Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Social Norms

First published Tue Mar 1, 2011

Social norms, the customary rules that govern behavior in groups and societies, have been extensively studied in the social sciences. Anthropologists have described how social norms function in different cultures (Geertz 1973), sociologists have focused on their social functions and how they motivate people to act (Durkheim 1950; Parsons 1937, Parsons and Shils 1951; Coleman 1990; Hechter and Opp 2001), and economists have explored how adherence to norms influences market behavior (Akerlof 1976; Young 1998). More recently, also legal scholars have touted social norms as efficient alternatives to legal rules, as they may internalize negative externalities and provide signaling mechanisms at little or no cost (Ellickson 1991; Posner 2000).

With a few exceptions, the social science literature conceives of norms as exogenous variables. Since norms are mainly seen as constraining behavior, some of the important differences between moral, social and legal norms, as well as differences between norms and conventions, have been blurred. Much attention instead has been paid to the conditions under which norms will be obeyed. Because of that, the issue of sanctions has been paramount in the social science literature. Moreover, since social norms are seen as central to the production of social order or social coordination, research on norms has been focused on the functions they perform, and whether they do so efficiently. Yet even if a norm may fulfill important social functions such as welfare maximization or the elimination of externalities, it cannot be explained solely or mainly on the basis of the functions it performs. The simplistic functionalist perspective has been rejected on several accounts since, even if a given norm can be conceived as a means to achieve some social goal, this is usually not the reason why it emerged in the first place (Elster 1989). Moreover, though a particular norm may persist (as opposed to emerge) because of some positive social function it fulfills, there are many others that are inefficient and even widely unpopular.

Philosophers have taken a different approach to norms. In the literature on norms and conventions, both social constructs are seen as the endogenous product of individuals' interactions (Lewis 1969; Ullmann-Margalit 1977; Vandershraaf 1995; Bicchieri 2006). Norms are represented as equilibria of games of strategy, and as such they are supported by a cluster of self-fulfilling expectations. Beliefs, expectations, group knowledge and common knowledge have thus become central concepts in the development of a philosophical view of social norms. Paying attention to the role played by expectations in supporting social norms has helped differentiate between social norms, conventions, and descriptive norms, an important distinction often overlooked in the social science accounts.

1. Introduction

Social norms, like many other social phenomena, are the unplanned, unexpected result of individuals' interactions. It has been argued (Bicchieri 2006) that social norms ought to be understood as a kind of grammar of social interactions. Like a grammar, a system of norms specifies what is acceptable and what is not in a society or group. And analogously to a grammar, it is not the product of human design and planning. This view suggests that a study of the conditions under which norms come into being, as opposed to one stressing the functions fulfilled by social norms, is important in order to understand the differences between social norms and other types of injunction, such as hypothetical imperatives, moral codes or legal rules.

Another important issue often blurred in the literature on norms is the relationship between normative beliefs and behavior. Some authors identify norms with observable, recurrent patterns of behavior. Others only focus on normative beliefs and expectations. All find it difficult to explain the observed variance in norm-induced behavior, and each offers an explanation of conformity that is at best partial. Though a purely behavioral account of norms is difficult to support, it is also true that normative beliefs alone cannot support a norm.

There are three main canonical theories of conformity: socialization, social identity and rational choice. Since all these theories make testable statements about conforming behavior, they should be evaluated in light of a large body of experimental evidence on whether and how normative beliefs affect behavior. Such evidence, however, shows that all three theories are deficient; their definitions of what is a norm are too rigid and limited to account for the rich landscape of norm-induced behavior. Alternative views take a different approach, considering norms as clusters of self-fulfilling expectations (Schelling 1966). Such expectations result in behavior that reinforces them, but a crucial element in sustaining the norm is the presence of conditional preferences for conformity. Only the joint presence of a conditional preference for conformity and the belief that other people will conform will produce an agreement between normative beliefs and behavior (Bicchieri 2006)

Since the norms that are interesting to study are those that emerge without planning or design from individuals' interactions (Schelling 1978), one important theoretical task is to analyze the conditions under which such norms come into being. Because norms are so often meant to represent a solution to the problem of attaining and maintaining social order, and social order requires cooperation, the main focus of studies trying to model the emergence and dynamics of norms has focused on norms of cooperation. Norms of honesty, loyalty, reciprocity and promise keeping, to name but a few cooperative norms, are crucial to the smooth functioning of social groups. One hypothesis is that they emerge in small, close-knit groups in which people have ongoing interactions with each other (Hardin 1982, Bicchieri 1993). Evolutionary game theory makes possible a more rigorous statement of this hypothesis, since repeated games are a useful if simplistic approximation of life in a close-knit group (Axelrod 1984, 1986; Skyrms 1996; Gintis 2000). The traditional game-theoretic framework has been expanded with an account of learning in repeated games. In repeated encounters, people have an opportunity to learn from each other's behavior, and to secure a pattern of reciprocity that minimizes the likelihood of misperception. To be effective, norms of reciprocity, like other cooperative norms, must be simple. Delayed and disproportionate punishment, as well as belated reward, are difficult to understand and, for this very reason, often ineffective. The cooperative norms that are likely to develop in close-knit groups are simple ones, and this prediction is easily put to test (Alexander 2000, 2005, 2007).

Though norms develop in small, close-knit groups, they often spread well beyond the narrow boundaries of the original group. The challenge thus becomes one of explaining the dynamics of the propagation of norms from small groups to populations. Evolutionary models have been introduced to account for the propagation of norms (Skyrms 1996, 2004; Alexander 2007; Gintis 2000).

If norms can thrive and spread, they can also die out. A poorly understood phenomenon is the sudden and unexpected change of well-established patterns of behavior (Mackie 1996). For example, smoking in public without asking for permission is quickly becoming unacceptable, and only a few years ago nobody would have worried about using gender-laden language. One would expect inefficient norms (such as discriminatory norms against women and minorities) to disappear more rapidly and with greater frequency than more efficient ones. However, Bicchieri (2006) points out that inefficiency is not a sufficient condition for a norm's demise: instead, it is only a necessary condition. This can best be seen by the study of corruption. There are many examples, past and present, of uniformly corrupt societies. Corruption fosters huge social costs, but costs—even when they take a society to the brink of collapse—are not enough to generate an overhaul of the system. Bicchieri and Rovelli (1995) have demonstrated that corruption can be an unstable equilibrium in a fixed population. In more realistic settings, in which the population is variable, Bicchieri and Duffy (1997) show that a society can cycle between ‘honest’ and corrupt social norms, without a single stable state.

2. Norms and efficiency

Some popular accounts of why social norms exist are the following: Norms are efficient means to achieve social welfare (Arrow 1971, Akerlof 1976), prevent market failures (Coleman 1989) or cut social costs (Thibaut and Kelley 1959, Homans 1961); norms are either Nash equilibria of coordination games or cooperative equilibria of prisoner's dilemma-type games (Lewis 1969, Ullmann-Margalit 1977), and as such they solve collective action problems.

Ackerlof's analysis of the norms that regulate land systems and of the evolution of sharecropping is a good example of the tenet that norms are efficient means to achieve social welfare. Since the sharecropper is much poorer and less liquid than the landlord (he does not own land to be mortgaged), it would be more natural for the landlord rather than the tenant to bear the risk of crop failure. This would be the case if the landlord paid the tenant a wage and sold the crops. There are two components to the sharecropper's input: the time he puts in and the effort expended. Time put in is easy to observe and can be paid a fixed wage. Effort cannot be observed without careful supervision of labor. Suppose effort (e) can be measured. With a wage system, the wage would be w = w (e, t), since the sharecropper's output depends on his effort and the time he puts in. But without supervision, effort cannot be determined. So the wage paid will depend on the average effort of the average worker, i.e., w = w (e', t). This leaves no incentive to the worker for any effort beyond the minimum necessary to be paid for his time. If he dislikes effort, he will minimize it. In sharecropping, on the contrary, the worker is paid both for the effort and the time he puts in. Time and effort are imperfectly estimated from an indicator: the output produced. Whenever supervision is needed for other reasons (as in capital-intensive plantation crops), we can expect a wage system to emerge.

Thibaut and Kelley's view of norms as substitutes for informal influence has a similar functionalist flavor. As an example, they consider a repeated battle of the sexes game. In this game some bargaining is necessary for each party to obtain, at least occasionally, the preferred outcome. The parties can engage in a costly sequence of threats and promises, but it seems better to agree beforehand upon some rule for trading, such as alternating between the respectively preferred outcomes. Rules emerge because they reduce the costs involved in face-to-face personal influence. Likewise, Ullman-Margalit (1977) uses game theory to show that norms solve collective action problems, such as prisoner's dilemma-type situations; in her own words, “… a norm solving the problem inherent in a situation of this type is generated by it” (p. 22). In a collective action problem, rational choices produce a Pareto-inefficient outcome. Pareto-efficiency is restored by means of norms backed by sanctions. Coleman, too, believes that norms emerge in situations in which there are externalities, i.e., in all those cases in which an activity produces positive or negative effects on other people that typically have no legal means to enforce the continuation/cessation of the activity. Thus the producer of the externality pays no cost/reaps no benefit for the additional effect of his activity. A norm solves the problem by prescribing or proscribing the externality-producing action. The simplest example is a repeated prisoner's dilemma, in which the cooperative action of one player produces a positive externality for the other. Thus each has an incentive to induce cooperation in the other player by establishing a cooperative norm, i.e., a set of sanctions punishing defection and rewarding cooperation.

