Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Dec 19, 2005; substantive revision Wed Sep 8, 2010

Rights are entitlements (not) to perform certain actions, or (not) to be in certain states; or entitlements that others (not) perform certain actions or (not) be in certain states.

Rights dominate modern understandings of what actions are permissible and which institutions are just. Rights structure the form of governments, the content of laws, and the shape of morality as it is currently perceived. To accept a set of rights is to approve a distribution of freedom and authority, and so to endorse a certain view of what may, must, and must not be done.

This entry begins by describing the nature of rights: their classification, their composition, and their function. It then reviews the history of the language of rights, and various relationships between rights and reasons. The major contemporary philosophical approaches to the justification of rights are compared, and the entry concludes by surveying criticisms of rights and “rights talk.” The focus throughout is on general theoretical issues instead of on the analysis or justification of specific rights. Those looking for a book-length introduction to rights may consider Jones (1994), Edmundson (2004), Campbell (2006) and Ivison (2007).

1. Categories of Rights

A right to life, a right to choose; a right to vote, to work, to strike; a right to one phone call, to dissolve parliament, to operate a forklift, to asylum, to equal treatment before the law, to feel proud of what one has done; a right to exist, to sentence an offender to death, to launch a nuclear first strike, to castle kingside, to a distinct genetic identity; a right to believe one's eyes, to pronounce the couple husband and wife, to be left alone, to go to hell in one's own way.

We encounter assertions of rights as we encounter sounds: persistently and in great variety. Making sense of this profusion of assertions requires that we class rights together by common attributes. Rights-assertions can be categorized, for example, according to:

Who is alleged to have the right: Children's rights, animal rights, workers' rights, states' rights, the rights of peoples.

What actions or states or objects the asserted right pertains to: Rights of free expression, to pass judgment; rights of privacy, to remain silent; property rights, bodily rights.

Why the rightholder (allegedly) has the right: Moral rights are grounded in moral reasons, legal rights derive from the laws of the society, customary rights exist by local convention.

How the asserted right can be affected by the rightholder's actions: The inalienable right to life, the forfeitable right to liberty, and the waivable right that a promise be kept.

Many of these categories have sub-categories. For instance, natural rights are the sub-class of moral rights that humans have because of their nature. Or again, the rights of political speech are a subclass of the rights of free expression.

The study of particular rights is primarily an investigation into how such categories and sub-categories overlap. There has been much discussion, for example, of whether human rights are natural rights, whether the right to privacy is a legal right, and whether the legal right to life is a forfeitable right. (For the central jurisprudential debate over the relation between legal and moral rights, see legal positivism, natural law theories, and the nature of law.)

2. The Analysis of Rights

Categorization sorts the profusion of rights assertions. To understand the exact meaning of any assertion of a right, we need to understand more precisely how rights are constructed and what they do.

An analysis of rights has two parts: a description of the internal structure of rights (their form), and a description of what rights do for those who hold them (their function). The Hohfeldian system for describing the form of rights is widely accepted, although there are scholarly quarrels about its details. Which theory gives the best account of the function of rights has been much more contentious; we turn to that debate in section 3.

2.1 The Form of Rights: The Hohfeldian Analytical System

Analysis reveals that most familiar rights, such as the right to free expression or the right of private property, have a complex internal structure. Such rights are ordered arrangements of basic components, much in the same way that most molecules are ordered arrangements of chemical elements. The four basic components of rights are known as “the Hohfeldian incidents” after Wesley Hohfeld (1879–1918), the American legal theorist who discovered them. These four basic “elements” are the privilege, the claim, the power, and the immunity. Each of these Hohfeldian incidents has a distinctive logical form, and the incidents fit together in characteristic ways to create complex “molecular” rights.

2.1.1 Privileges (or Liberties)

You have a right to pick up a shell that you find on the beach. This right is a privilege:

A has a privilege to φ if and only if A has no duty not to φ.

To say that you have a right to pick up the shell is to say that you have no duty not to pick it up. You will not be violating any duty not to pick up the shell should you decide to do so. Similarly your right to sit in an empty seat in the cinema, and your right to paint your bedroom red, are also privileges. Privilege-rights mark out what their bearer has no duty not to do. When a US President invokes “executive privilege” to resist an assertion that he has a duty not to conceal evidence, he is invoking a Hohfeldian privilege. Similarly, a license (to drive, to perform surgery, to kill) endows its holder with a privilege to engage in the licensed activity.

(Some writers on rights have preferred to speak of “liberties” instead of “privileges” (e.g., Steiner 1994, 59–60). Others have given these two terms different definitions (e.g., Thomson 1990, 53–55). To avoid confusion, this entry will always use “privilege” and never “liberty” to refer to the incident defined above.)

2.1.2 Claims

A contract between employer and employee confers on the employee a right to be paid his wages. This right is a claim:

A has a claim that B φ if and only if B has a duty to A to φ.

The employee has a claim that the employer pays him his wages, which means that the employer has a duty to the employee to pay those wages. As seen in the definition and the example, every claim-right correlates to a duty in (at least) one duty-bearer. What is distinctive about the claim-right is that a duty-bearer's duty is “directed at” or “owed to” the right-holder.

Not all claim-rights are created by voluntary actions like signing a contract; and not all claim-rights correspond to duties in just one agent. For example, a child's claim-right against abuse exists independently of anyone's actions, and the child's claim-right correlates to a duty in every other person not to abuse her. This example of the child's right also illustrates how a claim-right can require duty-bearers to refrain from performing some action (i.e., that “phi” can be a negative verb such as “not abuse her”).

2.1.3 Powers

Privileges and claims define what Hart called “primary rules”: rules requiring that people perform or refrain from performing particular actions (Hart 1961). Indeed the primary rules for all physical actions are properly analyzed as privileges and claims. Were we to know all the privileges and claims that there are regarding physical actions, we would know for every possible physical action whether that action was permitted, required or forbidden.

