a zombie world is possible, consciousness does not in that sense logically supervene on the physical facts, and physicalism is false. If that view is correct, therefore, to prove that a zombie world is possible would be to disprove physicalism.

Not everyone agrees that physicalism entails the impossibility of zombies. One suggestion is that if a slightly weaker kind of supervenience is accepted, then physicalists can concede there are possible worlds which are exact duplicates of our world in all purely physical respects, but where the physical properties which give rise to consciousness in our world are prevented from doing so: there are items in those worlds which ‘block’ consciousness. In that case physicalists can consistently allow that zombie worlds are possible (Leuenberger 2008. On such ‘blockers’ see Hawthorne 2002b, Chalmers 2010, pp. 163–165). However, this approach is obviously inconsistent with maintaining that conscious states are either identical with or constituted by physical or functional states, so it is not clear that physicalists can consistently allow the possibility of consciousness-blockers.

3. The conceivability argument for the possibility of zombies

The simplest version of the conceivability argument for the possibility of zombies goes:

  1. Zombies are conceivable.
  2. Whatever is conceivable is possible.
  3. Therefore zombies are possible.

(Kripke used a similar argument in his 1972. For versions of it see Chalmers 1996, pp. 93–171; 2010, pp. 141–205; Levine 2001; Nagel 1974; Stoljar 2001.) Clearly the argument is valid. However, both its premisses are problematic. They are unclear as stated, and controversial even when clarified. A key question is how we should understand ‘conceivable’ in this context.

Many philosophers are willing to concede that zombies are conceivable in some sense (e.g. Hill 1997; Hill and McLaughlin 1999; Loar 1999; Yablo 1999). However, that sense is sometimes quite broad. For example, a claim that ‘there are no substantive a priori ties between the concept of pain and the concept of C-fiber stimulation’ has been backed up by the point that ‘it is in principle possible to master either of these concepts fully without having mastered the other’ (Hill 1997, 76). By that standard, though, it would be conceivable that the ratio of a circle's circumference to its diameter should be a rational number, when it isn't. If conceivability in that sense entailed possibility, it would be both possible and impossible for that ratio to be rational; which would make conceivability in that sense useless for the purposes of the conceivability argument. So understood, premiss (1) of the argument would be easy to swallow; but premiss (2) would have to be rejected. Evidently, the lower the threshold for conceivability, the easier it is to accept (1) — but the harder it is to accept (2). So the kind of conceivability invoked in premisses (1) and (2) needs to be strongly constrained.

For our purposes we can take it that the relevant notion is ‘ideal conceivability, or conceivability on ideal rational reflection’ (Chalmers 1999, 477; see also his 2002, 2010). Roughly, the idea is that the situation in question must be imagined in such a way that arbitrary details can be filled in without any contradiction revealing itself. Equivalently, it must not be possible to tell a priori that the claim is false.

Joseph Levine discusses a version of the conceivability argument in his 2001. He views the conceivability of zombies as ‘the principal manifestation of the explanatory gap’ (79). What creates this gap, in his view, is the epistemological problem of explaining how the phenomenal is related to the physical. He sees no way to solve this problem, and thinks it remains even if zombies are impossible.

We now face two key questions: Are zombies conceivable in the sense explained? If zombies are conceivable, does it follow that they are possible? Only if the answer to each question is yes will the conceivability argument succeed. Let us take them in that order.

4. Are zombies conceivable?

The intuitive appeal of the zombie idea can be overwhelming. Those who exploited it in the 1970s typically assumed without argument that zombies are not just conceivable but possible (e. g. Campbell 1970, Nagel 1970). Chalmers too, reactivating the idea, finds the conceivability of zombies ‘obvious’: he remarks that ‘it certainly seems that a coherent situation is described; I can discern no contradiction in the description’ (1996, p. 96). However, he recognizes that this intuition cannot be relied on. The nature of consciousness is after all hard to understand: what strikes some people as obviously possible could still turn out to be contradictory or incoherent (Nagel 1998; Stoljar 2001). Clearly, those who maintain that zombies are conceivable must provide support for that claim, recognizing that, as an epistemic claim dependent on our cognitive abilities, it is defeasible. Some of the supporting reasoning on offer will be briefly noted in this section; typically it involves thought experiments.