All of the above are examples of a functionalist explanation of norms. Functionalists make a typical post hoc, ergo propter hoc fallacy, since the mere presence of a social norm does not justify inferring that it is there to accomplish some social function. This view of norms does not account for the fact that many social norms are highly inefficient, as in the case of discriminatory norms against women or norms of racial segregation, or are so rigid as to prevent the fine-tuning that would be necessary to accommodate new cases successfully. Besides, many norms that increase the welfare of the members of a certain group simultaneously damage outsiders to that group, as is the case with norms of loyalty among the Mafia.

Even if a norm is a means to achieve a social end, such as cooperation, retribution, or fairness, usually it is not the sole means. Many social norms are underdetermined with respect to the collective objectives they may serve, nor can they be ordered according to a criterion of greater or lesser efficiency in meeting these goals. Such an ordering would be feasible only if it were possible to show that one norm among others is the best means to attain a given social objective. The problem is that the objectives themselves are defined by means of some norm, as is the case, for example, with norms of revenge and fairness criteria. Though norms have many social functions, one should not confuse function and cause. Function and cause can be identified only in those cases in which an institution has been planned and designed to perform a given function. Social norms (as opposed to, say, legal rules), however, are the unintentional and unplanned outcome of human interaction. We can explain their emergence without any reference to the functions they eventually come to perform.

3. Theories of norms and their force

In almost all the literature on norms, it is unquestionably assumed that norms elicit conformity, and that there is a strong correlation between people's normative beliefs and their behavior. By normative beliefs is usually meant individual or collective beliefs about what sort of behavior is prescribed (or proscribed) in a given social context. Normative beliefs are habitually accompanied by the expectation that other people will follow the prescribed behavior and avoid the proscribed one. Yet it is not obvious that having normative beliefs will induce people to act in a way consistent with them. Whether there can be normative beliefs at variance with behavior, and if so, why, is a question we need to answer in order to provide a satisfactory account of norms.

A norm cannot simply be identified with a recurrent, collective behavioral pattern. If we were to adopt a purely behavioral account of norms, nothing would distinguish shared fairness criteria from, say, the collective morning habit of tooth cleaning. Avoiding a purely behavioral definition means focusing on the role expectations play in supporting those kinds of collective behaviors we take to be norms. After all, one cleans her teeth whether or not she expects others to do the same, but she would not even try to ask for a salary proportionate to her education if she expected her coworkers to go by the rule of giving to each proportionately to seniority. Furthermore, there are behaviors that can only be explained by the existence of norms, even if the behavior prescribed by the norm in question is never observed. In his study of the Ik, Turnbull (1972) reports that these starved hunters-gatherers tried hard to avoid situations where their compliance with norms of reciprocity was expected. Thus they would go out of their way not to be in the position of gift-taker, and hunted alone and in secret not to be forced to share their prey with anyone they encountered as they hunted. Much of Ik's behavior could be explained as a successful attempt at eluding existing reciprocity norms. Norms can hold a great amount of sway in a population, even when we never see the corresponding behaviors that the norm is meant to elicit.

As Turnbull's example shows, having normative beliefs and expecting others to behave according to a given norm does not always result in norm-abiding behavior. Simply focusing on norms as clusters of expectations might thus be misleading, as there are many examples of discrepancies between normative expectations and behavior. Take the widely acknowledged norm of self-interest (Miller and Ratner 1996); it is remarkable to observe how often people expect others to act selfishly, even when they are prepared to act altruistically themselves. For example, studies show that people's willingness to give blood is not altered by monetary incentives, but typically those very people who are willing to donate blood for free expect others to donate blood only in the presence of a sufficient monetary reward. Similarly, when asked whether they would rent an apartment to an unmarried couple, all landlords interviewed answered positively, but they estimated that only 50% of other landlords would accept an unmarried couple as tenants (Dawes 1974). Such cases of pluralistic ignorance are rather common; what is puzzling is that people may expect a given norm to be upheld in the absence of information about other people's conforming behavior and in the face of personal evidence to the contrary (Bicchieri and Fukui 1999). One might suspect that in all the cases mentioned the individuals involved—though believing in the existence of a norm—were not themselves “in its grip”. However, there is much evidence showing that people who donate blood, tip on a foreign trip, give money to beggars or return a lost wallet full of cash often attempt to underplay their altruistic behavior by supplying selfish motives that make their actions acceptable as conforming to a self-interest norm (Wuthnow 1991).

If a purely behavioral definition of norms is deficient, and one solely based upon expectations is questionable, what are we left with? We must realize that the semantic vagueness surrounding the concept of norm is common to all social constructs. There is no necessary and sufficient condition for being a norm, just a cluster of characteristics that any norm can display to a greater or lesser extent. Norms refer to behavior, to actions over which people have control, and are supported by shared expectations about what should or should not be done in different types of social situations. Norms, however, cannot be just identified with observable behavior, nor can they be equated with normative beliefs, as normative beliefs may or may not result in appropriate action.

The varying degrees of correlation between normative expectations and actions are an important factor to differentiate among various types of norms, and to critically assess three major theories about the relationship between normative beliefs and actions. These theories are: (1) the socialized actor theory, (2) the social identity theory, and (3) the rational choice model of conformity.

4. Socialization

In the theory of the socialized actor (Parsons 1951), an individual action is equated with a choice among several alternatives. Human action is understood within a utilitarian framework as instrumentally oriented and utility maximizing. Though a utilitarian setting does not necessarily imply a view of human motives as essentially egoistic, this is the preferred interpretation of utilitarianism adopted by Talcott Parsons and much contemporary sociology. It then becomes crucial to explain by which mechanisms social order and stability are attained in a society that would naturally be in a permanent Hobbesian state of nature. Order and stability are essentially socially derived phenomena, brought about by a common value system—the “cement” of society. The common values of a society are embodied in norms that, when conformed to, guarantee the orderly functioning and reproduction of the social system. In the Parsonian framework, norms are exogenous: how is a common value system created, and how it may change and why, are issues left unexplored. The most important question is rather how norms get to be followed, and what prompts rational egoists to abide by them. The theory of the socialized actor's answer is that people voluntarily adhere to the shared value system because it is introjected to form a constitutive element of the personality itself (Parsons 1951).

In Parsons' own words, a norm is “a verbal description of a concrete course of action, … , regarded as desirable, combined with an injunction to make certain future actions conform to this course” (1937: 75). Norms play a crucial role in individual choice since—by shaping individual needs and preferences—they serve as criteria for selecting among alternatives. Such criteria are shared by a given community, and embody a common value system. People may choose what they prefer, but what they prefer in turn conforms to social expectations. Norms influence behavior because, through a process of socialization that starts in infancy, they become part of one's motives for action: conformity to standing norms is a stable acquired disposition that is independent of the consequences of conforming. Such lasting dispositions are formed by long-term interactions with significant others (usually parents); through repeated socialization, individuals come to learn and internalize the common values embodied in the norms. Internalization is conceived as the process by which people develop a psychological need or motive to conform to a set of shared norms. When norms are internalized, norm-abiding behavior will be perceived as good or appropriate, and people will typically feel guilt or shame at the prospect of behaving in a deviant way. If internalization is successful, external sanctions will play no role in eliciting conformity, and since individuals are motivated to conform, it follows that normative beliefs and actions will be consistent.

Though Parsons' analysis of social systems starts with a theory of individual action, he views social actors as acting according to roles that define—through internalization and socialization—their self-identities and behaviors. The end of individual actions is to reach maximum satisfaction, which is defined in terms of seeking approval and avoiding disapproval. By making the common value system prior to and constraining the social actor, the potential conflict between individual desires and collective goals is resolved. The price of this solution is the disappearance of the individual actor as the basic unit of analysis. Insofar as individuals are role-bearers, in Parsons' theory it is social entities that act, entities that are completely detached from the individual actions that created them. This consideration forms the basis for most of the criticisms raised against the theory of the socialized actor (Wrong 1961). Such criticisms are typically rather abstract, as they are cast in the framework of the holism/individualism controversy. As far as we are aware, none of the critics has ever tried to control whether the main empirical conclusions about behavior that can be drawn from the socialized actor's theory—in particular, from the theory of how a normative orientation is acquired—are in fact supported by evidence.

Parsons' theory is still used by sociologists to explain recurrent social behavioral patterns as due to socialization, which produces motives or dispositions to act in the observed way. Given the widespread explanatory use of the theory, one is justified in treating it as a set of testable empirical assertions. There are a several such statements we can infer from the theory of the socialized actor, e.g., (a) Norms will change very slowly and only through intensive social interaction; (b) Normative beliefs are positively correlated to actions. Whenever such beliefs will change, behavior will follow; (c) If a norm is successfully internalized, expectations of others' conformity will have no effect on an individual's choice to conform.

