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Time Machines

First published Thu Nov 25, 2004; substantive revision Thu Oct 7, 2010

Recent years have seen a growing consensus in the philosophical community that the grandfather paradox and similar logical puzzles do not preclude the possibility of time travel scenarios that utilize spacetimes containing closed timelike curves. At the same time, physicists, who for half a century acknowledged that the general theory of relativity is compatible with such spacetimes, have intensely studied the question whether the operation of a time machine would be admissible in the context of the same theory and of its quantum cousins. A time machine is a device which brings about closed timelike curves—and thus enables time travel—where none would have existed otherwise. The physics literature contains various no-go theorems for time machines, i.e., theorems which purport to establish that, under physically plausible assumptions, the operation of a time machine is impossible. We conclude that for the time being there exists no conclusive no-go theorem against time machines. The character of the material covered in this article makes it inevitable that its content is of a rather technical nature. We contend, however, that philosophers should nevertheless be interested in this literature for at least two reasons. First, the topic of time machines leads to a number of interesting foundations issues in classical and quantum theories of gravity; and second, philosophers can contribute to the topic by clarifying what it means for a device to count as a time machine, by relating the debate to other concerns such as Penrose's cosmic censorship conjecture and the fate of determinism in general relativity theory, and by eliminating a number of confusions regarding the status of the paradoxes of time travel. The present article addresses these ambitions in as non-technical a manner as possible, and the reader is referred to the relevant physics literature for details.

1. Introduction: time travel vs. time machine

The topic of time machines is the subject of a sizable and growing physics literature, some of which has filtered down to popular and semi-popular presentations.[1] The issues raised by this topic are largely oblique, if not orthogonal, to those treated in the philosophical literature on time travel.[2] Most significantly, the so-called paradoxes of time travel do not play a substantial role in the physics literature on time machines. This literature equates the possibility of time travel with the existence of closed timelike curves (CTCs) or worldlines for material particles that are smooth, future-directed timelike curves with self-intersections.[3] Since time machines designate devices which bring about the existence of CTCs and thus enable time travel, the paradoxes of time travel are irrelevant for attempted “no-go” results for time machines because these results concern what happens before the emergence of CTCs.[4] This, in our opinion, is fortunate since the paradoxes of time travel are nothing more than a crude way of bringing out the fact that the application of familiar local laws of relativistic physics to a spacetime background which contains CTCs typically requires that consistency constraints on initial data must be met in order for a local solution of the laws to be extendable to a global solution. The nature and status of these constraints is the subject of ongoing discussion. We will not try to advance the discussion of this issue here;[5] rather, our aim is to acquaint the reader with the issues addressed in the physics literature on time machines and to connect them with issues in the philosophy of space and time and, more generally, with issues in the foundations of physics.

Paradox mongers can be reassured in that if a paradox is lost in shifting the focus from time travel itself to time machines, then a paradox is also gained: if it is possible to operate a time machine device that produces CTCs, then it is possible to alter the structure of spacetime such that determinism fails; but by undercutting determinism, the time machine undercuts the claim that it is responsible for producing CTCs. But just as the grandfather paradox is a crude way of making a point, so this new paradox is a crude way of indicating that it is going to be difficult to specify what it means to be a time machine. This is a task that calls not for paradox mongering but for scientifically informed philosophizing. The present article will provide the initial steps of this task and will indicate what remains to be done. But aside from paradoxes, the main payoff of the topic of time machines is that it provides a quick route to the heart of a number of foundations problems in classical general relativity theory and in attempts to produce a quantum theory of gravity by combining general relativity and quantum mechanics. We will indicate the shape of some of these problems here, but will refer the interested reader elsewhere for technical details.

There are at least two distinct general notions of time machines, which we will call Wellsian and Thornian for short. In The Time Machine, H. G. Wells (1931) described what has become science fiction's paradigmatic conception of a time machine: the intrepid operator fastens her seat belt, dials the target date—past or future—into the counter, throws a lever, and sits back while time rewinds or fast forwards until the target date is reached. We will not broach the issue of whether or not a Wellsian time machine can be implemented within a relativistic spacetime framework. For, as will soon become clear, the time machines which have recently come into prominence in the physics literature are of an utterly different kind. This second kind of time machine was originally proposed by Kip Thorne and his collaborators (see Morris and Thorne 1988; Morris, Thorne, and Yurtsever 1988). These articles considered the possibility that, without violating the laws of general relativistic physics, an advanced civilization might manipulate concentrations of matter-energy so as to produce CTCs where none would have existed otherwise. In their example, the production of “wormholes” was used to generate the required spacetime structure. But this is only one of the ways in which a time machine might operate, and in what follows any device which affects the spacetime structure in such a way that CTCs result will be dubbed a Thornian time machine. We will only be concerned with this variety of time machine, leaving the Wellsian variety to science fiction writers. This will disappoint the aficionados of science fiction since Thornian time machines do not have the magical ability to transport the would-be time traveler to the past of the events that constitute the operation of the time machine. For those more interested in science than in science fiction, this loss is balanced by the gain in realism and the connection to contemporary research in physics.