Two further Hohfeldian incidents define what Hart called “secondary rules”: rules that specify how agents can introduce, change, and alter primary rules.

The Hohfeldian power is the incident that enables agents to alter primary rules:

A has a power if and only if A has the ability within a set of rules to alter her own or another's Hohfeldian incidents.

A ship's captain has the power-right to order a midshipman to scrub the deck. The captain's exercise of this power changes the sailor's normative situation: it imposes a new duty upon him and so annuls one of his Hohfeldian privileges (not to scrub the deck). Similarly, a promisor exercises a power-right to create in the promisee a claim that the promisor will perform a certain action. The promisor's exercise of her power-right to promise creates in the promisee a claim that the promisor do what she promised to do. Or again, a neighbor waives his claim that you not enter his property by inviting you into his home. Ordering, promising, waiving, sentencing, buying, selling, and abandoning are all examples of acts by which a rightholder exercises a power to change his own Hohfeldian incidents or those of another.

Powers can alter not only “first-order” privileges and claims, but “second-order” incidents as well (Sumner 1987, 31). An admiral, for example, has the power-right to relieve a captain of her power-right to command a ship. Rights to alter the authority of others are, as we will see, definitive of all developed legal and political systems.

2.1.4 Immunities

The fourth and final Hohfeldian incident is the immunity. When A has the ability to alter B's Hohfeldian incidents, then A has a power. When A lacks the ability to alter B's Hohfeldian incidents, then B has an immunity:

B has an immunity if and only if A lacks the ability within a set of rules to alter B's Hohfeldian incidents.

The United States Congress lacks the ability within the Constitution to impose upon American citizens a duty to kneel daily before a cross. Since the Congress lacks a power, the citizens have an immunity. This immunity is a core element of an American citizen's right to religious freedom. Similarly, witnesses in court have a right not to be ordered to incriminate themselves, and civil servants have a right not to be dismissed after a new government comes to power. All of these rights are immunities, corresponding to an absence of a power in some other party to alter the rightholder's normative situation in some way.

2.1.5 Opposites and Correlatives

Hohfeld arranged the four incidents in tables of “opposites” and “correlatives” so as to display the logical structure of his system. In order to fill out the tables he added some further terminology. For instance, if a person A has a claim, then A lacks a “no-claim” (a no-claim is the opposite of a claim). And if a person A has a power, then some person B has a “liability” (a liability is the correlative of a power).

If A has a Claim, then A lacks a No-claim.
Privilege, Duty.
Power, Disability.
Immunity, Liability.
If A has a Claim, then some person B has a Duty.
Privilege, No-claim.
Power, Liability.
Immunity, Disability.

2.1.6 Molecular Rights

Each of the “atomic” incidents—the privilege, claim, power, and immunity—can be a right when it occurs in isolation. And as mentioned above these atomic incidents also bond together in characteristic ways to form complex rights. Following, for example, is part of the “molecular” structure of the property right that you have over your computer:

Part of the “Molecular” Structure of a Property Right

In the figure, the “first-order” rights are your legal rights directly over your property—in this case, your computer. The privilege on this first level entitles you to use your computer. The claim correlates to a duty in every other person not to use your computer.

The “second-order” rights are your legal rights concerning the alteration of these first-order rights. You have several powers with respect to your claim—you may waive the claim (granting others permission to touch the computer), annul the claim (abandoning the computer as your property), or transfer the claim (making the computer into someone else's property). Also on the second order, your immunity prevents others from altering your first-order claim over your computer. Your immunity, that is, prevents others from waiving, annulling, or transferring your claim over your computer. The four incidents together constitute a significant portion of your property right.

Of course all of these incidents are qualified: you have no privilege to strike others with your computer, or to use your computer to hack into someone else's machine; and your immunity may not entirely block out the state's power of expropriation (if for example the computer becomes evidence in a criminal case). These qualifications to the incidents carve the contours of your property right, but they do not affect its basic shape.

There may also be more incidents associated with ownership than shown in the figure above. Wellman (1985, 1995) describes each right as having a “defining core” surrounded by “associated elements” which may be present or absent in a particular case. Your property right, for instance, may also be protected by a qualified third-order immunity against the government altering your second-order rights over your property (for example, under the “Takings Clause” of the Fifth Amendment to the US Constitution the government cannot simply annul your right to sell a parcel of your land).

2.1.7 Active and Passive Rights

The distinction between active and passive rights (Lyons 1970) maps neatly onto the Hohfeldian incidents. The privilege and the power are “active” rights that concern their holders' own actions. The claim and the immunity are “passive” rights that regulate the actions of others. Active rights are signaled by statements of the form “A has a right to φ”; while passive rights are signaled by statements of the form “A has a right that B φ” (in both of these formulas, “φ” is an active verb).

A naval captain has an active privilege-right to walk the decks and an active power-right to order that the ship set sail. A player in a chess tournament has a passive claim-right that his opponent not distract him, and a professor has a passive immunity-right that her university not fire her for publishing unpopular views.

2.1.8 Negative and Positive Rights

A distinction between negative and positive rights is popular among some normative theorists, especially those with a bent toward libertarianism. The holder of a negative right is entitled to non-interference, while the holder of a positive right is entitled to provision of some good or service. A right against assault is a classic example of a negative right, while a right to welfare assistance is a prototypical positive right (Narveson 2001).

Since both negative and positive rights are passive rights, some rights are neither negative nor positive. Privileges and powers cannot be negative rights; and privileges, powers, and immunities cannot be positive rights. The (privilege-) right to enter a building, and the (power-) right to enter into a binding agreement, are neither negative nor positive.