4.1 Arguments for

One of these involves a person whose behavior starts to show features which (the argument goes) suggest he is progressively being deprived of qualia in one sense modality after another, even though most of the time he continues to produce behavior that would have been appropriate if he had retained full consciousness. As soon as all his sense modalities have been affected, his patterns of behavior revert to normal; but the suggestion is that it is at least intelligible to say he has become a zombie (Kirk 1974a). However, this line of reasoning falls well short of establishing that zombies are really conceivable. It seems to depend on much the same cluster of intuitions as the original idea.

Another thought experiment involves a team of micro-Lilliputians who invade Gulliver's head, disconnect his afferent and efferent nerves, monitor the inputs from his afferent nerves, and send outputs down his efferent nerves to produce behavior indistinguishable from what it would have been originally. The resulting system has the same behavioral dispositions as Gulliver but (allegedly) lacks sensations and other experiences, contrary to the ‘Entailment Thesis’, according to which the physical facts entail the psychological facts (Kirk 1974b). Don Locke objected that materialists can consistently hold that zombies are possible provided they deny ‘the empirical possibility of mere Zombies’ (Locke 1976: for recent versions of a similar objection see 5 below).

Not confining himself to arguing directly for the conceivability of zombies, Chalmers (1996) presents a series of five arguments against the view that there is an a priori entailment from physical facts to mental facts. Each of these arguments would directly or indirectly reinforce the intuitive appeal of the zombie idea. The first will be considered shortly; the other four appeal respectively to the alleged possibility of ‘inverted spectrum’ without physical difference; to the alleged impossibility of acquiring information about conscious experience on the basis of purely physical information; to Jackson's ‘knowledge argument’ (related to the last argument); and to what Chalmers calls ‘the absence of analysis’: the point being that his opponents ‘will have to give us some idea of how the existence of consciousness might be entailed by the physical facts’: in his view ‘any attempt to demonstrate such an entailment is doomed to failure’ (1996, p. 104).

His first argument goes roughly as follows. Suppose a population of tiny people disable your brain and replicate its functions themselves, while keeping the rest of your body in working order (see Block 1980); each homunculus uses a cell phone to perform the signal-receiving and -transmitting functions of an individual neuron. Now, would such a system be conscious? Intuitively one may be inclined to say obviously not. Some, notably functionalists, bite the bullet and answer yes. However, the argument does not depend on assuming that the homunculus-head would not be conscious. It depends only on the assumption that its not being conscious is conceivable — which many people find reasonable. In Chalmers's words, all that matters here is that when we say the system might lack consciousness, ‘a meaningful possibility is being expressed, and it is an open question whether consciousness arises or not’ (1996, p. 97). If he is right, then the system is not conscious. In that case it is already very much like a zombie, the only difference being that it has little people where a zombie has neurons. And why should that make a difference to whether the situation is conceivable? Why should switching from homunculi to neurons necessarily switch on the light of consciousness? (For doubts about the assumption that it is conceivable that the homunculus-head lacks consciousness, see e.g. Loar 1990/1997, pp. 613f.)

Other considerations which seem to favor the zombie idea are offered by, for example, Block 1995, 2002; Levine 2001; Searle 1992. (Some physicalists find pro-zombie reasoning persuasive; they tend to reject the view (to be examined in 5 below) that conceivability entails possibility.)

4.2 Arguments against

Although in the past it was quite widely accepted that zombies are conceivable, skepticism about that idea has been growing over recent years. Before considering some lines of attack on it, let us briefly recall three ideas that once seemed to support the view that we can know a priori that dualism is false — hence, on reasonable assumptions, that physicalism is true and zombies are inconceivable.