In Sections 2 and 3 we investigate the circumstances under which it is plausible to see a Thornian time machine at work. The main difficulty lies in specifying the conditions needed to make sense of the notion that the time machine “produces” or is “responsible for” the appearances of CTCs. We argue that at present there is no satisfactory resolution of this difficulty and, thus, that the topic of time machines in a general relativistic setting is somewhat ill-defined. This fact does not prevent progress from being made on the topic; for if one's aim is to establish no-go results for time machines it suffices to identify necessary conditions for the operation of a time machine and then to prove, under suitable hypotheses about what is physically possible, that it is not physically possible to satisfy said necessary conditions. In Section 4 we review various no-go results which depend only on classical general relativity theory. Section 5 surveys results that appeal to quantum effects. Conclusions are presented in Section 6.

2. What is a (Thornian) time machine? Preliminaries

The setting for the discussion is a general relativistic spacetime (M, gab) where M is a differentiable manifold and gab is a Lorentz signature metric defined on all of M. The central issue addressed in the physics literature on time machines is whether in this general setting it is physically possible to operate a Thornian time machine. This issue is to be settled by proving theorems about the solutions to the equations that represent what are taken to be physical laws operating in the general relativistic setting—or at least this is so once the notion of a Thornian time machine has been explicated. Unfortunately, no adequate and generally accepted explication that lends itself to the required mathematical proofs is to be found in the literature. This is neither surprising nor deplorable. Mathematical physicists do not wait until some concept has received its final explication before trying to prove theorems about it; indeed, the process of theorem proving is often an essential part of conceptual clarification. The moral is well illustrated by the history of the concept of a spacetime singularity in general relativity where this concept received its now canonical definition only in the process of proving the Penrose-Hawking-Geroch singularity theorems, which came at the end of a decades long dispute over the issue of whether spacetime singularities are a generic feature of solutions to Einstein's gravitational field equations.[6] However, this is not to say that philosophers interested in time machines should simply wait until the dust has settled in the physics literature; indeed, the physics literature could benefit from deployment of the analytical skills that are the stock in trade of philosophy. For example, the paradoxes of time travel and the fate of time machines are not infrequently confused in the physics literature, and as will become evident below, subtler confusions abound as well.

The question of whether a Thornian time machine—a device that produces CTCs—can be seen to be at work only makes sense if the spacetime has at least three features: temporal orientability, a definite time orientation, and a causally innocuous past. In order to make the notion of a CTC meaningful, the spacetime must be temporally orientable (i.e., must admit a consistent time directionality), and one of the two possible time orientations has to be singled out as giving the direction of time.[7] Non-temporal orientability is not really an obstacle since if a given general relativistic spacetime is not temporally orientable, a spacetime that is everywhere locally the same as the given spacetime and is itself temporally orientable can be obtained by passing to a covering spacetime.[8] How to justify the singling out of one of the two possible orientations as future pointing requires a solution to the problem of the direction of time, a problem which is still subject to lively debate (see Callender 2001). But for present purposes we simply assume that a temporal orientation has been provided. A CTC is then (by definition) a parameterized closed spacetime curve whose tangent is everywhere a future-pointing timelike vector. A CTC can be thought of as the world line of some possible observer whose life history is linearly ordered in the small but not in the large: the observer has a consistent experience of the “next moment,” and the “next,” etc., but eventually the “next moment” brings her back to whatever event she regards as the starting point.

As for the third condition—a causally innocuous past—the question of the possibility of operating a device that produces CTCs presupposes that there is a time before which no CTCs existed. Thus, Gödel spacetime, so beloved of the time travel literature, is not a candidate for hosting a Thornian time machine since through every point in this spacetime there is a CTC. We make this third condition precise by requiring that the spacetime admits a global time slice Σ (i.e., a spacelike hypersurface without edges);[9] that Σ is two-sided and partitions M into three parts—Σ itself, the part of M on the past side of Σ and the part of M on the future side of Σ—and that there are no CTCs that lie on the past side of Σ. The first two clauses of this requirement together entail that the time slice Σ is a partial Cauchy surface, i.e., Σ is a time slice that is not intersected more than once by any future-directed timelike curve.[10]

Now suppose that the state on a partial Cauchy surface Σ0 with no CTCs to its past is to be thought of as giving a snapshot of the universe at a moment before the machine is turned on. The subsequent realization of a Thornian time machine scenario requires that the chronology violating region VM, the region of spacetime traced out by CTCs,[11] is non-null and lies to the future of Σ0. The fact that V ≠ Ø does not lead to any consistency constraints on initial data on Σ0 since, by hypothesis, Σ0 is not intersected more than once by any timelike curve, and thus, insofar as the so-called paradoxes of time travel are concerned with such constraints, the paradoxes do not arise with respect to Σ0. But by the same token, the option of traveling back into the past of Σ0 is ruled out by the set up as it has been sketched so far, since otherwise Σ0 would not be a partial Cauchy surface. This just goes to underscore the point made above that the fans of science fiction stories of time machines will not find the present context of discussion broad enough to encompass their vision of how time machines should operate; they may now stop reading this article and return to their novels.