It is sometimes said that negative rights are easier to satisfy than positive rights. Negative rights can be respected simply by each person refraining from interfering with each other, while it may be difficult or even impossible to fulfill everyone's positive rights if the sum of people's claims outstrips the resources available.

However, when it comes to the enforcement of rights, this difference disappears. Funding a legal system that enforces citizens' negative rights against assault may require more resources than funding a welfare system that realizes citizens' positive rights to assistance. As Holmes and Sunstein (1999, 43) put it, in the context of citizens' rights to state enforcement, all rights are positive. Moreover, the point is often made that the moral urgency of securing positive rights may be just as great as the moral urgency of securing negative rights (Shue 1996). Whatever is the justificatory basis for ascribing rights—autonomy, need, or something else—there might be just as strong a moral case for fulfilling a person's right to adequate nutrition as there is for protecting that person's right not to be assaulted.

2.2 The Function of Rights: The Will Theory and the Interest Theory

2.2.1 Conceptual Analysis versus Definitional Stipulation

All rights can be represented by Hohfeldian diagrams like the diagram of the part of the property right “molecule” above. However, some diagrams of Hohfeldian incidents that we could construct do not correspond to any right. Rights are only those collections of Hohfeldian incidents that have a certain function (or perhaps certain functions). To take an analogy: all thrones are chairs, but only chairs with a certain function are thrones.

The question of the function of rights is the question of what rights do for those who hold them. Before discussing the two major positions on this issue, we can survey some statements that theorists have made that may appear to be analyzing which Hohfeldian incidents are rights:

At first this survey might remind one the proverb of the blind men and the elephant. However, we should distinguish between two different aims that a theorist might have when he make a statement of the form “All rights are x.” A theorist may be attempting to analyze the meaning of our ordinary concept of rights, or he may be stipulating a definition of “rights” within his own ethical, political or legal theory.

Consider, for example, Mill's famous assertion in Utilitarianism:

When we call anything a person's right, we mean that he has a valid claim on society to protect him in the possession of it, either by the force of law, or by that of education and opinion… To have a right, then, is, I conceive, to have something which society ought to defend me in the possession of. (Mill 1861, 54)

As an analysis of the everyday concept of a right, Mill's assertion would be weak. There is nothing incoherent in asserting, for example, that God has the right to command man; yet presumably no one asserting such a right would hold that society ought to defend God in the possession of anything. Indeed there seems nothing incoherent in the thought that individuals have a right not to be protected by society; yet this thought could not make sense on Mill's characterization of rights. (On Mill see also Hart 1982, 100–04.)

Mill's statement is better seen as a stipulative definition of the term “right.” Mill stipulates this particular definition because the concept of “those possessive relations that are valuable enough that it is worthwhile for society to institute sanctions to protect them” is a concept that works well within his larger utilitarian theory. So where Mill's statement departs from the common understanding of rights, we should charitably read Mill as prescribing, instead of describing, usage. Many authors' pronouncements about rights are charitably interpreted as these kinds of exercises in stipulation, rather than as attempts to analyze the ordinary concept of rights.

In the scholarly literature it is not uncommon to encounter a general statement about rights aligned with Hohfeld's assertion in the list above: that all rights are, or at least include, claim-rights (see, e.g., Raz 1986, 166, 173-75; Steiner, 1994, 55; Kramer, Steiner and Simmonds 1999, 9-14). Again these “rights are claims” statements are better interpreted as stipulative, rather than as analyzing common usage. “Rights are claims” positions cannot recognize, for example, rights in a Hobbesian state of nature where each person has unlimited privileges of self-defense. Neither could a “rights are claims” theory recognize rights in a section of a political constitution comprising only the powers of various office-holders to appoint to other political offices. The statement that rights are claims is prescriptive for, not descriptive of, usage.

2.2.2 The Will Theory and the Interest Theory

There are two main theories of the function of rights: the will theory and the interest theory. Each presents itself as capturing an ordinary understanding of what rights do for those who hold them. Which theory offers the better account of the functions of rights has been the subject of spirited dispute, literally for ages.

Will theorists maintain that a right makes the rightholder “a small scale sovereign.” (Hart 1982, 183) More specifically, a will theorist asserts that the function of a right is to give its holder control over another's duty. Your property right diagrammed in the figure above is a right because it contains a power to waive (or annul, or transfer) others' duties. You are the “sovereign” of your computer, in that you may permit others to touch it or not at your discretion. Similarly a promisee is “sovereign” over the action of the promisor: she has a right because she has the power to waive (or annul) the promisor's duty to keep the promise. In Hohfeldian terms, will theorists assert that every right includes a Hohfeldian power over a claim. In colloquial terms, will theorists believe that all rights confer control over others' duties to act in particular ways.

Interest theorists disagree. Interest theorists maintain that the function of a right is to further the right-holder's interests. An owner has a right, according to the interest theory, not because owners have choices, but because the ownership makes owners better off. A promisee has a right because promisees have some interest in the performance of the promise, or (alternatively) some interest in being able to form voluntary bonds with others. Rights, the interest theorist says, are the Hohfeldian incidents you have that are good for you.

The contest between will-based and interest-based theories of the function of rights has been waged for hundreds of years. Influential will theorists include Kant, Savigny, Hart, Kelsen, Wellman, and Steiner. Important interest theorists include Bentham, Ihering, Austin, Lyons, MacCormick, Raz, and Kramer. Each theory has stronger and weaker aspects as an account of what rights do for rightholders.

The will theory captures the powerful link between rights and normative control. To have a right is to have the ability to determine what others may and may not do, and so to exercise authority over a certain domain of affairs. The resonant connection between rights and authority (the authority to control what others may do) is for will theorists a matter of definition.