The first of these ideas is verificationism, according to which a (declarative) sentence is meaningful just in case its truth value can be verified. This entails that unverifiable sentences are literally meaningless, so that no metaphysical claim according to which unobservable nonphysical items exist can be true. However, since our ability to think and talk about our experiences is itself a problem for verificationism, to presuppose it when attacking the zombie idea would beg the question. The second idea is Wittgenstein's ‘private language argument’. Although not crudely verificationistic, it depends on the assumption that in order for words to be meaningful, their use must be open to public checking. If sound, therefore, it would seem to prove that we cannot talk about qualia in the ways that defenders of the zombie possibility think we can; the checkability assumption therefore also seems question-begging in this context. According to the third idea, behaviorism, there is no more to having mental states than being disposed to behave in certain ways. As a possible basis for attacking the zombie idea, behaviorism is in a similar situation to verificationism and the private language argument. Obviously zombies would satisfy all behavioral conditions for full consciousness, so if we could know a priori that behaviorism was correct, zombie worlds would be inconceivable for that reason. It seems unlikely, though, that behaviorism can be shown to be correct. (Dennett 1991 defends a position with strong affinities to behaviorism, though it is better classified as functionalist).

A much more widely supported approach to the mental is functionalism: the view that mental states are not just a matter of behavior and dispositions, but of the causal or other ‘functional’ relations of sensory inputs, internal states, and behavioral outputs. (Note that unless the nature of the internal processing is taken into account as well, then functionalism falls to most of the usual objections to behaviorism, for example to the ‘homunculus-head’ described in the last section.) Since zombies would satisfy all the functional conditions for full consciousness, functionalism entails that zombies are impossible. Of course functionalism cannot just be presupposed when attacking the zombie idea: that would hardly be any better than presupposing behaviorism. But increasingly sophisticated versions of functionalism are being formulated and defended today, and any arguments for functionalism are a fortiori arguments against the possibility of zombies. (For some defenses of functionalism against zombies see Dennett 1991; 1995; 1999; Shoemaker 1999; Tye 2006; 2009; for doubts about functionalism's capacity to deal with zombies see for example Harnad 1995.)

Apart from broad-front functionalist theories of the mental, there are more narrowly focused attacks on the conceivability of zombies; some are noted below.

Can we really imagine zombies? Daniel Dennett thinks those who accept the conceivability of zombies have failed to imagine them thoroughly enough: ‘they invariably underestimate the task of conception (or imagination), and end up imagining something that violates their own definition’ (1995, p. 322. For a related point see Marcus 2004). Given his broadly functionalist model of consciousness, he argues, we can see why the ‘putative contrast between zombies and conscious beings is illusory’ (325. See also his 1991; 1999). Consciousness is ‘not a single wonderful separable thing … but a huge complex of many different informational capacities that individually arise for a wide variety of reasons (1995, p. 324):

Supposing that by an act of stipulative imagination you can remove consciousness while leaving all cognitive systems intact … is like supposing that by an act of stipulative imagination, you can remove health while leaving all bodily functions and powers intact. … Health isn't that sort of thing, and neither is consciousness (1995, p. 325).
(Cottrell 1999 supports this approach.)

Zombies' utterances. Suppose I smell roasting coffee beans and say, ‘Mm! Roasting coffee: I love that smell!’. Everyone would rightly assume I was talking about my experience. But now suppose my zombie twin produces the same utterance. He too seems to be talking about an experience, but in fact he isn't because he's just a zombie. Is he mistaken? Is he lying? Could his utterance somehow be interpreted as true, or is it totally without truth value? Nigel Thomas (1996) argues that ‘any line that zombiphiles take on these questions will get them into serious trouble’.

Knowing and referring to qualia. It is sometimes assumed that the view that zombies are possible entails epiphenomenalism; but that is not so. One may hold that zombies are possible while denying that the actual world is physically closed under causation: one might be an interactionist. In that case one will not define zombies as being like us in all physical respects, but only as like us to the extent that the physical events in our bodies are physically caused; those physical events that one holds are caused non-physically in ourselves must be taken to have physical causes in zombies. (Perry argues that the zombie idea simply presupposes epiphenomenalism: 2001, pp. 71–80.) However, although the zombie idea does not entail epiphenomenalism (or parallelism) about the actual world, it does seem to entail that epiphenomenalism might have been true: that there are possible worlds subject to the causal closure of the physical, where each of our conscious counterparts consists of a body plus nonphysical, causally inert qualia. (See e.g. Campbell 1970, p. 52, Chalmers 1996, p. 152; Kirk 2005, p. 42).