As a concrete example of these concepts, consider the (1 + 1)-dimensional Misner spacetime (see Figure 1) which exhibits some of the causal features of Taub-NUT spacetime, a vacuum solution to Einstein's gravitational field equations. It satisfies all three of the conditions discussed above. It is temporally orientable, and a time orientation has been singled out—the shading in the figure indicates the future lobes of the light cones. To the past of the partial Cauchy surface Σ0 lies the Taub region where the causal structure of spacetime is as bland as can be desired. But to the future of Σ0 the light cones begin to “tip over,” and eventually the tipping results in CTCs in the NUT region.

The issue that must be faced now is what further conditions must be imposed in order that the appearance of CTCs to the future of Σ0 can be attributed to the operation of a time machine. Not surprisingly, the answer depends not just on the structure of the spacetime at issue but also on the physical laws that govern the evolution of the spacetime structure. If one adopts the attitude that the label “time machine” is to be reserved for devices that operate within a finite spatial range for a finite stretch of time, then one will want to impose requirements to assure that what happens in a compact region of spacetime lying on or to the future of Σ0 is responsible for the CTCs. Or one could be more liberal and allow the would-be time machine to be spread over an infinite space. We will adopt the more liberal stance since it avoids various complications while still sufficing to elicit key points. Again, one could reserve the label “time machine” for devices that manipulate concentrations of mass-energy in some specified ways. For example, based on Gödel spacetime—where matter is everywhere rotating and a CTC passes through every spacetime point—one might conjecture that setting into sufficiently rapid rotation a finite mass concentration of appropriate shape will eventuate in CTCs. But with the goal in mind of proving negative general results, it is better to proceed in a more abstract fashion. Think of the conditions on the partial Cauchy surface Σ0 as encoding the instructions for the operation of the time machine. The details of the operation of the device—whether it operates in a finite region of spacetime, whether it operates by setting matter into rotation, etc.—can be left to the side. What must be addressed, however, is whether the processes that evolve from the state on Σ0 can be deemed to be responsible for the subsequent appearance of CTCs.

3. When can a would-be time machine be held responsible for the emergence of CTCs?

The most obvious move is to construe “responsible for” in the sense of causal determinism. But in the present setting this move quickly runs into a dead end. For if CTCs exist to the future of Σ0 they are not causally determined by the state on Σ0 since the time travel region V, if it is non-null, lies outside the future domain of dependence D+0) of Σ0, the portion of spacetime where the field equations of relativistic physics uniquely determine the state of things from the state on Σ0.[12] The point is illustrated by the toy model of Figure 1. The surface labeled H+0) is called the future Cauchy horizon of Σ0. It is the future boundary of D+0),[13] and it separates the portion of spacetime where conditions are causally determined by the state on Σ0 from the portion where conditions are not so determined. And, as advertised, the CTCs in the model of Figure 1 lie beyond H+0).

Thus, if the operation of a Thornian time machine is to be a live possibility, some condition weaker than causal determinism must be used to capture the sense in which the state on Σ0 can be deemed to be responsible for the subsequent development of CTCs. Given the failure of causal determinism, it seems the next best thing to demand that the region V is “adjacent” to the future domain of dependence D+0). Here is an initial stab at such an adjacency condition. Consider causal curves which have a future endpoint in the time travel region V and no past endpoint. Such a curve may never leave V; but if it does, require that it intersects Σ0. But this requirement is too strong because it rules out Thornian time machines altogether. For a curve of the type in question to reach Σ0 it must intersect H+0), but once it reaches H+0) it can be continued endlessly into the past without meeting Σ0 because the generators of H+0) are past endless null geodesics that never meet Σ0.[14] This difficulty can be overcome by weakening the requirement at issue by rephrasing it in terms of timelike curves rather than causal curves. Now the set of candidate time machine spacetimes satisfying the weakened requirement is non-empty—as illustrated, once again, by the spacetime of Figure 1. But the weakened requirement is too weak, as illustrated by the (1 + 1)-dimensional version of Deutsch-Politzer spacetime[15] (see Figure 2), which is constructed from two-dimensional Minkowski spacetime by deleting the points p1p4 and then gluing together the strips as shown. Every past endless timelike curve that emerges from the time travel region V of Deutsch-Politzer spacetime does meet Σ0. But this spacetime is not a plausible candidate for a time machine spacetime. Up to and including the time Σ0 (which can be placed as close to V as desired) this spacetime is identical with empty Minkowski spacetime. If the state of the corresponding portion of Minkowski spacetime is not responsible for the development of CTCs—and it certainly is not since there are no CTCs in Minkowski spacetime—how can the state on the portion of Deutsch-Politzer spacetime up to and including the time Σ0 be held responsible for the CTCs that appear in the future?