However, the will theory's account of the function of rights is unable to explain many rights that most think there are. Within the will theory there can be no such thing as an unwaivable right: a right over which its holder has no power. Yet intuitively it would appear that unwaivable rights are some of the most important rights that we have: consider, for example, the unwaivable right not to be enslaved. (MacCormick 1977, 197) Moreover, since the will theorist holds that all rights confer sovereignty, he cannot acknowledge rights in beings incapable of exercising sovereignty. Within the will theory it is impossible for incompetents like infants, animals, and comatose adults to have rights. Yet we ordinarily would not doubt that these incompetents can have rights, for example the right not to be tortured. (MacCormick 1982, 154–66) Will theories also have difficulties explaining privilege-rights, which are not rights of authority over others.

The interest theory is more capacious than the will theory. It can accept as rights both unwaivable rights (the possession of which may be good for their holders) and the rights of incompetents (who have interests that rights can protect). The interest theory also taps into the deeply plausible connection between holding rights and being better off.

However, the interest theory is also misaligned with any ordinary understanding of rights. We commonly accept that people can have interests in x without having a right to x; and contrariwise that people can have a right to x without having interests sufficient to explain this. In the first category are “third party beneficiaries.” (Lyons 1994, 36–46) You may have a powerful interest in the lottery paying out for your spouse's winning ticket, but you have no right that the lottery pays out to your spouse. In the second category are many of the rights of office-holders and role-bearers (Jones 1994, 31–32; Wenar 2008, 258–62). Whatever interest a judge may have in exercising her legal right to sentence a convict to life in prison, the judge's interests cannot possibly justify ascribing to her the power to make such a dramatic change in the convict's normative situation. Also in the second category are counter-examples such as Kamm's (2007, 245): “If I simply endow you with the right to some of my money, your interest in having the money or property in general played no role, let alone a sufficient role, in my now having a duty to give you my money.”

Will theorists and interest theorists have developed their positions with increasing technical sophistication. The issues that divide the two camps are clearly defined, and the debates between them are often intense. (Kramer, Simmonds, and Steiner 1998) The seemingly interminable debate between these two major theories has encouraged the development of alternative positions on the function of rights.

“Demand” theories fill out the idea that, as Feinberg (1973, 58–59) puts it, “A right is something a man can stand on, something that can be demanded or insisted upon without embarrassment or shame.” For Darwall (2006, 18), to have a claim-right, “includes a second-personal authority to resist, complain, remonstrate, and perhaps use coercive measures of other kinds, including, perhaps, to gain compensation if the right is violated.” On Skorupski's account (2010, XII.6, XIV.2–3) rights specify what the right-holder may demand of others, where “demand” implies the permissibility of compelling performance or exacting compensation for non-performance. Like the will theory, such accounts center on the agency of the right-holder. They do not turn on the right-holder's power over the duty of another, so they do not share the will theory's difficulty with unwaivable rights. They may, however, have more difficulty explaining power-rights. Demand theories also share the will-theory's challenges in explaining the rights of incompetents, and in explaining privilege-rights.

Other recent analyses of what rights do for rightholders attempt to combine the strengths of both of the leading theories. Sreenivasan (2005, 2010) puts forward a hybrid analysis of the claim-right that grafts the interest theory onto the will theory: here the function of the claim-right is to endow the right-holder with the amount of control over another's duty that advances her interests. Cruft (2004) suggests an inclusive analysis where all rights are “of value” in securing the right-holder's autonomy or interests. Wenar (2005) abandons the idea that all rights have any single function at all, describing instead several distinct functions that rights perform.

3. The History of the Language of Rights

Intellectual historians have tangled over the origins of rights. These debates are sometimes framed in terms of when “the concept of a right” emerged. Yet insofar as it is really the emergence of the concept of a right that is at issue, the answer lies beyond the competence of the intellectual historian and within the domain of the anthropologist. Even the most primitive social order must include rules specifying that certain individuals or groups have special permission to perform certain actions. Moreover, even the most rudimentary human communities must have rules specifying that some are entitled to tell others what they must do. Such rules ascribe rights. The genesis of the concept of a right was simultaneous with reflective awareness of certain social norms.

The more productive characterization of the debate within intellectual history concerns when a word or phrase appeared that has a meaning close to the meaning of our modern word. This debate turns on when in history the pre-modern “objective” sense of “right” came also to bear our modern, “subjective” sense of “a right.”

“Right” in its older, objective sense means “what is just” or “what is fair.” (Finnis 1980, 206) Aristotle uses dikaion, for example, to indicate that a society is “rightly ordered”: that it displays the correct structure of human relationships “Right” in this objective sense can also be attributed to individuals. The Roman jurist Ulpian, for instance, held that justice means rendering each his right (ius). In this sense, a person's “right” is what is due to him given his role or status. This objective sense of “right” is not the same as our modern idea of “a right.” For instance, Ulpian noted that the ius of a parricide was to be sewn into a sack of snakes and tossed into the Tiber. (Tierney 1997, 16)

The scholarly inquiry into when our modern, subjective sense of “a right” became established as a meaning of some word or phrase has proved long and divisive. The ancient authors often used words imprecisely, and smeared their meanings across and beyond the Hohfeldian categories. The intellectual historians themselves have occasionally congested the discussion by taking different features of rights as definitive of the modern concept. Moreover, the scholarly debate has sometimes accepted over-optimistic assumptions about the sharpness of conceptual boundaries.

Nevertheless, two broad trends in the scholarly discussions are clear. The first is to push the origins of a term indicating a modern, subjective sense of “a right” back further into history: from Locke to Hobbes to Grotius in the seventeenth century, then to Gerson in the fifteenth century, Ockham in the fourteenth, perhaps even to Gratian in the twelfth (Brett 1997, Tierney 1997). The second and related trend has been to establish that terms referring to active rights (what we would call privilege-rights and power-rights) predate terms referring to passive rights (what we would call claim-rights and immunity-rights). It appears that the earliest debates using recognizably modern rights-language concerned topics such as whether the pope has a (power-) right to rule an earthly empire, and whether the poor have a (privilege-) right to take what they need from the surplus of the rich.