But, arguably, it is a priori true that phenomenal consciousness, whether actual or possible, involves being able to refer to and know about one's qualia. If that is right, any zombie-friendly account faces a problem. According to the widely accepted causal theory of reference — accepted by many philosophers — reference and knowledge require us to be causally affected by what is known or referred to (Kripke 1972/80); and it seems reasonable to suppose that this too is true a priori if true at all. On that basis, in those epiphenomenalistic worlds whose conceivability seems to follow from the conceivability of zombies — (worlds where qualia are inert) — our counterparts cannot know about or refer to their qualia. That contradicts the assumption that phenomenal consciousness involves being able to refer to qualia, from which it follows that such epiphenomenalistic worlds are not possible after all. Hence zombies are not conceivable in the relevant sense either, since their conceivability leads a priori to a contradiction. To summarize: if zombies are conceivable, so are epiphenomenalistic worlds. But by the causal theory of reference, epiphenomenalistic worlds are not conceivable; therefore zombies are not conceivable.

Chalmers replies that on his account of ‘phenomenal judgments’ (roughly, judgments about qualia) the crucial consideration is that we are ‘acquainted’ with our experiences. This ‘intimate epistemic relation’ both ensures that we can refer to experiences and also justifies our claims to know about them. Since our zombie twins, in contrast, have no experiences, their quasi-phenomenal judgments are unjustified. Chalmers suggests that even if qualia have no causal influence on our judgments, their mere presence in the appropriate physical context ensures that our thoughts are about those qualia. It also constitutes justification for our knowledge claims, he thinks, even if our experiences are not explanatorily relevant to making the judgments in question (Chalmers 1996, pp. 172–209; 1999, pp. 493f; see also his 2003, 2010).

The problem of epistemic contact. Just now it seemed that if zombies are conceivable, then epiphenomenalist and parallelist worlds are also conceivable. In that case the friends of zombies must explain how the epiphenomenal qualia in such worlds — call them ‘e-qualia’ — could make any sort of intimate contribution to people's lives; and here Kirk (2005; 2008) suggests that the zombie idea faces a further difficulty. This emerges when we consider such things as attending to, thinking about, remembering, and comparing our experiences: activities that bring us into ‘epistemic contact’ with those experiences. Such activities involve cognitive processing, which in turn involves changes causing other changes. Since e-qualia are causally inert, they themselves could not do that processing; so if they actually constitute our experiences (as epiphenomenalism and parallelism seem to imply) the necessary processing must be done by the body. The trouble is that the conception of consciousness implied by the zombie idea would make it impossible for such processing to put us into epistemic contact with e-qualia, since that conception can appeal only to the assumed causation of e-qualia by neural processes or to their isomorphism with them, factors which (Kirk argues) are not enough. If that is right, the notions of e-qualia and zombies imply a conception of consciousness which requires people to be in epistemic contact with their e-qualia, yet also rules out the possibility of such contact: a contradiction.

There are other attacks on the conceivability of zombies in Cottrell 1999; Harnad 1995; Marcus 2004; Shoemaker 1999; Tye 2006.

5. Does conceivability entail possibility?

Premise (2) of the conceivability argument is: whatever is conceivable is possible. This is surely a defensible claim, given that what is relevant here is ‘conceivability on ideal rational reflection’. However, this premiss faces several challenges.

5.1 Objections based on a posteriori necessity

A number of philosophers argue that Kripke's ideas about a posteriori necessary truth facilitate the defense of physicalism. They urge that even if a zombie world is conceivable, that does not establish that it is possible in the way that matters. Conceivability is an epistemic notion, they say, while possibility is a metaphysical one: ‘It is false that if one can in principle conceive that P, then it is logically possible that P; … Given psychophysical identities, it is an ‘a posteriori’ fact that any physical duplicate of our world is exactly like ours in respect of positive facts about sensory states’ (Hill and McLaughlin 1999, p. 446. See also Hill 1997; Loar 1990/1997; 1999; Webster 2006). (Some philosophers reject even the assumption that conceivability is a guide to possibility, thereby challenging the assumption that the burden of proof is on those who deny the zombie possibility (Yablo 1993; Block and Stalnaker 1999).)