Some of the above statements are not supported by evidence drawn from social psychology. For example, studies of co-variation of normative beliefs/attitudes and behavior show that there may not be a relation between what people claim they should or would do, and what they in fact do. In general, these studies have examined a large class of attitudes, where by “attitude” is meant “evaluative feelings of pro or con, favorable or unfavorable, with regard to particular objects”; the objects may be “concrete representations of things or actions, or abstract concepts” (Insko and Schopler 1967: 361–362). The concept of attitude is quite broad: it includes normative beliefs about how people should behave in given situations and what counts as good/acceptable behavior, but it also comprises personal opinions and preferences. The psychological assumption of many such studies is that since attitudes are evaluative predispositions, they have consequences for the way people act, especially in social situations.

However, a series of prominent field experiments, dating back to 1934, provided evidence contrary to the assumption that attitudes and behaviors are closely related. LaPiere (1934) famously reported a sharp divergence between the widespread anti-Chinese attitudes in the United States and the tolerant behavior he witnessed. Many other studies have pointed to inconsistencies between an individual's stated normative beliefs and her actions (Wicker 1969). Several reasons may account for the discrepancy. For example, studies about ethnic prejudice indicate that normative beliefs are more likely to determine behavior in close and long-lasting relationships and least likely to determine behavior in the transient situations typical of experimental studies (Harding et al. 1969; Gaertner and Dovidio 1986). Warner and DeFleur (1969) report that when overt behaviors involving blacks were highly visible to a community opposing integration, low-prejudice subjects were much more willing to engage in behaviors that maintained social status differences between whites and blacks than to engage in behaviors that reduced status differences. In this study, it seems that the main variable affecting behavior is not what an individual personally feels he should do, but rather his belief about what “society” (i.e., most other people, his reference group, etc.) says he should do.

When the results of social psychologists' research on attitudes and behavior are lumped together, we are left with little evidence to support the claim that an individual's normative beliefs influence his actions. Such studies, however, do not discriminate among different types of normative beliefs, whereas a careful differentiation might help to determine which normative beliefs—if any—present a positive correlation with behavior. For example, when a distinction is made between personal normative beliefs and social normative beliefs, it becomes apparent that only the second group of beliefs positively correlates with behavior (Fishbein 1967). In experimental work on norm-compliance (Bicchieri and Xiao 2009, Bicchieri and Chavez 2010), it appears that individuals' actions tend to be at odds with what are understood as shared norms only when (a) other people are not expected to follow the norm, and/or (b) the normative beliefs are not perceived to be collectively shared in the present situation. On the contrary, whenever individuals believe they are expected by their group (or society at large) to behave according to a given standard, and also expect the norm to be generally followed, they usually comply. Only those normative beliefs that people perceive to be collectively shared and put into practice seem to matter to behavior.

Note that the above-mentioned studies presuppose that norms, as beliefs about what behavior ought to be followed, can be measured independently of action by asking people to state their normative beliefs. This idea has its merits, but it should be qualified. To assess the existence of a norm, it is important to ask people not just what their personal normative beliefs are, but what they expect other's normative beliefs to be. There is indeed a difference between personal normative beliefs such as “John believes that he ought to divide the money equally”, and normative expectations, such as “John believes that others think he ought to divide the money fairly and may punish him if he does not”. Only when we observe widespread convergence of normative expectations can we say a norm is in place (Bicchieri and Chavez 2010). Yet the fact that a norm exists does not mean it will be followed. Normative expectations, per se, are not sufficient to induce compliance. If one observes widespread transgressions, the force of normative expectations will be greatly diminished, as experimental evidence demonstrates (Bicchieri and Xiao 2009). To be effective, normative expectations must be accompanied by the belief that most people in fact obey the norm. There is extensive experimental evidence that individuals prefer to conform to a norm on condition that both these expectations, empirical and normative, are met (Bicchieri 2006).

What we just said represents an important criticism of the socialization view. If norms were to directly affect behavior, as Parsons would have it, we should observe a high correlation between all types of normative beliefs and behavior, independently of whether other group members are expected to conform or whether the norm is perceived to be collectively shared. According to Parsons, once a norm is internalized people are motivated to conform by an internal sanctioning system, irrespective of the external consequences that conforming behavior may bring about. However, we only observe a correlation between people's choices and (a) what they think other people believe ought to be done (normative expectations) and (b) what they expect others in the same situation to do (empirical expectations). In other words, a verbal assessment of an individual's personal normative beliefs has little predictive value regarding his choices. Only when personal normative beliefs coincide with what one thinks others will do and believe should be done we have a strong correlation with actual choices.

Another interpretation of Parsonian norms is, however, possible. One cannot deny that there exist norms that our society has internalized to the point that almost no variance exists in norm-induced behaviors. Such norms are typically proscriptive, and as such not likely to be correlated with observable behavior. For example, a norm against killing someone who stomps over one's foot in a crowded bus is never observed precisely because people usually do not engage in that sort of behavior. Moreover, such behavior is not even conceived as an option, as the mere thought of it would spawn feelings of anguish and guilt in most of us. Parsonian norms are internalized to the point that their existence can be elicited only when the norm is violated, and conformity to such norms is clearly unconditional. In this sense, such norms seem to coincide with moral norms, insofar as we understand moral norms to be internalized, unconditional imperatives. Social norms instead are conditional, and compliance crucially depends on having the right kind of expectations in the appropriate situation.

Another indication that the socialization theory lacks generality is the observation that norms can change rather quickly, and that new norms often emerge in a short period of time among complete strangers (Mackie 1996). Long-term, intensive and close interaction does not seem to be necessary for a person to acquire a given normative disposition, as is testified by the relative ease with which individuals learn new norms when they change status or social group (e.g., from single to married, from student to faculty, etc.). Moreover, studies of emergent social and political groups show that in such groups new norms form rather rapidly and that the demise of old patterns of behavior is often sudden and unexpected. Studies as disparate as the analysis of Prohibition support (Robinson 1932), racial integration (O'Gorman 1986), the sexual revolution in the 1960s (Klassen et al. 1989), alcohol use on campus (Prentice and Miller 1993) and the behavior of gang members (Matza 1964) all lend credibility to a model of norms grounded on individuals' empirical and normative expectations of what others will do and believe should be done. Once these expectations are no longer met, the norm quickly decays (Mackie 1996; Bicchieri 1999, 2006). One is compelled to conclude that there is little empirical support for the theory of the socialized actor and the view of social norms that accompanies it, at least if we take it to be a general, all-encompassing theory of norms.

5. Social identity

The theory of the socialized actor assumes that norms affect action by becoming part of an individual' preferences and goals. In this case, ongoing social relationships such as group memberships can have only marginal effect on behavior. Against this tendency towards over-socializing human action, it has been argued that most behavior is closely embedded in a network of personal relations, and that a theory of norms cannot leave the specific social context out of consideration (Granovetter 1985). Critics of the socialization view call therefore for an alternative conception of norms capable, among other things, to account for the often-weak relation between beliefs and behavior (Deutscher 1973). This alternative approach takes social relations to be crucial in explaining social action and views social identity as a key motivating factor. A strong support for this view among anthropologists is to be found in the work of Cancian (1975) on the normative beliefs that are held by the Zinacanteco Indians, and how such beliefs correlate with behavior.

Since the concept of social identity is inextricably linked to that of group behavior, it is important to clarify the relation between these concepts. By ‘social identity’ we refer, in Tajfel's own words, to “that part of an individual's self-concept which derives from his knowledge of his membership of a social group (or groups) together with the value and emotional significance attached to that membership” (Tajfel 1981, p. 255). Note that a crucial feature of the concept of social identity is that identification with a group is in some sense a conscious choice: one may accidentally belong to a group, but it is only when being a group member becomes at least partly constitutive of who one is that we can meaningfully talk of social identifications.

According to Tajfel's theory, when we categorize ourselves as belonging to a particular group, the perception and definition of the self, as well as our motives, change. We start perceiving ourselves and our fellow group-members along impersonal, ‘typical’ dimensions that characterize the group to which we belong. Such dimensions include specific roles, and the beliefs/actions that accompany them.