4. Rights and Freedom

Most rights entitle their holders to freedom in some sense; indeed holding a right can entail that one is free in one or more of a variety of senses. In the most general terms, the active incidents—the privilege and the power—entitle their holders to freedom to act in certain ways. The passive incidents—the claim and the immunity—often entitle their holders to freedom from undesirable actions or states.

We can be more specific. A privilege-right makes it holder “free to” in the sense of non-forbiddenness. A government employee with a security clearance, for instance, has a privilege-right that makes him free to read classified documents. One can be free in this non-forbidden way without having the physical ability to do what one is free to do. You may be free to march in the parade, even when both your knees are sprained. The actions you are free to do in this sense may or may not be possible for you, but at least they are not disallowed.

Someone who has a pair of privilege rights—no duty to perform the action, no duty not to perform the action—is free in an additional sense of having discretion over whether to perform the action or not. You are free to tie your left shoe first, or not, as you like. This dual non-forbiddenness again does not imply physical ability. A rightholder may be allowed to perform or not perform some action, but this still does not mean that she is capable of performing the action that she is free to perform.

In contrast, the holder of a power-right does have an ability. This is the normative ability to exercise authority in a certain way. (Sumner 1987, 28) This normative ability confers freedom in a different sense. A judge is free to sentence a convicted criminal to prison. The judge is not merely allowed to sentence the prisoner: her power-right gives her the ability—that is, the authority—to do so. Her (power-) right makes her free to sentence in a way that non-judges are not free to sentence.

As for the passive rights, many claim-rights entitle their holders to be free from the physical interference or surveillance of others. Other claim-rights entitle their holders to be free from undesirable conditions like hunger or fear. Immunity-rights parallel claim-rights one level up. Immunity-rights make their holders free from the authority of others, and so entitle their holders to be free from conditions like tyranny or exploitation.

A legal system can be seen as a distribution of all of these varieties of freedom. Any legal system will set out rules specifying who is free to act in which ways, and who should be free from the unwanted actions of others. A developed legal system will also determine who has the authority (and so who is free) to interpret and enforce these rules.

More generally, a political constitution can be seen as a multi-leveled structure of rights that distributes authority over rules of conduct in a distinctive way. A democratic constitution, for example, may give voters the power to elect legislators, who have certain powers to enact laws, which the judiciary has certain powers to interpret, and the police have certain powers to enforce, leaving certain courses of conduct open as legal for citizens to pursue. The facts about who should be free to do what within any legal or political system, as well as the facts about who should be free from which actions and conditions, can be represented as a complex, layered structure of rights.

5. Rights and Reasons

5.1 Rights as Trumps

Though there are disputes over the function of rights and the history of rights language, most agree that rights have special normative force. The reasons that rights provide are particularly powerful or weighty reasons, which override reasons of other sorts. Dworkin's metaphor is of rights as “trumps.” (Dworkin 1984) Rights give reasons to treat their holders in certain ways or permit their holders to act in certain ways, even if some social aim would be served by doing otherwise. As Mill wrote about the trumping power of the right to free expression: “If all mankind minus one were of one opinion, mankind would be no more justified in silencing that one person than he, if he had the power, would be in silencing mankind.” (Mill 1859, 20)

How rights become imbued with this special normative force is a matter of ongoing scholarly inquiry. As Sreenivasan (2010) notes, a Hohfeldian claim-right in itself only entails the existence of a duty with a certain structure, and not a duty with a certain force. A has a claim against B if and only if B has a duty to A: in this definition it is the “direction” of B's duty (that it is owed to A) which correlates B's duty to A's right; nothing is said in the definition about the duty's strength. Why “directed duties”—those owed to a rightholder—have greater normative priority remains an open question: the only broad consensus is that they do. (See Thompson 2004 on “bipolar” judgments.)

Dworkin's metaphor suggests that rights trump non-right objectives, such as increasing national wealth. What of the priority of one right with respect to another? We can keep to the trumps metaphor while recognizing that some rights have a higher priority than others. Within the trump suit, a jack still beats a seven or a three. Your right of way at a flashing yellow light has priority over the right of way of the driver facing a flashing red; and the right of way of an ambulance with sirens on trumps you both.

This metaphor of trumps leads naturally to the question of whether there is any right that has priority to absolutely all other normative considerations: whether there is an “ace of rights.” Gewirth (1981) asserts that there is at least one such absolute right: the right of all persons not to be made the victim of a homicidal project. For such a right to be absolute it would have to trump every other consideration whatsoever: other rights, economic efficiency, saving lives, everything. Not all would agree with Gewirth that even this very powerful right overrides every conceivable normative concern. Some would think it might be justifiable to infringe even this right were this somehow necessary, for example, to prevent the deaths of a great many people. If it is permissible to kill one in order to save a billion, then not even Gewirth's right is absolute.

5.2 Conflicts of Rights?

Most theorists would agree that A's claim-right gives B what Raz (1975, 35-48) calls an exclusionary reason: a second-order reason not to act on some first-order reason. Dworkin's trumping metaphor makes it tempting to characterize the normative force of rights in the stronger terms of conclusive reasons. We could indeed attempt to define the Hohfeldian incidents in these terms. A's having a claim-right that B φ would imply that B has a conclusive reason to φ, and A's having a privilege-right to φ would imply that A has no conclusive reason not to φ. Powers and immunities would then determine the ways in which agents were and were not able to alter the patterns of conclusive reasons in the world.