Chalmers has responded in several places (e.g. 1996, pp. 131–134; 1999, pp. 476–7; and especially 2010, pp. 141–205). His most detailed version of the conceivability argument (2010) uses the framework of two-dimensional semantics. This framework (see the entry two-dimensional semantics) enables him to distinguish two kinds of possibility and, correspondingly, two kinds of conceivability. In the ‘primary’ sense conceivability entails possibility, and it is conceivable that water should have been a substance chemically different from H2O. In the other, ‘secondary’ sense, it is neither conceivable nor possible that water should have been chemically different. The difficulty for the conceivability argument can be expressed by saying that even if zombie worlds are primarily conceivable and therefore primarily possible, it does not follow that they are also secondarily possible. A posteriori physicalists will typically deny that it follows, on the ground that only the secondary possibility of zombie worlds would entail the falsity of physicalism. At this point Chalmers in effect presents his opponents with a dilemma, which is (summarizing very crudely) that either the primary conceivability of zombies does after all entail their secondary possibility, in which case the conceivability argument works and materialism is false; or else the view he calls ‘Russellian monism’, which is briefly explained at 5.3 below, is true. (See also Jackson 1998; and for discussions, Brueckner 2002; Loar 1999; Hill and McLaughlin 1999; Perry 2001, pp. 169–208; Shoemaker 1999; Soames 2005; Yablo 1999.)

5.2 The phenomenal concept strategy

Many physicalists hold that both the zombie idea and Frank Jackson's ‘knowledge argument’ can best be dealt with through a proper understanding of the nature of phenomenal concepts (roughly, the concepts that are used essentially when conveying the character of our experiences: for example ‘sweet’, ‘the way I see blue’). Exponents of the conceivability argument hold that the supposed ‘explanatory gap’ between the physical and the phenomenal — the gap expressed in the idea that zombies are conceivable — brings with it an ontological gap. According to the ‘phenomenal concept strategy’ (Stoljar 2005) there is really only a conceptual gap: phenomenal concepts have features which mislead us into supposing that there is an ontological gap in addition to an epistemic one, when there isn't.

It is further argued that even if a zombie world is indeed conceivable, it does not follow that there are nonphysical properties in our world. If that is right, physicalists can concede the conceivability of zombies while insisting that the properties we pick out in terms of ‘phenomenal concepts’ are physical. ‘Given that properties are constituted by the world and not by our concepts’, Brian Loar comments, ‘it is fair of the physicalist to request a justification of the assumption that conceptually distinct concepts must express metaphysically distinct properties’ (Loar 1999, p. 467; see also his 1997).

Loar also argues that phenomenal concepts are ‘recognitional’, in contrast to physical concepts, which are ‘theoretical’. Phenomenal concepts, he says, ‘express the very properties they pick out, as Kripke observed in the case of ‘pain’’ (1999, p. 468). He thinks these points explain the conceivability of a zombie world, while maintaining that there is no possible world in which the relevant physical properties are distinct from consciousness. Chalmers objects that ‘there is nothing in Loar's account to justify coreference’ (1999, p. 488).

He further objects (2007) that exponents of this approach face a dilemma. Let C be whichever psychological ‘key features’ we have but zombies lack. Then if it is conceivable that the purely physical facts about us should have held without C, then C is not physicalistically explicable. On the other hand, if that is not conceivable, then C cannot explain our epistemic situation as contrasted with that of zombies. So either C is not physicalistically explicable, or C cannot explain our epistemic situation.

See also Carruthers 2005; Chalmers 1999; 2007; 2010; Crane 2005; Loar 1990/97; Papineau 2002; Tye 2009.

5.3 Russellian monism

Some philosophers suggest that physics tells us only about the ‘structural’ properties of things — such as their dispositions and nomic relations — rather than about the ‘intrinsic’ properties which supposedly underlie and account for structural properties. Thus Daniel Stoljar (2001) argues that there are two distinct notions of the physical and correspondingly of physicalism, depending on whether one appeals just to the notions in physical theory or to the intrinsic properties of physical objects. He suggests that even if one of the corresponding two versions of the conceivability argument is sound, the other is not because (roughly) physicalists can always object that, since we do not know enough about the physical world (in particular, about its intrinsic properties), we cannot ‘strongly’ conceive of the possibility of zombies.