Turner's ‘self-categorization theory’ (1987) provided a more specific characterization of self-perception, or self-definition, as a system of cognitive self-schemata that filter and process information, and output a representation of the social situation that guides the choice of appropriate behavior. This system has at least two major components, social and personal identity. Social identity refers to self-descriptions related to group memberships. Personal identity refers to more personal self-descriptions, such as individual character traits, abilities and tastes. Though personal and social identities are mutually exclusive levels of self-definition, this distinction must be taken as an approximation. There are many interconnections between social and personal identity, and even personal identity has a social component. It is, however, important to recognize that sometimes we perceive ourselves primarily in terms of our relevant group memberships rather than as differentiated, unique individuals. Depending on the situation, personal or group identity will become salient (Brewer 1991). For example, when one makes interpersonal comparisons between self and other group members, personal identity will become salient, whereas group identity will be salient in situations in which one's group is compared to another group. Within a group, all those factors that lead members to categorize themselves as different and endowed with special characteristics and traits are enhancing personal identity. If a group is solving a common task, but each member will be rewarded according to his contribution, personal abilities are highlighted and individuals will perceive themselves as unique and different from the rest of the group. Conversely, if all group members equally share the reward for a jointly performed task, group identification is going to be enhanced. When the difference between self and fellow group members is accentuated, we are likely to observe selfish motives and self-favoritism against other group members. When instead group identification is enhanced, in-group favoritism against out-group members will be activated, as well as behavior contrary to self-interest.

According to Turner, social identity is basically a cognitive mechanism whose adaptive function is to make group behavior possible. Whenever social identification becomes salient, a cognitive mechanism of categorization is activated that produces perceptual and behavioral changes. Such categorization is called a stereotype, the prototypical description of what members of a given category are (or are believed to be). It is a cluster of physical, mental and psychological characteristics attributed to a ‘typical’ member of a given group. Stereotyping, like any other categorization process, activates scripts or schemata, and what we call group behavior is nothing but scripted behavior. For example, the category “Asian student” is associated with a cluster of behaviors, personality traits and values. We often think of Asian students as respectful, diligent, disciplined, and especially good with technical subjects. When thinking of an Asian student solely in terms of her group membership, we attribute her the stereotypical characteristics associated with her group, so she becomes interchangeable with other group members. When we perceive people in terms of stereotypes, we depersonalize them and see them as ‘typical’ members of their group. The same process is at work when we perceive ourselves as group members. Self-stereotyping is a cognitive shift from perceiving oneself as unique and differentiated to perceiving oneself in terms of the attributes that characterize the group. It is this cognitive shift that mediates group behavior.

Group behavior, as opposed to individual behavior, is characterized by distinctive features such as perceived similarity between group members, cohesiveness, the tendency to cooperate to achieve common goals, shared attitudes and beliefs and conformity to group norms. Once an individual self-categorizes as member of a group, she will perceive herself as ‘depersonalized’ and similar to other group members in the stereotypical dimensions linked to the relevant social categorization. Insofar as group members perceive their interests and goals as identical—because such interests and goals are stereotypical attributes of the group—self-stereotyping will induce a group member to embrace such interests and goals as her own, and act to further them. It is thus predicted that pro-social behavior will be enhanced by group membership, and diluted when people act in an individualistic mode (Brewer 1979).

The groups with which we happen to identify ourselves may be very large, as when one self-defines as Muslim or French, or as small as a friends' group. Some very general group identities may not involve specific norms, but there are many cases in which group identification and social norms are inextricably connected, as often groups develop their own special norms. In that case, group members believe that certain patterns of behavior are unique to them, and use their distinctive norms to define group membership. Many close-knit groups, such as the Amish or the Hasidic Jews, enforce norms of separation proscribing marriage and intimate relationships with outsiders, as well as specific dress codes and a host of other prescriptive and proscriptive norms that make the group unique and differentiate it from out-groups. In this case, once an individual perceives herself as a group member, she will adhere to the group prototype and behave in accordance with it. Hogg and Turner (1987) called the process through which individuals come to conform to such group norms referent informational influence. Group-specific norms have, among other things, the twofold function of minimizing perceived differences among group members and maximizing differences between the group and outsiders. Once formed, such norms become stable cognitive representations of appropriate behavior as a group member. Social identity is built around group characteristics and behavioral standards, hence any perceived lack of conformity to group norms is seen as a threat to the legitimacy of the group. Self-categorization accentuates the similarities between one's behavior and that prescribed by the group norm, thus causing conformity as well as the disposition to control and punish in-group members that transgress group norms. In this view, group norms are obeyed because one identifies with the group, and conformity is mediated by self-categorization as an in-group member. A telling (but not uncommon) historical example of the relationship between norms and group-membership was the division of England into the two parties of the Roundheads and Cavaliers. Charles Mackay reports that “In those days every species of vice and iniquity was thought by the Puritans to lurk in the long curly tresses of the monarchists, while the latter imagined that their opponents were as destitute of wit, of wisdom, and of virtue, as they were of hair. A man's locks were a symbol of his creed, both in politics and religion. The more abundant the hair, the more scant the faith; and the balder the head, the more sincere the piety” (Extraordinary popular delusions, 1841: 351).

In the social identity framework, norms are defined as collective (as opposed to personal) beliefs about what actions are appropriate in a group-membership context. As Homans stated, norms are just shared beliefs; they are not behavior itself, but what people think behavior ought to be (Homans 1950, 1961). In this sense, this definition of norms is much closer to the normative/empirical expectations view adopted by Bicchieri (2006). The difference lies in the account of motivation; in the social identity version, people conform to norms to validate their identity as group members. Note that ‘wanting to validate one's identity’ may mean several things. On the one hand, identifying with a particular ethnic or geographical group might hold the promise of future tangible rewards; membership can thus be seen as a rational choice, strictly motivated by self-interested considerations. Obeying group norms thus becomes the outward sign of one's good standing as a group member, and a crucial step in reclaiming the rewards provided by group membership. At other times, however, group memberships' benefits are more elusive: Tajfel's study of “minimal groups” (Tajfel 1973) suggest that social identity effects may occur even in the absence of the tangible or intangible rewards that membership in an established group affords. There is a difference between motives ultimately derived from self-interest and those derived from concern for the interests and outcomes of a group. Identification with a valued group may thus stem from individual or collective welfare considerations: one may want to belong to a group because of the prospect of future personal rewards, or just because one values the group and takes the group's goals and interests as one's own, even at the cost of overlooking or restricting individual gains.

Be it as it may, it follows that norms do not need to be internalized in order to affect action. Conformity to norms is conditional: people would stop conforming to a norm if there were doubts or disagreements about a particular group's identifying characteristics, thus questioning the group's ability to validate a particular identity, or when a group is abandoned for a new one. The fierce disputes common to the first Christian groups are an example of the first challenge to conformity (Pagel 2003), whereas changes in social status, such as the passage from student to faculty, are an example of the second.

A criticism of the socialization model consisted in showing that only socially shared normative beliefs (or normative expectations) are usually associated with behavior, whereas personal ones may not. The social identity model underscores this point, as it claims that only beliefs that are perceived to be shared by a relevant group will affect action, whereas personal normative beliefs may fail to do so. So if an individual believes it is a good thing to live in a racially mixed neighborhood, he may or may not act on his belief. However, if that same individual perceives that his friends will frown on him if he does not choose to live in a racially integrated neighborhood, he will act consistently with his belief (Cancian 1975). Norms thus tend to be consistent with action, but within the framework of acts that are defined as meaningful, appropriate, or desirable by a group of reference.

If people are motivated to conform by their desire to acquire or maintain a given social identity, it follows that they are not committed to any given norm, but to the identity that a norm supports. Suppose that one's identity as a teacher is defined by what the relevant reference group expects a teacher to do. A person who cares about that particular role will then act in conformity to the group's expectations because she wants the group to validate her identity. Again, what remains to be explained is the desire attributed to people to acquire and maintain a social identity. Such desire might not be primitive, as one may desire instead the rewards that accompany performance according to a certain role. For example, wanting to be identified as a good employee may just mean that one wants to obtain all the material and psychological rewards that accompany good work performance. On the other hand, there are situations in which there are no tangible, foreseeable rewards, and still people act in conformity with group norms, as is the case with emergent political movements (Hirschman 1982).

Given the commitment to an identity, conformity to a norm does not involve internalization. Thus a new norm can be quickly adopted without much interaction, and beliefs about identity validation may change very rapidly under the pressure of external circumstances. Consider what being a successful, competent male meant in the fifties. In those years a popular icon was a Humphrey Bogart type that, among other things, was never observed without a cigarette in his mouth. Now it means leading a healthy lifestyle that may include running, vegetarianism, and abstinence from drinking and smoking.

There are several consequences one can draw from the social identity theory of norms. Insofar as norms are shared, collective beliefs of what actions are appropriate in what class of situations, they will be consistent with actions, at least until the individual wants to belong and be identified with a particular group that adopts the norms in question. Yet a change in social status and/or group membership will bring about a change in the norms relevant to the new status/group. In this sense, not just norm compliance, but norms themselves are potentially unstable.

Results from social psychology and behavioral experiments support the hypothesis that only collectively shared normative beliefs, and not personal ones, matter to behavior (Cialdini et al. 1991; Bicchieri and Xiao, 2009). In this sense, the social identity view rightly highlights the importance of shared beliefs. There are, however, several difficulties inherent in the use of the concept of social identity to explain conformity to norms. Such difficulties become apparent in the experimental literature on cooperative behavior in social dilemmas.