The deletion of the points p1p4 means that the Deutsch-Politzer spacetime is singular in the sense that it is geodesically incomplete.[16] It would be too drastic to require of a time-machine hosting spacetime that it be geodesically complete. And in any case the offending feature of Deutsch-Politzer can be gotten rid of by the following trick. Multiplying the flat Lorentzian metric ηab of Deutsch-Politzer spacetime by a scalar function j(x, t) > produces a new metric η′ab := j ηab which is conformal to the original metric and, thus, has exactly the same causal features as the original metric. But if the conformal factor j is chosen to “blow up” as the missing points p1p4 are approached, the resulting spacetime is geodesically complete—intuitively, the singularities have been pushed off to infinity.

A more subtle way to exclude Deutsch-Politzer spacetime focuses on the generators of H+0). The stipulations laid down so far for Thornian time machines imply that the generators of H+0) cannot intersect Σ0. But in addition it can be required that these generators do not “emerge from a singularity” and do not “come from infinity,” and this would suffice to rule out Deutsch-Politzer spacetime and its conformal cousins as legitimate candidates for time machine spacetimes. More precisely, we can impose what Stephen Hawking (1992a,b) calls the requirement that H+0) be compactly generated; namely, the past endless null geodesics that generate H+0) must, if extended far enough into past, fall into and remain in a compact subset of spacetime. Obviously the spacetime of Figure 1 fulfills Hawking's requirement—since in this case H+0) is itself compact—but just as obviously the spacetime of Figure 2 (conformally doctored or not) does not.

Imposing the requirement of a compactly generated future Cauchy horizon has not only the negative virtue of excluding some unsuited candidate time machine spacetimes but a positive virtue as well. It is easily proved that if H+0) is compactly generated then the condition of strong causality is violated on H+0), which means, intuitively, there are almost closed causal curves near H+0).[17] This violation can be taken as an indication that the seeds of CTCs have been planted on Σ0 and that by the time H+0) is reached they are ready to bloom.

However, we still have no guarantee that if CTCs do bloom to the future of Σ0, then the state on Σ0 is responsible for the blooming. Of course, we have already learned that we cannot have the iron clad guarantee of causal determinism that the state on Σ0 is responsible for the actual blooming in all of its particularity. But we might hope for a guarantee that the state on Σ0 is responsible for the blooming of some CTCs—the actual ones or others. The difference takes a bit of explaining. The failure of causal determinism is aptly pictured by the image of a future “branching” of world histories, with the different branches representing different alternative possible futures of (the domain of dependence of) Σ0 that are compatible with the actual past and the laws of physics. And so it is in the present setting: if H+0) ≠ Ø, then there will generally be different ways to extend D+0), all compatible with the laws of general relativistic physics. But if CTCs are present in all of these extensions, even through the details of the CTCs may vary from one extension to another, then the state on Σ0 can rightly be deemed to be responsible for the fact that subsequently CTCs did develop.

A theorem due to Krasnikov (2002, 2003) might seem to demonstrate that no relativistic spacetime can count as embodying a Thornian time machine so understood. Following Krasnikov, call a condition C on a spacetime (M, gab) local just in case C holds in (M, gab) iff it holds in any (U, gab|U) that is isometric to an open neighborhood of (M, gab). Examples of local conditions one might want to impose on physically reasonable spacetimes are Einstein's gravitational field equations and so-called energy conditions that restrict the form of the stress-energy tensor Tab. An example of the latter that will come into play below is the weak energy condition that says that the energy density is non-negative.[18] Einstein's field equations (sans cosmological constant) require that Tab is proportional to the Einstein tensor which is a functional of the metric and its derivatives. Call a C-spacetime (M′, gab) a C-extension of a C-spacetime (M, gab) spacetime if the latter is isometric to an open proper subset of the former; and call (M, gab) C-extensible if it admits a C-extension and C-maximal otherwise. (Of course, C might be the empty condition.) Krasnikov's theorem shows that every C-spacetime (M, gab) admits a C-maximal extension (Mmax, gmaxab) such that all CTCs in (Mmax, gmaxab) are to the chronological past of the image of M in (Mmax, gmaxab). So start with some candidate spacetime (M, gab) for a Thornian time machine, and apply the theorem to (D+0), gab|D+0)). Conclude that no matter what local conditions the candidate spacetime is required to satisfy, D+0) has extensions that also satisfies said local conditions but does not contain CTCs to the future of Σ0. Thus, the candidate spacetime fails to exhibit the crucial feature identified above necessary for underwriting the contention that the conditions on Σ0 are responsible for the development of CTCs. Hence, it appears as if Krasnikov's theorem effectively prohibits time machines. However, John Manchak (2010, Other Internet Resources) has given the would-be time machine operator a reprieve by providing a counterexample to Krasnikov's “theorem.” But the would-be operator cannot breathe easy since the counteraxmple does not locate the flaw in Krasnikov's proof, leaving open the possibility that the “theorem” can be turned into a genuine theorem by making minor modifications. It is important, therefore, that the advocates of time machines explore other means of escaping such theorems. Here is one promising avenue.