These ideas are exploited in what Chalmers calls ‘Russellian monism’ (a variety of neutral monism). In our world, he suggests, the underlying intrinsic properties might be ‘phenomenal properties, or they might be protophenomenal properties: properties that collectively constitute phenomenal properties when organized in the appropriate way’ (2010: p. 151); while in some other worlds the corresponding intrinsic physical properties did not provide for consciousness. If the intrinsic properties which supposedly provide for our consciousness are nevertheless classified as physical, exponents can deny the possibility of zombies if these are understood to be our ‘full’ physical duplicates. At the same time they can concede the possibility of zombies which duplicate us only in their structural properties. As he points out, this view is ‘a highly distinctive form of physicalism that has much in common with property dualism and that many physicalists will want to reject’ (Chalmers 2010, p. 152). (One obstacle to counting it as physicalism is that it cannot explain why the special intrinsic properties in our world should provide for consciousness, while the ones which perform the same functions in those other worlds do not: that has to be accepted as a brute fact.)

Philip Goff (2010) suggests that this loophole for Russellian versions of physicalism weakens the zombie argument. He recommends instead an argument from ghosts: pure subjects of experience without any physical nature. He argues that such ghosts are conceivable and possible, and that they provide an argument against physicalism which leaves no loophole for Russellian monism.

5.4 Other objections

Special factors. It has been suggested that there are special factors at work in the psychophysical case which have a strong tendency to mislead us. For example it is claimed that what enables us to imagine or conceive of states of consciousness is a different cognitive faculty from what enables us to conceive of physical facts: ‘there are significant differences between the cognitive factors responsible for Cartesian intuitions [for example, that zombies are logically possible] and those responsible for modal intuitions of a wide variety of other kinds’ (Hill and McLaughlin 1999, p. 449. See also Hill 1997). The suggestion is that these differences help to explain the ease with which we seem able to conceive of zombies, and the difficulty we have in understanding the claim that they are nevertheless impossible.

Conditional analysis. Another line of objection rests on conditional analyses of the concept of qualia. The core idea, roughly, is that if there actually are certain nonphysical properties which fit our conception of qualia, then that is what qualia are, in which case zombies are conceivable; but if there are no such nonphysical properties, then qualia are whichever physical properties perform the appropriate functions, and zombies are not conceivable. It is argued that this approach enables physicalists to accept that the possibility of zombies is conceivable, while denying that zombies are conceivable (Hawthorne 2002a; Braddon-Mitchell 2003. See Stalnaker 2002 for a related point, and for criticism, Alter 2007; Chalmers 2010, pp. 159–59; Crane 2006).

Causal essentialism. According to the theory of causal essentialism, the causal properties of physical properties are essential to them. Brian Garrett (2009) exploits this theory to argue that the zombie argument against physicalism depends on broadly Humean assumptions about the laws of nature and property identity which presuppose the falsity of causal essentialism. If we reject those assumptions and accept that some physical properties have essentially the capacity to produce consciousness, then ‘we cannot accept the genuine possibility of zombie worlds’ even if such worlds are conceivable (see also Aranyosi 2010).

More on the utterances of zombies. Consider a zombie world that is an exact physical duplicate of our world and contains zombie twins of all philosophers, including some who appeal to the conceivability argument. Katalin Balog (1999) argues that while their utterances would be meaningful, their sentences would not always mean what they do in our mouths. She further argues — to oversimplify — that if the conceivability argument were sound in actual philosophers' mouths, then it would be sound in the mouths of zombie philosophers too. But since by hypothesis physicalism is true in their world, their argument is not sound. Therefore the conceivability argument used by actual philosophers is not sound either. If this argument works, it has the piquant feature that ‘the zombies that antiphysicalists think possible in the end undermine the arguments that allege to establish their possibility’ (502. Chalmers offers brief replies in his 2003; 2010, pp. 159–60).

The anti-zombie argument for physicalism. Assuming physicalism entails that zombies are impossible, the conceivability argument purports to refute it by showing they are possible. As we saw, the simplest version of this argument goes: (1) zombies are conceivable; (2) whatever is conceivable is possible; (3) therefore zombies are possible. However, ‘anti-zombies’ (Frankish 2007) — duplicates of ourselves made conscious by the purely physical facts — also seem conceivable. So we have a parallel argument: (1*) anti-zombies are conceivable; (2) whatever is conceivable is possible; (3*) therefore anti-zombies are possible. But (3) and (3*) cannot both be true, since if the purely physical facts about anti-zombies make them conscious, then the exactly similar physical facts about zombies make them conscious too, and they are not zombies after all. The intended moral is that we should reject the inference from conceivability to possibility (Brown 2010; Frankish 2007; Marton 1998; Sturgeon 2000, pp. 114–116). The most promising reply for exponents of the conceivability argument (Chalmers 2010, p. 180) seems to be to deny that anti-zombies are conceivable.