In a typical social dilemma, a group of people attempts to obtain a common good in the absence of central authority (Olson 1971). Each individual has two choices: either to contribute to the common good, or to free-ride on the work of others. All individuals share equally in the common good, regardless of their actions. However, each cooperator increases the amount of the common good by a fixed amount, but receives only a fraction of that amount in return. Since the cost of cooperating is greater than the marginal benefit, it is rational for each individual to defect. Everyone faces the same choice, therefore all rational agents will defect and the common good will not be produced. The individually rational strategy of weighing costs against benefits results in an inferior outcome for all. Environmental pollution, population explosion, nuclear arm proliferation, conservation of electricity and giving to charity are all examples of situations where an individual benefits by not contributing to the common cause, but if all individuals free ride, everyone is worse off.

In the experimental literature on social dilemmas, the search for mechanisms that elicit cooperative behavior has included the use of the concept of social identity (Dawes 1980; Brewer and Schneider 1990). In these studies it is argued that, once identification with a group has been established through pre-play communication, cooperation and the willingness to sacrifice one's selfish goals for the sake of the group will characterize intra-group behavior. For example, it has been shown that the cooperation rate averaged 69% when discussion among group members was allowed, but it declined to a meager 34% in the absence of discussion (Dawes 1991). The hypothesis was that group discussion would induce identification with the group, and thus elicit cooperative behavior. Face to face group discussion, however, may help group members to gather important information about each other, and this very information may induce them to trust each other and thus to cooperate, without the need to assume group identity has been created (Bicchieri and Lev-On 2007). Furthermore, it has been conclusively shown that the topic of conversation matters to subsequent cooperation. Only when participants are allowed to discuss the game, and make public promises to cooperate, do we observe a high degree of subsequent cooperation. Collective promising, and the resulting focus on a norm of promise-keeping, seems to be the crucial factor in eliciting cooperation (Bicchieri 2002).

Cooperative outcomes can thus be explained without making use of the social identity concept. A social identity explanation would make more sense in a relatively stable context in which individuals have had time to make emotional investments or, at least, can expect repeated future interactions with the same group. In artificial lab settings, where there are no expectations of future interactions, the concept of social identity seems less persuasive as an explanation of the observed rates of cooperation. Social identity, however, does play a role in experimental settings in which participants are divided into separate groups. In that case, it has been shown that participants start categorizing the situation as “we” versus “them”, activating in-group loyalty and trust, and an equal degree of mistrust toward the out-group (Kramer and Brewer 1984; Bornstein and Ben-Yossef 1994).

Even with stable environments and repeated interactions, however, an explanation of norm compliance in terms of social identity cannot avoid the difficulty of explaining what happens when one is simultaneously committed to different identities. We may concurrently be workers, parents, spouses and friends, club members and party affiliates, to name but a few of the possible identities we embrace. For each of them, there are rules that define what is appropriate, acceptable or good behavior. In the social identity view, however, it is not clear what happens when one is committed to different identities that may involve conflicting behaviors. Will one identity override all others? Or is it not the case that often norms are negotiated precisely to avoid a conflict of loyalties? For example, rules that have traditionally defined good performance in the workplace may be modified when a sufficient number of women enter a firm. The flexibility and negotiation potential of norms, however, are not taken into consideration by the social identity theorists.

Finally, there is ample evidence that people's perceptions may change very rapidly. Since in the social identity framework group norms are defined as shared perceptions about group beliefs, one would expect that—whenever all members of a group happen to believe that others have changed their beliefs about, say, core membership rules—the very norms that define membership will change. The study of fashion, fads and speculative bubbles shows quite clearly that there are areas of social interaction in which rapid (and possibly disruptive) changes of collective expectations may occur. It is, however, much less clear what sort of norms are more likely to be subject to rapid changes. Dress codes may change rather swiftly, but what about the codes of honor or the norms of revenge that survived for centuries in Mediterranean countries? Unfortunately the social identity view does not offer a theoretical framework for differentiating these cases.

Though some norms are clearly related to group membership, and thus compliance may be explained through identity-validation mechanisms, there are many limits to the social identity explanation. For example, what sort of rewards (in terms of identity validation) accrue to those individuals who take part in new, emergent groups or movements? In this case, it seems that a new identity and a new set of norms are forged at the same time. Furthermore, norms—being shared beliefs about what sort of behavior validates an identity—are expected to be consistent with behavior, at least insofar as an individual's group membership is maintained. But, as was discussed earlier, individuals are usually committed to different social identities, and their commitments may also vary with time, so that consistency between normative beliefs and behavior, though explainable, is hardly predictable in all but the simplest group contexts.

6. Rational choice

The rational choice model of conformity maintains that, since norms are upheld by sanctions, compliance is a utility-maximizing strategy. Provided that conformity to a norm attracts approval and transgression disapproval, conforming is the rational thing to do, since nobody willfully attracts discredit and punishment (Rommetveit 1955, Thibaut and Kelley 1959). If others' approval and disapproval act as external sanctions, we have a cost-benefit model of compliance (Axelrod 1986, Coleman 1989). In this framework, one cannot say that norms motivate behavior. Conforming behavior is rationally chosen in order to avoid negative sanctions or to attract positive sanctions. The rational choice model typically defines norms behaviorally, equating them with patterns of behavior as opposed to expectations or values. Such approach relies heavily on sanctions. According to Axelrod (1986), for example, if we observe individuals to follow a regular pattern of behavior and to be punished if they act otherwise, then we have a norm. Similarly, Coleman (1989) argues that a norm coincides with a set of sanctions that act to direct a given behavior.

However, not all social norms involve sanctions, as is indicated by studies of the differences among societies as to the proportion and kind of norms that are subject to organized sanctions (Diamond 1935, Hoebel 1954). Moreover, sanctioning generally works well in small-groups and in the context of repeated interactions, where the identity of the participants is known and monitoring behavior is relatively easy. Even in such cases, though, it remains to be explained how the so-called second-order public good problem gets to be solved. Imposing negative sanctions on transgressors is in everybody's interest, but the individual who observes a transgression faces a dilemma. She will have to decide whether or not to punish the transgressor, where punishing involves costs and there is no guarantee that other individuals, when faced with the same dilemma, will also impose a penalty on the transgressor. In this case, upholding a norm depends on the previous solution of a so-called “punisher's dilemma”. An answer to this problem has been to assume that there exist “meta-norms” that tell people to punish transgressors of lower-level norms (Axelrod 1986). This solution, however, only shifts the problem one level up: upholding the meta-norm itself requires the existence of a higher-level sanctioning system.

Another problem with sanctions is the following: A sanction, to be effective, must be recognized as such. Coleman and Axelrod typically take the repeated prisoner's dilemma game as an example of the working of sanctions. However, in a repeated prisoner's dilemma the same action (C or D) must serve as both the sanctioning action and the target action. By simply looking at behavior, it is unclear whether the action is a function of a sanction or a sanction itself. It becomes thus very difficult to determine the presence of a norm, much less to assess its effect on choice as distinct from the individual strategies of the players.

A further consideration weakens the credibility of the view that norms are upheld only because of external sanctions. Often we keep conforming to a norm even in situations of complete anonymity, where the probability of being caught transgressing is almost zero. In this case, fear of sanctions cannot be a motivating force. It is often argued that all cases of “spontaneous” compliance with norms are the result of internalization (Scott 1971). People who have developed an internal sanctioning system, for example, feel guilt and shame at behaving in a deviant way. However, we have seen that the Parsonian view of internalization and socialization is inadequate, as it leads to predictions about norms and compliance that run counter to much evidence, at least insofar as prescriptive (as opposed to proscriptive) norms are concerned.

In order to offer a better explanation of internalization, proponents of the rational choice model maintain that it is rational to internalize a norm. For example, Coleman (1989) has argued in favor of reducing internalization to rational choice, insofar as it is in the interest of a group to get another group to internalize certain norms. In this case, internalization would still be the result of some form of socialization. This theory faces some of the same objections raised against Parsons' theory. Norms that are passed from parents to children, for example, should be extremely resistant to change and one would expect a high degree of correlation between such norms and behavior, especially in all those cases in which norms prescribe specific kinds of actions. However, studies of normative beliefs about honesty (that one typically acquires during childhood) show that they are often uncorrelated with behavior (Freeman and Aatov 1960).

Bicchieri (1990, 1997) has presented a third, alternative view about internalization. This view of internalization is cognitive, and is grounded on the assumption that social norms develop in small, close-knit groups where ongoing interactions are the rule. Once an individual has learned to behave in a way consistent with the group's interests, she will tend to persist in the learned behavior unless it becomes evident that, on average, the cost of upholding the behavior significantly outweighs the benefits. Small groups can typically monitor the members' behavior, and successfully employ retaliation whenever free riding is observed. In such groups, an individual will learn, maybe at some personal cost, to cooperate. And he will uphold the cooperative norm as a “default rule” in any new encounter, unless and until it becomes evident that the cost of conformity has become excessive. The idea that norms may be “sluggish” is in line with well-known results from cognitive psychology showing that, once a norm has emerged in a group, it will tend to persist and guide the behavior of group members even when they are facing a new situation and are isolated from the original group (Sherif 1936).