The would-be time machine operator need not capitulate in the face of Krasnikov's theorem. Recall that the main difficulty in specifying the conditions for the successful operation of Thornian time machines traces to the fact that the standard form of causal determinism does not apply to the production of CTCs. But causal determinism can fail for reasons that have nothing to do with CTCs or other acausal features of relativistic spacetimes, and it seems only fair to assure that these modes of failure have been removed before proceeding to discuss the prospects for time machines. To zero in on the modes of failure at issue, consider vacuum solutions (Tab ≡ 0) to Einstein's field equations. Let (M, gab) and (M′, gab) be two such solutions, and let Σ ⊂ M and Σ′ ⊂ M′ be spacelike hypersurfaces of their respective spacetimes. Suppose that there is an isometry Ψ from some neighborhood N(Σ) of Σ onto a neighborhood N′(Σ′) of Σ′. Does it follow, as we would want determinism to guarantee, that Ψ is extendible to an isometry from D+(Σ) onto D+(Σ′)? To see why the answer is negative, start with any solution (M, gab) of the vacuum Einstein equations, and cut out a closed set of points lying to the future of N(Σ) and in D+(Σ). Denote the surgically altered manifold by M* and the restriction of gab to M* by g*ab. Then (M*, g*ab) is also a solution of the vacuum Einstein equations. But obviously the pair of solutions (M, gab) and (M*, g*ab) violates the condition that determinism was supposed to guarantee as Ψ is not extendible to an isometry from D+(Σ) onto D+(Σ*). It might seem that the requirement, contemplated above, that the spacetimes under consideration be maximal, already rules out spacetimes that have “holes” in them. But while maximality does rule out the surgically mutilated spacetime just constructed, it does not guarantee hole freeness in the sense needed to make sure that determinism does not stumble before it gets to the starting gate. That (M, gab) is hole free in the relevant sense requires that if Σ ⊂ M is a spacelike hypersurface, there does not exist a spacetime (M′, gab) and an isometric embedding Φ of D+(Σ) into M′ such that Φ(D+(Σ)) is a proper subset of D+(Φ(Σ)). A theorem due to Robert Geroch (1977, 87), who is responsible for this definition, asserts that if Σ ⊂ M and Σ′ ⊂ M′ are spacelike hypersurfaces in hole-free spacetimes (M, gab) and (M′, gab), respectively, and if there exists an isometry Ψ: MM′, then Ψ is indeed extendible to an isometry between D+(Σ) and D+(Σ′). Thus, hole freeness precludes an important mode of failure of determinism which we wish to exclude in our discussion of time machines. It can be shown that hole freeness entails, but is not entailed by, maximality.[19] And it is just this gap that gives the would-be time machine operator some hope, for the maximal CTC-free extensions produced by Krasnikov's construction are not always hole-free, as follows from a recent result by Manchak (2009, see also below).

Thus, we propose that one clear sense of what it would mean for a Thornian time machine to operate in the setting of general relativity theory is given by the following assertion: the laws of general relativistic physics allow solutions containing a partial Cauchy surface Σ0 such that no CTCs lie to the past of Σ0 but every extension of D+0) as a hole-free solution of the laws contains CTCs. Correspondingly, a proof of the physical impossibility of time machines would take the form of showing that this assertion is false for the actual laws of physics, consisting, presumably, of Einstein's field equations plus energy conditions and, perhaps, some additional restrictions as well. And a proof of the emptiness of the associated concept of a Thornian time machine would take the form of showing that the assertion is false independently of the details of the laws of physics, as long as they take the form of local conditions on Tab and gab.

Recently, John Manchak (2009) has been able to prove that the proposed concept of a time machine isn't empty. He shows that Misner spacetime satisfies the conditions for a time machine as laid out above and thereby establishes that there exist general-relativistic spacetimes, i.e., spacetimes that satisfy Einstein's field equations and that permit the operation of time machines. Energy conditions are automatically satisfied since Misner spacetime is a vacuum solution. Thus, it also rules out a sweeping proof of the physical impossibility of time machines. It remains an open question whether physically more realistic spacetimes also permit the operation of time machines and how generic time-machine spacetimes are in particular spacetime theories, such as general relativity.