Were we to go this route, we would need to temper the “conclusiveness” of the conclusive reasons implied by rights assertions to accommodate the facts that some rights have priority to others, and that few if any rights outweigh absolutely all non-right considerations in all circumstances. If we associate rights with conclusive reasons, then for at least most rights these reasons can only be conclusive with respect to some but not all competing considerations.

This line of thought can be developed by saying that the reasons associated with rights are conclusive within the area covered by the right, but are not conclusive outside of that area. Each right trumps competing considerations in most circumstances, but there are certain circumstances in which another right with higher priority—or a pressing non-right consideration—determines what may or should be done. From this perspective, the conclusive reasons implied by rights assertions really are conclusive, but only within certain circumstances. Every right is absolute, within a specifically delimited space. (Contrast this position with Gewirth's defense of a single, unqualified absolute right.)

The theoretical position at the end of this line of thought is called “specificationism.” (Shafer-Landau 1995) The specificationist holds that each right is defined by an elaborate set of qualifications that specify when it does and when it does not apply: a set of qualifications that define the right's “space.”

The test of specificationism is how convincingly it can explain what occurs when rights appear to conflict. Rights often appear to conflict. (Sinnott-Armstrong 1996; Kamm 2007, 262-301) For example, on a certain day it may seem that the public's right to protest is conflicting with the government's right to keep order on public property. When confronted with a case like this one, we will judge that one or the other (say, the public's) right should prevail. However, we do not believe that one of these rights is always stronger than the other. Given different circumstances, our judgment might favor the other (in this case, the government's) right. When rights appear to conflict like this, the usefulness of the image of rights as trumps begins to dim. Both of these rights are trump cards, yet it does not appear that one right always trumps the other.

A specificationist will attempt to dispel any appearance of conflict of rights. For example, a specificationist will say that what is colloquially referred to as “the public's right to protest” is actually, on closer examination, “the public's right to protest, unless the protest would cause serious risk to life or property, or would lead to the spread of a deadly disease, or…” Similarly, the government's right should really be specified more fully as the right: “to control what happens on public property, but not to the extent of stopping peaceful protest, unless the protest would lead to the spread of deadly disease, but not…” On the specificationist view, rights never do conflict in the sense of overlapping in a given case. Rather, rights fit together like pieces in a jigsaw puzzle, so that in each circumstance there is only one right which determines what is permitted, forbidden or required. Every right is absolute within its own area, but the area in which each right prevails is elaborately gerrymandered. Rights never conflict: they are always, to use Steiner's phrase, “compossible.” (Steiner 1994)

Feinberg (1980, 221–51) and Thomson (1990, 82–104) object to this specificationist view of rights. First, fully specified rights would be unknowable: no one could set out all of the qualifications that define even the simplest right. Second, rights so understood lose their explanatory force: for the specificationist rights can only be the conclusions, not the premises, of arguments concerning which side in any dispute should prevail. Third, specificationists cannot explain the “moral residue” of a “defeated” right. For instance, consider a case in which your property right in the pie cooling on your window sill conflicts with John's right to do what he must do to keep from starving. John's right may prevail in this case: John may have a right to eat your pie. Still, after John rightfully eats your pie he should apologize to you, and compensate you if he can. Thomson alleges that specificationists cannot explain the requirements that John apologizes to and compensates you, since on the specificationist view there is no right of yours that he has violated when he consumes your food. Thomson prefers the view that there really are conflicts of rights, and suggests that we should speak of a “defeated” right as being permissibly “infringed” (instead of “violated”), leaving residual obligations on the infringer.

5.3 Rights to Do Wrong

Are there rights to do wrong? Many have thought so. Waldron (1993, 63) gives the example of antiwar protesters organizing a rowdy demonstration near a Remembrance Day service; Wellman (1997, 33) offers the illustration of edging into a checkout line with a full cart, just ahead of a tired woman carrying triplets. The puzzle is how the positive normative force of “a right” can exist so close to an opposed normative pole, “wrong.” In Hohfeldian terms, how can there be a right (no duty not) to do what it is wrong (duty not) to do? (Similar questions arise about “the abuse of rights” (Schauer 1984).)

There are two readings of rights to do wrong. The first reading characterizes most rights as furthering the holder's autonomy. Rights entitle their holders to make choices, and as Waldron says the importance of a person's having choices would be diminished if she were forced to do the right thing. Even though the person has no (privilege-) right to perform an action that is wrong, it would nevertheless violate an important (claim-) right of hers for others to compel her not to do that thing. To take the speech example, we respect the autonomy of speakers when we allow them to speak unmolested—even when they do wrong by expressing themselves in disrespectful ways.

The second reading of rights to do wrong sees them as involving a mid-sentence shift in domains of reasons. There is no mystery, after all, in having a legal right to do something morally wrong. The potential for a legal right to do a moral wrong arises from the fact that the domains of legal and moral reasons are not perfectly overlapped. One has a legal privilege to edge in front of the tired mother in the check-out line, but this is something that one has a moral duty not to do. Similarly, one might have a moral privilege to do what one has no customary privilege to do (a moral right to do a customary wrong), and so on. Each domain of reasons is distinct, and however conclusive are the reasons that any particular rights-assertion implies, these are only reasons within a single domain of reasons (moral, or legal, or customary).

5.4 Rights to Believe, Feel, and Want

Moral rights, legal rights, and customary rights all define domains of rights within the realm of rights of conduct: rights concerning how agents should act. When our reasons within these three different domains conflict, we may have reasons of different kinds to act in different ways. Yet there are also rights entirely beyond the realm of conduct. These are rights to believe, to feel and to want. For example, the prime minister asserts that he had a right to believe what his advisors told him. The artist says she has a right to feel angry at her critics. The frustrated suburbanite complains he has a right to want more out of life.