By and large, norm-abiding behavior is not, as the rational choice model would have it, a matter of cost/benefit calculation. Upholding a norm that has led one to fare reasonably well in the past is a way of economizing on the calculation costs that one would have to sustain whenever facing a new situation. This kind of “bounded rationality” approach explains why people tend to obey norms that sometimes put them at a disadvantage, as is the case with norms of honesty. This does not mean, however, that external sanctions never play a role in compliance. In the initial development of a norm, as well as when individuals do not particularly care about what a norm stands for, sanctions may play an important role in supporting a norm.

Once a norm is established, there are several mechanisms that may account for conformity. Furthermore, to say that one conforms only because of the negative sanctions involved in nonconformity does not distinguish norm-abiding behavior from an obsession, in which one feels an inner constraint to repeat the same action in order to quiet some “bad” thought, or from an entrenched habit that cannot be shed without great unease. Nor does it distinguish norms from hypothetical imperatives enforced by sanctions, such as the rule that prohibits naked sunbathing on public beaches. In all these cases, avoidance of the sanctions involved in transgression constitutes a decisive reason to conform, independently of what others do. In the traditional rational choice perspective, the only expectations that matter are those about the sanctions that follow compliance or non-compliance. Beliefs about how other people will act, as opposed to what they expect us to do are not, in this view, an important explanatory variable. However, as we shall see in the next section, theoretical and empirical evidence weigh heavily in favor of empirical and normative expectations playing a crucial role in eliciting conformity to social norms.

7. Equilibria and self-fulfilling expectations

The traditional rational choice model of compliance depicts the individual as facing a decision problem in isolation: If there are sanctions for non-compliance, the individual will calculate the benefit of transgression against the cost of norm compliance, and choose so as to maximize his expected utility. Individuals, however, seldom choose in isolation. They know the outcome of their choice will depend on the actions and beliefs of other individuals, so a rational choice in such interactive context is contingent on what everyone else does and what each expects the others to do. Game theory provides a formal framework for modeling such interactions.

Thomas Schelling (1966), David Lewis (1969), Edna Ullmann-Margalit (1977) Robert Sugden (1986) and, more recently, Peyton Young (1993), Peter Vandrshraaf (1995) and Cristina Bicchieri (1993, 2006) have proposed a game-theoretic account of norms and conventions according to which a norm is broadly defined as a Nash equilibrium. A Nash equilibrium is a combination of strategies, one for each individual, such that each individual's strategy is a best reply to the others' strategies, were one to take them as given. Since it is an equilibrium, a norm is supported by self-fulfilling expectations, in the sense that in equilibrium players' beliefs are consistent, and thus the actions that follow from those beliefs will validate them. Characterizing social norms as equilibria has the advantage of emphasizing the role that expectations play in upholding norms. On the other hand, this interpretation of social norms does not prima facie explain why people prefer to conform if they expect others to conform.

Take for example conventions such as putting the fork to the left of the plate, adopting a particular dress code, using a particular sign language, or using a handkerchief to blow one's nose. In all these cases, my choice to follow a certain rule is conditional upon expecting most other people to follow it. Once my expectation is met, I have every reason to adopt the rule in question. If I do not use the sign language everybody else uses, I will not be able to communicate, and if I blow my nose in my hands, I will send out the wrong signal about who I am. It is in my immediate interest to follow the convention, since my main goal is to coordinate with other people. In the case of conventions, there is a continuity between individual's self interest and the interests of the community that support the convention. This is the reason why David Lewis models conventions as equilibria of coordination games. Such games have multiple equilibria, but once one of them has been established, players will have every incentive to keep playing it, as any deviation will be costly.

Take instead a norm of cooperation. In this case, the expectation that almost everyone abides by it may not be sufficient to induce compliance. If everyone is expected to cooperate, one may be tempted, if unmonitored, to behave in the opposite way. The point is that conforming to social norms, as opposed to conventions, is almost never in the immediate interest of the individual who has to conform. Often there is a discontinuity between individual's self interest and the interests of the community that support the social norm. The typical game that represents a state of affairs in which following a norm would provide a better solution than the one attained by a rational, selfish choice, is a mixed-motive game. In such games the unique Nash equilibrium represents a suboptimal outcome, but there is no way to do better within the confines of the game.

Bicchieri (2006) has argued that social norms, as opposed to conventions, are never born as equilibria of the mixed-motive games they ultimately transform. Whereas a convention is one among several equilibria of a coordination game, a norm can never be an equilibrium of a mixed-motive game (such as, for example, a prisoner's dilemma or a trust game). When a norm exists, however, it transforms the original mixed-motive game into a coordination one. As an example, consider the following prisoner's dilemma game (Figure 1), where the payoffs are B=Best, S=Second, T= Third, and W= Worst. Clearly the only Nash equilibrium is to defect (D), in which case both players get (T,T), a suboptimal outcome. Suppose, however, that society has develop a norm of cooperation; that is, whenever a social dilemma occurs, it is commonly understood that the parties should privilege a cooperative attitude. Should, however, does not imply “will”, therefore the new game generated by the existence of the cooperative norm has two equilibria: either both players defect or both cooperate.

PD game vs Coordination game
Figure 1

Note that in the new coordination game created by the existence of a cooperative norm, the payoffs are quite different from those of the original prisoner's dilemma. Now there are two equilibria: If both players follow the cooperative norm they will play an optimal equilibrium and get (B,B), whereas if they both choose to defect they get (S,S), which is worse than (B,B). Players' payoffs in the new coordination game differ from the original payoffs because their preferences and beliefs will reflect the existence of the norm. More specifically, if a player knows that a cooperative norm exists and has the right kind of expectations, then she will have a preference to conform to the norm in a situation in which she can choose to cooperate or to defect. In the new game generated by the norm's existence, choosing to defect when others cooperate is not a good choice anymore (T,W). To understand why, let us look more closely to the preferences and expectations that underlie the conditional choice to conform to a social norm.

Bicchieri (2006) has thus defined the expectations that underlie norm compliance:

Empirical expectations: individuals believe that a sufficiently large subset of the relevant group/population conforms to the norm in situations of type S and either
Normative expectations: individuals believe that a sufficiently large subset of the relevant group/population expects them to conform to the norm in situations of type S;


Normative expectations with sanctions: individuals believe that a sufficiently large subset of the relevant group/population expects them to conform to the norm in situations of type S, prefers them to conform and may sanction behavior.

Note that universal compliance is not usually needed for a norm to exist. However, how much deviance is socially tolerable will depend upon the norm in question. Group norms and well-entrenched social norms will typically be followed by almost all members of a group or population, whereas greater deviance is usually accepted when norms are new, or when norms are not deemed to be socially important. Furthermore, as it is usually unclear how many people follow a norm, different individuals may have different beliefs about the size of the group of followers, and may also have different thresholds for what ‘sufficiently large’ means. What matters to conformity is that an individual believes that her threshold has been reached or surpassed.

If we go back to the players in the new coordination game of Figure 1, for them to obey the norm, and thus choose C, it must be the case that each expects the other to follow it. In the original prisoner's dilemma, a player's empirical expectations would not be sufficient to induce cooperative behavior. When a norm exists, however, players also believe that others believe they should obey the norm, and may even punish them if they do not. The combined force of normative and empirical expectations makes norm compliance a superior choice and makes defection, in case the others are expected to cooperate, a bad choice indeed, be it because punishment may follow, or just because one recognizes the legitimacy of other's expectations (Sugden 2000).

It is important to understand that conformity to a social norm is always conditional upon the expectations of what the relevant other/s will do. We prefer to comply with the norm on the basis of having certain expectations. To make this point clear, think of the player who is facing a typical one-shot prisoner's dilemma with an unknown opponent. Suppose the player knows a norm of cooperation exists and is generally followed, but is uncertain as to whether the opponent is a norm-follower. In this case, the player is facing the following situation (Figure 2):

probability of PD game vs Coordinationgame
Figure 2

With probability p, the opponent is a norm-following type, and with probability 1–p he is not (it is usually assumed that nature picks such types with a given probability, but the probability may also be a subjective one). Depending upon his assessment of p, a player will decide which game he is playing, and act accordingly. Conditional preferences imply that having a reason to be fair, reciprocate or cooperate in a given situation does not entail having any general motive or disposition to be fair, reciprocate or cooperate as such. Having conditional preferences means that one may follow a norm in the presence of the relevant expectations, but disregard it in its absence. Whether a norm is followed at a given time depends on the actual proportion of followers, on the expectations of conditional followers about such proportion, and on the combination of individual thresholds.

As an example, consider a community that abides by strict norms of honesty. A person who, upon entering the community, systematically violates these norms will be certainly met with hostility, if not utterly excluded from the group. But suppose a large group of, say, thieves makes its way into this community. In due time, people would cease to expect honesty on the part of others, and would find no reason to be honest themselves in a world overtaken by theft. Probably the norms of honesty would cease to exist, since the strength of a norm lies in its being followed by almost all the members of the relevant group or population, which in turn reinforces people's expectation of conformity.