If time-machine spacetimes turn out to be highly non-generic, the fan of time machines can retreat to a weaker concept of Thornian time machine by taking a page from probabilistic accounts of causation, the idea being that a time machine can be seen to be at work if its operation increases the probability of the appearance of CTCs. Since general relativity theory itself is innocent of probabilities, they have to be introduced by hand, either by inserting them into the models of the theory, i.e., by modifying the theory at the level of the object-language, or by defining measures on sets of models, i.e., by modifying the theory at the level of the meta-language. Since the former would change the character of the theory, only the latter will be considered. The project for making sense of the notion that a time machine as a probabilistic cause of the appearance of CTCs would then take the following form. First define a normalized measure on the set of models having a partial Cauchy surface to the past of which there are no CTCs. Then show that the subset of models that have CTCs to the future of the partial Cauchy surface has non-zero measure. Next, identify a range of conditions on or near the partial Cauchy surface that are naturally construed as settings of a device that is a would-be probabilistic cause of CTCs, and show that the subset of models satisfying these conditions has non-zero measure. Finally, show that conditionalizing on the latter subset increases the measure of the former subset. Assuming that this formal exercise can be successfully carried out, there remains the task of justifying these as measures of objective chance. This task is especially daunting in the cosmological setting since neither of the leading interpretations of objective chance seems applicable. The frequency interpretation is strained since the development of CTCs may be a non-repeated phenomenon; and the propensity interpretation is equally strained since, barring just-so stories about the Creator throwing darts at the Cosmic Dart Board, there is no chance mechanism for producing cosmological models.

We conclude that, even apart from general doubts about a probabilistic account of causation, the resort to a probabilistic conception of time machines is a desperate stretch, at least in the context of classical general relativity theory. In a quantum theory of gravity, a probabilistic conception of time machines may be appropriate if the theory itself provides the transition probabilities between the relevant states. But an evaluation of this prospect must wait until the theory of quantum gravity is available.

4. No-go results for (Thornian) time machines in classical general relativity theory

In order to appreciate the physics literature aimed at proving no-go results for time machines it is helpful to view these efforts as part of the broader project of proving chronology protections theorems, which in turn is part of a still larger project of proving cosmic censorship theorems. To explain, we start with cosmic censorship and work backwards.

For sake of simplicity, concentrate on the initial value problem for vacuum solutions (Tab ≡ 0) to Einstein's field equations. Start with a three-manifold Σ equipped with quantities which, when Σ is embedded as a spacelike submanifold of spacetime, become initial data for the vacuum field equations. Corresponding to the initial data there exists a unique[20] maximal development (M, gab) for which (the image of the embedded) Σ is a Cauchy surface.[21] This solution, however, may not be maximal simpliciter, i.e., it may be possible to isometrically embed it as a proper part of a larger spacetime, which itself may be a vacuum solution to the field equations; if so Σ will not be a Cauchy surface for the extended spacetime, which fails to be a globally hyperbolic spacetime.[22] This situation can arise because of a poor choice of initial value hypersurface, as illustrated in Figure 3 by taking Σ to be the indicated spacelike hyperboloid of (1 + 1)-dimensional Minkowski spacetime. But, more interestingly, the situation can arise because the Einstein equations allow various pathologies, collectively referred to as “naked singularities,” to develop from regular initial data. The strong form of Penrose's celebrated cosmic censorship conjecture proposes that, consistent with Einstein's field equations, such pathologies do not arise under physically reasonable conditions or else that the conditions leading to the pathologies are highly non-generic within the space of all solutions to the field equations. A small amount of progress has been made on stating and proving precise versions of this conjecture.[23]

One way in which strong cosmic censorship can be violated is through the emergence of acausal features. Returning to the example of Misner spacetime (Figure 1), the spacetime up to H+o) is the unique maximal development of the vacuum Einstein equations for which Σo is a Cauchy surface. But this development is extendible, and in the extension illustrated in Figure 1 global hyperbolicity of the development is lost because of the presence of CTCs. The chronology protection conjecture then can be construed as a subconjecture of the cosmic censorship conjecture, saying, roughly, that consistent with Einstein field equations, CTCs do not arise under physically reasonable conditions or else that the conditions are highly non-generic within the space of all solutions to the field equations. No-go results for time machines are then special forms of chronology protection theorems that deal with cases where the CTCs are manufactured by time machines. In the other direction, a very general chronology protection theorem will automatically provide a no-go result for time machines, however that notion is understood, and a theorem establishing strong cosmic censorship will automatically impose chronology protection.

The most widely discussed chronology protection theorem/no-go result for time machines in the context of classical general relativity theory is due to Hawking (1992a). Before stating the result, note first that, independently of the Einstein field equations and energy conditions, a partial Cauchy surface Σ must be compact if its future Cauchy horizon H+(Σ) is compact (see Hawking 1992a and Chrusciel and Isenberg 1993). However, it is geometrically allowed that Σ is non-compact if H+(Σ) is required only to be compactly generated rather than compact. But what Hawking showed is that this geometrical possibility is ruled out by imposing Einstein's field equations and the weak energy condition. Thus, if Σ0 is a partial Cauchy surface representing the situation just before or just as the would-be Thornian time machine is switched on, and if a necessary condition for seeing a Thornian time machine at work is that H+0) is compactly generated, then consistently with Einstein's field equations and the weak energy condition, a Thornian time machine cannot operate in a spatially open universe since Σ0 must be compact.