The realm of rights of rights to believe, to feel and to want are the realms of epistemic, of affective, and of conative rights. Together with the realm of rights of conduct, these are the four realms of rights. Each of these four realms of rights defines a separate conceptual space: there are no epistemic rights to act, and no affective rights to believe. What is distinctive about the three realms of rights beyond the rights of conduct is that they contain only privilege-rights (Wenar 2003). One may, for example, have a privilege-right to believe what one's eyes tell one, and a privilege-right to feel proud of what one has done. It is interesting to consider why these epistemic, affective, and conative realms contain no claims, powers, or immunities.

Philosophers have long been interested in epistemic rights in particular. William James, for instance, calls The Will to Believe, “an essay in justification of faith, a defense of our right to adopt a believing attitude in religious matters, in spite of the fact that our merely logical intellect may not have been coerced.” James's “radical” conclusion in the essay is that “we have the right to believe at our own risk any hypothesis that is live enough to tempt our will.” (James 1897, 2, 29) Similarly the deepest questions in Kant's philosophy are framed in terms of rights. In the Critique of Pure Reason the Transcendental Deduction of the Categories aims to prove the validity of the employment of the concepts of pure understanding. In the Critique of Practical Reason the Deduction of Freedom aims to demonstrate our entitlement to regard ourselves as free. In both Deductions the central question is a quaestio iuris: “By what right?” Kant's questions are: By what right do we employ the categories; and by what right do we think of ourselves as free?

6. Three Approaches to the Justification of Rights

There are two leading philosophical approaches to explaining which fundamental rights of conduct there are, and why these rights should be respected. These two approaches are broadly identifiable as deontological and consequentialist. Status theories hold that human beings have attributes that make it fitting to ascribe certain rights to them, and make respect for these rights appropriate. Instrumental theories hold that respect for particular rights is a means for bringing about some optimal distribution of interests. Each approach has characteristic strengths and weaknesses; the long-running contest between them is ongoing.

Quinn (1993, 170) sketches a contemporary status theory this way:

A person is constituted by his body and his mind. They are parts or aspects of him. For that very reason, it is fitting that he have primary say over what may be done to them—not because such an arrangement best promotes overall human welfare, but because any arrangement that denied him that say would be a grave indignity. In giving him this authority, morality recognizes his existence as an individual with ends of his own—an independent being. Since that is what he is, he deserves this recognition.

Quinn claims that there is some attribute of the person—here, being “an individual with ends of his own”—that merits recognition from others. The recognition that is due to each individual can be accorded to that individual by respecting his fundamental rights.

Quinn contrasts his status approach to rights with one that ascribes rights “because such an arrangement best promotes overall human welfare.” His target is consequentialist theories of rights, the paradigm of which are utilitarian theories. We met such a utilitarian theory of rights above in John Stuart Mill's conceptualization of rights as “something which society ought to defend me in the possession of.” Mill believed that society ought to defend the individual in possession of her rights because doing so would bring about the greatest aggregate utility summed across the members of that society. For Mill, as for other instrumental theorists, rights are a tool for producing an optimal distribution of interests across some group.

The two approaches differ sharply over the role of consequences in the justification of ascribing rights. Status theorists hold that rights should be respected because it is fitting to do so, and not because of the good consequences that will flow from so doing. By contrast, within an instrumental theory good consequences are the justification for promulgating and enforcing rights. As Quinn (1993, 173) says about the status approach:

It is not that we think it fitting to ascribe rights because we think it is a good thing that rights be respected. Rather we think respect for rights a good thing precisely because we think people actually have them—and… that they have them because it is fitting that they should.

Within a status approach rights are not means for the promotion of good consequences. They are rather, in Nozick's phrase, side constraints on the pursuit of good consequences. (Nozick 1974, 29) A status approach frowns on any rights violation, even for the sake of maximizing the non-violation of rights overall (as in a “utilitarianism of rights”). Such an approach emphasizes the “agent-relative” reasons that each person has to avoid violating the rights of others.

A status-based justification thus begins with the nature of the rightholder and arrives immediately at the right. The instrumental approach starts with the desired consequences (like maximum utility) and works backward to see which rights-ascriptions will produce those consequences.

6.1 Status-Based Rights

Status theories belong to the tradition of natural rights theories. All natural rights theories fix upon features that humans have by their nature, and which make respect for certain rights appropriate. The theories differ over precisely which attributes of humans give rise to rights, although non-religious theories tend to fix upon the same sorts of attributes described in more or less metaphysical or moralized terms: free will, rationality, autonomy, the ability to regulate one's life in accordance with one's chosen conception of the good life. Natural rights theorists agree that human reason can grasp the fact that it is appropriate to treat beings with such attributes in certain ways, although they disagree on whether such facts are self-evident.

Natural rights theory reached its high point in the early modern era, in the work of Grotius, Hobbes, Pufendorf, and especially Locke. Locke argued that men have rights to “life, liberty, and estate” in a pre-political state of nature, and that these natural rights put limits on the legitimate authority of the state. Locke's influence can be seen in the revolutionary American and French political documents of the eighteenth century, and especially in Jefferson's Declaration of Independence (1776): “We hold these truths to be self-evident, that all men are created equal, that they are endowed by their Creator with certain unalienable rights, that among these are Life, Liberty, and the Pursuit of Happiness.”