What we are discussing here is a rational reconstruction of what a social norm is. Such reconstruction is meant to capture some essential features of social norms, as well as help us distinguish social norms from other constructs, such as conventions or personal norms. A good rational reconstruction, though quite abstract, will also provide its own constraints: if we have a belief/desire model of norms, we must specify how behavior will change if beliefs change, and be able to make testable predictions. Note that a rational reconstruction is not in conflict with a heuristic account of how we comply with social norms. Indeed, most people's experience of conformity to a norm would seem to be beyond rational calculation. Most of the time, we are not aware of our expectation, and compliance may look like a habit, thoughtless and automatic, or it may be driven by feelings of anxiety at the thought of what would happen if one transgresses the norm. Upholding a norm is not a matter of conscious cost/benefit calculations; rather, people tend to repeat patterns of behavior that they have learned and, on average, work well in a variety of situations. Yet we may still claim that conformity to a norm is rational, and explain it in terms of one's beliefs and desires, even though one does not conform out of a conscious rational calculation. As David Lewis himself pointed out in his analysis of habits, a habit may be under an agent's rational control in the sense that should that habit ever cease to serve the agent's desires according to his beliefs, it would at once be overridden and abandoned (Lewis 1975a, 1975b). Similarly, an explanation in terms of norms does not compete with one that refers to expectations and preferences, since a norm persists precisely because of certain expectations and preferences. If we ever wanted to be different, or if we expected others to do something different, we would probably overcome the force of the norm. We are not constantly aware of our beliefs, preferences and desires, which we take to be dispositions to act in a certain way in the appropriate circumstances. What is required in a dispositional account of belief, preference and desire is that such motives be ready to manifest themselves in the relevant circumstances.

The advantage of an account of social norms in terms of equilibria is that it underscores the importance of expectations and conditional conformity. A limit of this account, however, is that it does not indicate how such equilibria are attained or, in other terms, how expectations become self-fulfilling.

8. Evolution

Thus far we have examined accounts of social norms that take for granted that a particular norm exists in a population. However, for a full account of social norms, we must answer two questions related to the dynamics of norms. First, we must ask how a norm can emerge. Norms require a set of corresponding beliefs and expectations to support them, and so there must be an account of how these arise. Second, we must investigate the conditions under which a norm is stable under some competitive pressure from other norms. Sometimes, multiple candidate norms vie for dominance in a population. Even if one norm has come to dominate the population, new norms can try to “invade” the existing norm's population of adherents.

Let us now turn to the question of norm emergence. Here we can see three classes of models: first, a purely biological approach, second, a more cognitive approach, and third, a structured interactions approach. The most famous of the biological approaches to norms seek to explain cooperative behavior. The simplest models are Kin selection models (Hamilton 1964). These models seek to explain altruistic tendencies in animals by claiming that, as selection acts on genes, those genes have an incentive to promote the reproductive success of other identical sets of genes found in other animals. This mode of explanation can provide an account of why we see cooperative behaviors within families, but being gene-centered, cannot explain cooperative behavior toward strangers, as strangers should not be sufficiently genetically related to merit altruistic behavior.

Models of “reciprocal altruism”(Trivers 1971, 1985), on the other hand, tell us that cooperative behavior has no chance of evolving in random pairings, but will evolve in a social framework in which individuals can benefit from building reputations for being nice guys. Reciprocal altruism, however, does not require an evolutionary argument; a simple model of learning in ongoing close-knit groups will do, and has the further advantage of explaining why certain types of cooperative behavior are more likely to emerge than others. All that matters in these models is that agents can properly identify other agents, such that they can maintain a record of their past behavior. This allows for the possibility of reputations: people who have the reputation of being cooperative will be treated cooperatively, and those who have a reputation of being unfair will be treated unfairly.

A variation on the idea of reciprocal altruism can be seen in Axelrod (1986). Axelrod presents a “norms game” in which agents probabilistically choose to comply with the norm, or deviate from it, and then other agents can probabilistically choose to punish any deviations at some cost to them. Agents can choose over time to be more or less “bold,” which determines the rate at which they attempt defections, and they can likewise choose to be more or less “vengeful”, which determines how often they punish. Axelrod noted that if the game is left like this, we find that the stable state is constant defection and no punishment. However, if we introduce a meta-norm – one that punishes people who fail to punish defectors, then we arrive at a stable norm in which there is no boldness, but very high levels of vengefulness. It is under these conditions that we find a norm emerge and remain stable. Axelrod's model aims to illustrate that norms require meta-norms. That is, failure to retaliate against a defection must be seen as equivalent to a defection itself. What Axelrod does not analyze is whether there is some cost to being vigilant. Namely, watching both defectors and non-punishers may have a cost that, though nominal, might encourage some to abandon vigilance once there has been no punishment for some time.

Bicchieri, Duffy and Tolle (2004) present an alternative model of norm emergence to explain how a norm of impersonal trust/reciprocity can emerge and survive in an heterogeneous population. This model does not rely on a meta-norm of punishment – instead, it is purely driven by repeated interactions of conditional strategies. In their model, agents play anywhere from 1 to 30 rounds of a trust game for 1,000 iterations, relying on the 4 unconditional strategies, and the 16 conditional strategies that are standard for the trust game. After each round, agents update their strategies based on the replicator dynamic. As the number of rounds grows, a norm of impersonal trust/reciprocity emerges in the population. Most interestingly, however, the norm is not associated with a single strategy, but it is supported by several strategies behaving in similar ways. This model suggests that Trivers' basic model works well in normal social contexts, but we can further enrich the story by allowing a social norm to supervene on several behavioral strategies.

The third prominent model of norm emergence comes from Brian Skyrms (1996, 2004) and Jason Alexander (2007). In this approach, two different features are emphasized: relatively simple cognitive processes, and structured interactions. Both have explored a variety of games, such as the Prisoner's Dilemma, the Stag Hunt, Divide the Dollar, and the Ultimatum Game as exemplars of situations that offer the possibility of the emergence of a moral norm. Though Skyrms occasionally uses the replicator dynamic, both tend to emphasize simpler mechanisms in an agent-based learning context. In particular, learning rules like "imitate the best" or best response are used, as they are much less cognitively demanding. Alexander justifies the use of these simpler rules on the grounds that, rather than fully rational agents, we are cognitively limited beings who rely on fairly simple heuristics for our decision-making. Rules like imitation are extremely simple to follow. Best response requires a bit more cognitive sophistication, but is still simpler than a fully Bayesian model with unlimited memory and computational power. These simpler learning rules provide the same function as the replicator dynamic: in between rounds of play, agents rely on their learning rule to decide what strategy to employ. Unlike in the model of Bicchieri, Duffy, and Tolle, both Skyrms and Alexander tend to treat norms as single strategies.

The largest contribution of this strain of modeling comes not from the assumption of boundedly rational agents, but rather the careful investigation of the effects of particular social structures on the equilibrium outcomes of various games. Much of the previous literature on evolutionary games has focused on the assumptions of infinite populations of agents playing games against randomly-assigned partners. Skyrms and Alexander both rightly emphasize the importance of structured interaction. As it is difficult to uncover and represent real-world network structures, both tend to rely on examining different classes of networks that have different properties, and from there investigate the robustness of particular norms against these alternative network structures. Alexander (2007) in particular has done a very careful study of the different classical network structures, where he examines lattices, small world networks, bounded degree networks, and dynamic networks for each game and learning rule he considers. A final feature of Skyrms and Alexander's work is a refinement on this structural approach: they separate out two different kinds of networks. First, there is the interaction network, which represents the set of agents that any given agent can actively play a game with. Second is the update network, which is the set of agents that an agent can “see” when applying her learning rule. The interaction network is thus one's immediate community, whereas the update network is all that the agent can see. To see why this is useful, we can imagine a case not too different from how we live, in which there is a fairly limited set of other people we may interact with, but thanks to a plethora of media options, we can see much more widely how others might act. This kind of situation can only be represented by clearly separating the two networks.

Thus, what makes the model of norm emergence of Skyrms and Alexander so interesting is its enriching the set of idealizations that one must make in building a model. The addition of structured interaction and structured updates to a model of norm emergence can help make clear how certain kinds of norms tend to emerge in certain kinds of situation and not others, which is difficult or impossible to capture in random interaction models.