This no-go result does not touch the situation illustrated in Figure 1. Taub-NUT spacetime is a vacuum solution to Einstein's field equations so the weak energy condition is automatically satisfied, and H+0) is compact and, a fortiori, compactly generated. Hawking's theorem is not contradicted since Σ0 is compact. By the same token the theorem does not speak to the possibility of operating a Thornian time machine in a spatially closed universe. To help fill the gap, Hawking proved that when Σ0 is compact and H+0) is compactly generated, the Einstein field equations and the weak energy condition together guarantee that both the convergence and shear of the null geodesic generators of H+0) must vanish, which he interpreted to imply that no observers can cross over H+0) to enter the chronology violating region V. But rather than showing that it is physically impossible to operate a Thornian time machine in a closed universe, this result shows only that, given the correctness of Hawking's interpretation, the observers who operate the time machine cannot take advantage of the CTCs it produces.

There are two sources of doubt about the effectiveness of Hawking's no-go result even for open universes. The first stems from possible violations of the weak energy condition by stress-energy tensors arising from classical relativistic matter fields (see Vollick 1997 and Visser and Barcelo 2000).[24] The second stems from the fact that Hawking's theorem functions as a chronology protection theorem only by way of serving as a potential no-go result for Thornian time machines since the crucial condition that H+0) is compactly generated is supposedly justified by being a necessary condition for the operation of such machine. But in retrospect, the motivation for this condition seems frayed. As argued in the previous section, if the Einstein field equations and energy conditions entail that all hole free extensions of D+0) contain CTCs, then it is plausible to see a Thornian time machine at work, quite regardless ofwhether or not H+0) is compactly generated or not. Of course, it remains to establish the existence of cases where this entailment holds. If it should turn out that there are no such cases, then the prospects of Thornian time machines are dealt a severe blow, but the reasons are independent of Hawking's theorem. On the other hand, if such cases do exist then our conjecture would be that they exist even when some of the generators of H+0) come from singularities or infinity and, thus, H+0) is not compactly generated.[25]

5. No-go results in quantum gravity

Three degrees of quantum involvement in gravity can be distinguished. The first degree, referred to as quantum field theory on curved spacetimes, simply takes off the shelf a spacetime provided by general relativity theory and then proceeds to study the behavior of quantum fields on this background spacetime. The Unruh effect, which predicts the thermalization of a free scalar quantum field near the horizon of a black hole, lies within this ambit. The second degree of involvement, referred to as semi-classical quantum gravity, attempts to calculate the backreaction of the quantum fields on spacetime metric by computing the expectation value <Ψ|Tab|Ψ> of the stress-energy tensor in some appropriate quantum state |Ψ> and then inserting the value into Einstein's field equations in place of Tab .[26] Hawking's celebrated prediction of black hole radiation belongs to this ambit.[27] The third degree of involvement attempts to produce a genuine quantum theory of gravity in the sense that the gravitational degrees of freedom are quantized. Currently loop quantum gravity and string theory are the main research programs aimed at this goal.[28]

The first degree of quantum involvement, if not opening the door to Thornian time machines, at least seemed to remove some obstacles since quantum fields are known to lead to violations of the energy conditions used in the setting of classical general relativity theory to prove chronology protection theorems and no-go results for time machines. However, the second degree of quantum involvement seemed, at least initially, to slam the door shut. The intuitive idea was this. Start with a general relativistic spacetime where CTCs develop to the future of H+(Σ) (often referred to as the “chronology horizon”) for some suitable partial Cauchy surface Σ. Find that the propagation of a quantum field on this spacetime background is such that <Ψ|Tab|Ψ> “blows up” as H+(Σ) is approached from the past. Conclude that the backreaction on the spacetime metric creates unbounded curvature, which effectively cuts off the future development that would otherwise eventuate in CTCs. These intuitions were partly vindicated by detailed calculations in several models. But eventually a number of exceptions were found in which the backreaction remains arbitrarily small near H+(Σ).[29] This seemed to leave the door ajar for Thornian time machines.

But fortunes were reversed once again by a result of Kay, Radzikowski, and Wald (1997). The details of their theorem are too technical to review here, but the structure of the argument is easy to grasp. The naïve calculation of <Ψ|Tab|Ψ> results in infinities which have to be subtracted off to produce a renormalized expectation value <Ψ|Tab|Ψ>R with a finite value. The standard renormalization procedure uses a limiting procedure that is mathematically well-defined if, and only if, a certain condition obtains.[30] The KRW theorem shows that this condition is violated for points on H+(Σ) and, thus, that the expectation value of the stress-energy tensor is not well-defined at the chronology horizon.