6. Other issues

If zombies are genuinely possible, then not only is physicalism problematic: so are widely held views on other topics. Here are three notable examples.

6.1 Mental causation

The zombie idea inverts the traditional problem of mental causation. Descartes accepted the common assumption that not only do physical events have mental effects, but mental events have physical effects. The difficulty for his dualism, it was thought, was to understand how a supposedly nonphysical mind can have physical effects. But if zombies are possible, it seems natural to suppose that qualia cannot have physical effects. If the physical world is causally closed, and if qualia are nonphysical, then it may seem that qualia have no role to play.

If that is the case, then it is hard to see any alternative to parallelism or epiphenomenalism, with the radical revision of common assumptions about mental causation that those views demand. True, the friends of zombies do not seem compelled to be epiphenomenalists or parallelists. They may instead hold that the actual world is not physically closed under causation, and that nonphysical properties have physical effects. Or they may favor ‘panprotopsychism’, according to which what is metaphysically fundamental is not physical properties, but phenomenal or ‘protophenomenal’ ones (Chalmers 1991, 297–299; 1999, 492) — a view arguably compatible with the causal closure of the physical. But neither of those options is easy. Abandoning causal closure conflicts with empirical evidence; while the idea of phenomenal or quasi-phenomenal properties as fundamental is obscure. Besides, as also noted earlier, the conceivability of zombies seems to entail that epiphenomenalistic worlds are at any rate possible.

6.2 The function of consciousness

The apparent possibility of zombies can seem to pose a problem for evolutionary theory. Why did creatures with qualia survive rather than zombie counterparts of those creatures? How could consciousness possibly have a function? Owen Flanagan and Thomas Polger have used the apparent possibility of zombies to support the claim that ‘There are as yet no credible stories about why subjects of experience emerged, why they might have won — or should have been expected to win — an evolutionary battle against very intelligent zombie-like information-sensitive organisms’ (1995, 321): a problem not faced by those who reject the possibility of zombies. One response on behalf of those who do accept it is to suggest that there might be fundamental laws linking the phenomenal to the physical. Such laws would not depend on whether conscious creatures ever happened to evolve, in which case, arguably, evolution poses no special problem (Chalmers 1996, 171).

6.3 Other minds

If qualia have no physical effects, then nothing will enable anyone to establish for certain that anyone else actually has qualia. Philosophers who believe they have a solid response to skepticism about other minds may therefore conclude that this consequence of the zombie idea is enough to condemn it. Others, however, may regard the skeptical consequence as ‘a confirmation’, on the ground that we actually are ignorant of others' minds (Campbell 1970, 120). Of course not all responses to other minds skepticism imply that zombies are inconceivable.

7. Conclusion

There is not always a meeting of minds in this debate. Some physicalists believe the zombie idea and its relatives exert an irrational grip on anti-physicalist thinking, so that

… it is tempting to regard anti-physicalist arguments as rationalizations of an intuition whose independent force masks their tendentiousness (Loar 1997, 598).

Correspondingly, some anti-physicalists believe their opponents' commitment results in turning a blind eye to the difficulties:

Some may be led to deny the possibility [of zombies] in order to make some theory come out right, but the justification of such theories should ride on the question of possibility, rather than the other way round (Chalmers 1996, 96).

Regardless of whether those pessimistic readings of the debate are correct, and of whether the zombie idea itself is or is not coherent, it continues to stimulate fruitful work on consciousness, physicalism, phenomenal concepts, and the relations between imaginability, conceivability, and possibility.


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behaviorism | conceivability | consciousness | consciousness: animal | dualism | epiphenomenalism | functionalism | identity theory of mind | knowledge argument | Kripke | mental causation | neutral monism | other minds | physicalism | private language | qualia | skepticism | supervenience | verificationism


Many thanks to David Chalmers and to Bill Fish for valuable detailed comments and suggestions on drafts of this entry.