Now that we have examined norm emergence, we must examine what happens when a population is exposed to more than one social norm. In this instance, social norms must then compete with each other for adherents. This lends itself to investigations about the competitive dynamics of norms over long time horizons. In particular, we can investigate the features of norms and of their environments, such as the populations themselves, which help facilitate one norm becoming dominant over others, or becoming prone to elimination by its competitors. An evolutionary model provides a description of the conditions under which social norms may spread. One may think of several environments to start with. A population can be represented as entirely homogeneous, in the sense that everybody is adopting the same type of behavior, or heterogeneous to various degrees. In the former case, it is important to know whether the commonly adopted behavior is stable against mutations. The relevant concept here is that of an evolutionarily stable strategy (Maynard Smith and Price 1973; Taylor and Jonker 1978); when a population of individuals adopts such a strategy, it cannot be successfully invaded by isolated mutants, since the mutants will be at a disadvantage with respect to reproductive success. An evolutionarily stable strategy is a refinement of the Nash equilibrium in game theory. Unlike standard Nash equilibria, evolutionarily stable strategies must either be strict equilibria, or have an advantage when playing against mutant strategies. Since strict equilibria are always superior to any unilateral deviations, and the second condition requires that the ESS have an advantage in playing against mutants, the strategy will remain resistant to any mutant invasion. This is a difficult criterion to meet, however. For example, a classic Tit-For-Tat strategy in the Prisoner's Dilemma is not an ESS. Many strategies perform equally well against it, including the very simple “Always Cooperate” strategy, let alone Tit-For-Two-Tats, and any number of variations. Tit-For-Tat is merely an evolutionarily neutral strategy relative to these others. If we only consider strategies that are defection-oriented, then Tit-For-Tat is an ESS, since it will do better against itself, and no worse than defection strategies when paired with them.

A more interesting case, and one relevant to a study of the reproduction of norms of cooperation, is that of a population in which several competing strategies are present at any given time. What we want to know is whether the strategy frequencies that exist at a time are stable, or if there is a tendency for one strategy to become dominant over time. If we continue to rely on the ESS solution concept, we see a classic example in the Hawk-Dove game. If we assume that there is no uncorrelated asymmetry between the players, then the mixed Nash equilibrium is the ESS. If we further assume that there is no structure to how agents interact with each other, this can be interpreted in two ways: either each player randomizes his or her strategy in each round of play, or we have a stable polymorphism in the population, in which the proportion of each strategy in the population corresponds to the frequency with which each strategy would be played in a randomizing approach. So, in those cases where we can assume that players randomly encounter each other, whenever there is a mixed solution ESS we can expect to find polymorphic populations.

If we wish to avoid the interpretive challenge of a mixed solution ESS, there is an alternative analytic solution concept that we can employ: the evolutionarily stable state. An evolutionarily stable state is a distribution of (one or more) strategies that is robust against perturbations, whether they are exogenous shocks or mutant invasions, provided the perturbations are not overly large. Evolutionarily stable states are solutions to a replicator dynamic. Since evolutionarily stable states are naturally able to describe polymorphic or monomorphic populations, there is no difficulty with introducing population-oriented interpretations of mixed strategies. This is particularly important when random matching does not occur, as under those conditions, the mixed strategy can no longer be thought of as a description of population polymorphism.

Now that we have seen the prominent approaches to both norm emergence and norm stability, we can turn to some general interpretive considerations of evolutionary models. An evolutionary approach is based on the principle that strategies with higher current payoffs will be retained, while strategies that lead to failure will be abandoned. The success of a strategy is measured by its relative frequency in the population at any given time. This is most easily seen in a game theoretic framework. A game is repeated a finite number of times with randomly selected opponents. After each round of the game, the actual payoffs and strategies of the players become public knowledge; on the basis of this information, each player adjusts his strategy for the next round. The payoff to an individual player depends on her choice as well as on the choices of the other players in the game, and players are rational in the sense that they are payoff-maximizers. In an evolutionary model, however, players learn and adapt in a non-Bayesian way, that is, they do not condition on past experience using Bayes' Rule. In this sense, they are not typical rational learners (Nachbar 1990, Binmore and Samuelson 1992).

In an evolutionary approach behavior is adaptive, so that a strategy that did work well in the past is retained, and one that fared poorly will be changed. This can be interpreted in two ways: either the evolution of strategies is the consequence of adaptation by individual agents, or the evolution of strategies is understood as the differential reproduction of agents based on their success rates in their interactions. The former interpretation assumes short timescales for interactions: many iterations of the game over time thus represent no more than a few decades in time in total. The latter interpretation assumes rather longer timescales: each instance of strategy adjustment represents a new generation of agents coming into the population, with the old generation dying simultaneously. Let us consider the ramifications of each interpretation in turn.

In the first interpretation, we have agents who employ learning rules that are less than fully rational, as defined by what a Bayesian agent would have, both in terms of computational ability and memory. As such, these rules tend to be classified as adaptive strategies: they are reacting to a more limited set of data, with lower cognitive resources than what a fully rational learner would possess. However, there are many different adaptive mechanisms we may attribute to the players. One realistic adaptive mechanism is learning by trial and error; another plausible mechanism is imitation: those who do best are observed by others who subsequently emulate their behavior (Hardin 1982). Reinforcement learning is another class of adaptive behavior, in which agents tweak their probabilities of choosing one strategy over another based on the payoffs they just received.

In the second interpretation, agents themselves do not learn, but rather the strategies grow or shrink in the population according to the reproductive advantages that they bestow upon the agents that adhere to them. This interpretation requires very long timescales, as it requires many generations of agents before equilibrium is reached. The typical dynamics that are considered in such circumstances come from biology. A standard approach is something like the replicator dynamic. Norms grow or shrink in proportion to both how many agents adhere to them at a given time, and their relative payoffs. More successful strategies gain adherents at the expense of less-successful ones. This evolutionary process assumes a constant-sized (or infinite) population over time. This interpretation of an evolutionary dynamic, which requires long timescales, raises the question of whether norms themselves evolve slowly. As Bicchieri (2006) has argued, norms can rapidly collapse in a very short amount of time. This phenomenon could not be represented within a model whose interpretation is generational in nature. It remains an open question, however, as to whether such timescales can be appropriate for examining the emergence of certain kinds of norms. While it is known that many norms can quickly come into being, it is not clear if this is true of all norms.

Another challenge in using evolutionary models to study social norms is that there is a potential problem of representation. In evolutionary models, there is no rigorous way to represent innovation or novelty. Whether we look at an agent-based simulation approach, or a straightforward game-theoretic approach, the strategy set open to the players, as well as their payoffs, must be defined in advance. But many social norms rely on innovations, whether they are technological or social. Wearing mini-skirts was not an option until they were invented. Marxist attitudes were largely not possible until Marx. The age at which one gets married and how many children one has are highly linked to availability of and education about birth control technologies. While much of the study of norms has focused on more generic concepts such as fairness, trust, or cooperation, the full breadth of social norms covers many of these more specific norms that require some account of social innovation.

This representational challenge has broad implications. Even when we can analytically identify evolutionarily stable states in a particular game, which is suggestive of norms that will be converged upon, we now have a problem of claiming that this norm has prospects for long-term stability. Events like the publication of the Kinsey report can dramatically shift seemingly stable norms quite rapidly. As the underlying game changes in the representation, our previous results no longer apply. In the face of this representational problem, we can either attempt to develop some metric of the robustness of a given norm in the space of similar games, or more carefully scope the claims that we can make about the social norms that we study with this methodology.

Though some questions of interpretation and challenges of representation exist, an important advantage of the evolutionary approach is that it does not require sophisticated strategic reasoning in circumstances, such as large-group interactions, in which it would be unrealistic to assume it. People are very unlikely to engage in full Bayesian calculations in making decisions about norm adherence. As Bicchieri (2006) has argued, agents often rely on cognitive shortcuts to determine when norms ought to be in effect given a certain context, and whether or not they should adhere to them. Evolutionary models that employ adaptive learning strategies capture these kinds of cognitive constraints, and allow the theorist to explore how these constraints influence the emergence and stability of norms.

9. Conclusions

The study of social norms can help us understand a wide variety of seemingly puzzling human behavior. As Bicchieri (2006) has argued, norm existence and compliance can be best understood in terms of conditional preferences for following behavioral rules that apply to classes of social interactions. Preferences are conditional on two different kinds of expectations: the empirical expectation that a sufficient number of people adhere to the behavioral rule, and the normative expectation that other people expect one to follow the behavioral rule as well, and possibly enact positive/negative sanctions for conformity/transgression.

This account of social norms, and others like it, still leave much to be investigated. While there are several available models of norm emergence, there has not been one that does not presuppose the existence of some norm in the population. Both Axelrod (1986, 1992) and Bicchieri (2006) present models of norm emergence, but these models either do not address normative expectations, or assume that normative expectations are already present in the population. Explaining how normative expectations come to exist remains an open problem. Still another open question is how social norms relate to the literature on signaling. Many social norms, like Western brides wearing white on their wedding day, serve a signaling function as well. But there has not been much work comparing how norms evolve this signaling component, nor how it may reinforce or inhibit convergence to a norm or set of norms. A final question to consider is how one might be able to productively intervene to change socially harmful norms. If social norms convert mixed-motive games into coordination games, and then supply an equilibrium to the coordination game, then they are going to be fairly robust against interventions. Yet many public policy questions revolve around precisely this question: how do we change norms once they are already entrenched in a population? As the United States has experienced with rapid shifts away from finding smoking socially acceptable, these shifts are possible, but there is not yet a general account of how populations can be shifted away from harmful norms and toward more socially beneficial norms.


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