While the KRW theorem is undoubtedly of fundamental importance for semi-classical quantum gravity, it does not serve as an effective no-go result for Thornian time machines. In the first place, the theorem assumes, in concert with Hawking's chronology protection theorem, that H+(Σ) is compactly generated, and we repeat that it is far from clear that this assumption is necessary for seeing a Thornian time machine in operation. A second, and more fundamental, reservation applies even if a compactly generated H+(Σ) is accepted as a necessary condition for time machines. The KRW theorem functions as a no-go result by providing a reductio ad absurdum with a dubious absurdity: roughly, if you try to operate a Thornian time machine, you will end up invalidating semi-classical quantum gravity. But semi-classical quantum gravity was never viewed as anything more than a stepping stone to a genuine quantum theory of gravity, and its breakdown is expected to be manifested when Planck-scale physics comes into play. This worry is underscored by Visser's (1997, 2003) findings that in chronology violating models trans-Planckian physics can be expected to come into play before H+(Σ) is reached.

It thus seems that if some quantum mechanism is to serve as the basis for chronology protection, it must be found in the third degree of quantum involvement in gravity. Both loop quantum gravity and string theory have demonstrated the ability to cure some of the curvature singularities of classical general relativity theory. But as far as we are aware there are no demonstrations that either of these approaches to quantum gravity can get rid of the acausal features exhibited in various solutions to Einstein's field equations. An alternative approach to formulate a fully-fledged quantum theory of gravity attempts to capture the Planck-scale structure of spacetime by constructing it from causal sets.[31] Since these sets must be acyclic, i.e., no element in a causal set can causally precede itself, CTCs are ruled out a priori. Actually, a theorem due to Malament (1977) suggests that any Planck-scale approach encoding only the causal structure of a spacetime cannot permit CTCs either in the smooth classical spacetimes or a corresponding phenomenon in their quantum counterparts.[32]

In sum, the existing no-go results that use the first two degrees of quantum involvement are not very convincing, and the third degree of involvement is not mature enough to allow useful pronouncements. There is, however, a rapidly growing literature on the possibility of time travel in lower-dimensional supersymmetric cousins of string theory. For a review of these recent results and a discussion of the fate of a time-traveller's ambition in loop quantum gravity, see Smeenk and Wüthrich (2010).

6. Conclusion

Hawking opined that “[i]t seems there is a chronology protection agency, which prevents the appearance of closed timelike curves and so makes the universe safe for historians” (1992a, 603). He may be right, but to date there are no convincing arguments that such an Agency is housed in either classical general relativity theory or in semi-classical quantum gravity. And it is too early to tell whether this Agency is housed in loop quantum gravity or string theory. But even if it should turn out that Hawking is wrong in that the laws of physics do not support a Chronology Protection Agency, it could still be the case that the laws support an Anti-Time Machine Agency. For it could turn out that while the laws do not prevent the development of CTCs, they also do not make it possible to attribute the appearance of CTCs to the workings of any would-be time machine. We argued that a strong presumption in favor of the latter would be created in classical general relativity theory by the demonstration that for any model satisfying Einstein's field equations and energy conditions as well as possessing a partial Cauchy surface Σ0 to the future of which there are CTCs, there are hole free extensions of D+0) satisfying Einstein's field equations and energy conditions but containing no CTCs to the future of Σ0. The strongest such presumption, however, seems to be ruled out by Manchak's result (2009). There are no doubt alternative approaches to understanding what it means for a device to be “responsible for” the development of CTCs. Exploring these alternatives is one place that philosophers can hope to make a contribution to an ongoing discussion that, to date, has been carried mainly by the physics community. Participating in this discussion means that philosophers have to forsake the activity of logical gymnastics with the paradoxes of time travel for the more arduous but (we believe) rewarding activity of digging into the foundations of physics.

Time machines may never see daylight, and perhaps so for principled reasons that stem from basic physical laws. But even if mathematical theorems in the various theories concerned succeed in establishing the impossibility of time machines, understanding why time machines cannot be constructed will shed light on central problems in the foundations of physics. As we have argued in Section 4, for instance, the hunt for time machines in general relativity theory should be interpreted as a core issue in studying the fortunes of Penrose's cosmic censorship conjecture. This conjecture arguably constitutes the most important open problem in general relativity theory. Similarly, as discussed in Section 5, mathematical theorems related to various aspects of time machines offer results relevant for the search of a quantum theory of gravity. In sum, studying the possibilities for operating a time machine turns out to be not a scientifically peripheral or frivolous weekend activity but a useful way of probing the foundations of classical and quantum theories of gravity.


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We thank Carlo Rovelli for discussions and John Norton for comments on an earlier draft. C.W. acknowledges support by the Swiss National Science Foundation (grant PBSK1-102693).