The revival of status theory within contemporary philosophy began with Nozick's Anarchy State and Utopia (1974). While Nozick does acknowledge a debt to Locke's theory of property, his work belongs within the Kantian tradition of natural rights theorizing. Nozick centers his explanation of the moral force of individual rights on the Kantian imperative against treating humanity merely as a means to an end. Each person's rights impose side-constraints on the pursuit of others' goals, Nozick says, because each person possesses an inviolability that all others must respect. “Individuals have rights,” he wrote, “and there are things no person or group may do to them (without violating their rights).” (Nozick 1974, ix)

Many find this approach of grounding of rights in individual dignity appealing. There is a directness and clarity to status explanations of fundamental rights. For example, Kamm (2007, 247) explains the right of free expression as follows:

The right to speak may simply be the only appropriate way to treat people with minds of their own and the capacity to use means to express it... Not recognizing a person's option of speaking is to fail to respect him... To say that any given person is not entitled to the strong right to free speech is... a way of saying that certain crucial features of human nature are not sufficient to generate the right in anyone. And this seems to be a mistake.

Moreover, status-based rights are attractively robust. While the justifications of instrumental rights are always contingent on calculations concerning consequences, status-based rights are anchored firmly in individual dignity. This makes it easy to explain why status-based rights are strong, almost unqualified rights, and this is a position which many believe properly expresses the great value of each person.

However, the strength of status-based rights can also be seen as a weakness of the theory. One does not wish to be carried from the great importance of each individual to the implausible position that all fundamental rights are absolute. As Nagel (2002, 36) allows while defending a status view, “there are evils great enough so that one would be justified in murdering or torturing an innocent person to prevent them.” Consequences, if bad enough, do justify the qualification of individual rights, which leaves the status theorist needing to explain how a theory which rejects consequences so resolutely at the outset can concede their importance later on.

Moreover, the simplicity of the status approach to rights can also appear to be a liability. On close examination, the fundamental rights that most people believe in are intricately “shaped.” For example, consider the widely-accepted right to free expression. This right includes the right to make damning personal attacks on others. Yet the right is much more permissive about attacking public figures than it is about assailing private citizens. How could a status approach explain this distinction between public figures and private citizens? Or again: the right to free speech contains a right to say what the speaker knows to be untrue. Yet we tend to be more tolerant of deceitful speech in political campaigns than we are of deceitful speech in advertising or in the courtroom. It is an open question whether status theory has the conceptual resources to explain why individual rights should be shaped in these specific ways.

Status theory also faces the challenge of vindicating its foundations and its scope. Why after all is it “fitting” to ascribe individuals rights? The Kantian value of inviolability can look puzzling when presented independently of a metaphysical grounding. As Nagel (2002, 34) admits, “it has proven extremely difficult to account for such a basic, individualized value such that it becomes morally intelligible.” This is a quiet echo of Bentham's protest that the doctrine of natural rights “is from beginning to end so much flat assertion: it lays down as a fundamental and inviolable principle whatever is in dispute.” (Bentham 1796, 66)

Moreover, status theorists must also resolve an internal debate over exactly which rights should be thought to express an individual's inviolability. Nozick holds that status-based rights include rights to whatever property one has acquired, while other status theorists reject the libertarianism to which Nozick's position leads. The resolution of this debate has become more urgent, as a group of neo-Kantian and neo-Lockean “left libertarian” theorists have advanced the view that the status of individuals requires that each be accorded strong rights to self-ownership, and also initially equal shares of “world-ownership.” (Vallentyne and Steiner 2000, Otsuka 2003)

6.2 Instrumental Rights

Instrumental theories describe rights as instruments for achieving an optimal distribution of interests. The archetypal instrumental theory is some form of two-level consequentialism, such as rule utilitarianism. Within such a theory rights are rules, the general observance of which will lead to an optimal distribution of interests. In rule utilitarianism the optimal distribution is the one that contains the greatest aggregate utility.

The most common objection to grounding rights in such a theory is that the resulting rights will be too flimsy. If rights are justified only insofar as they generate good consequences, it may seem that the theory will need to prune its rights, perhaps severely, whenever maximum utility lies elsewhere. Why should it not be a rule in a two-level system, for example, that one should frame an innocent man if this would prevent a major riot? Why should it not be a rule that one should “violate” the right of an innocent not to be killed if this would prevent the killings of two innocents elsewhere? While status-based rights can appear to be too strong, instrumental rights can appear to be too weak.

Weak rights are a problem for utilitarianism because its focus on maximization makes it indifferent to certain facts about how utility is distributed across individuals. However, utilitarianism is not the only kind of instrumental theory.

For example, a pure egalitarian theory will portray rights as instruments for achieving a more equal distribution of interests. A prioritarian theory will define an optimal distribution in a manner similar to egalitarianism, except that it will give extra weight to the interests of those worse off. Other instrumental theories characterize “optimal distribution” in other ways. (Sumner 1987, 171) Instrumental theories that do not define an optimal distribution in terms of maximization may face less pressure than utilitarianism from concerns about weak rights. (Scanlon 1977)

Instrumental theories differ over how they define what counts as an optimal distribution (maximization, equality, etc.). They also differ in how they measure individual interests. For instance, a utilitarian's metric for interests is utility, Sen works with a metric of capabilities, Dworkin with resources, and so on.

Whatever metric they use, all instrumental theorists will have to address longstanding questions about the commensurability and interpersonal comparison of interests. Since instrumental theorists work with overall evaluations of how well off individuals would be were certain rights ascribed, they must explain how distinct categories of interests (e.g., health, income, opportunities for self-expression, social recognition) trade off against one another. They must also explain why they believe that these interests are similar enough across persons that it makes sense to use the same scales of measurement for different persons. (Griffin 1989)

Status theories are subject to the objection that they lack the conceptual resources to explain why the rights we believe in are intricately “shaped” to accommodate the particularities of different contexts and different rightholders. Instrumental theories are vulnerable to the mirror-image objection. An instrumental theorist can appeal to any number of distinct interests, which are at stake for any number of differently-situated individuals, to explain why a certain right should be held only by certain persons or only in certain circumstances. The danger for such a theorist is that the wealth of normative resources at her command will permit the ascription of whatever rights she favors. The theorist begins with the rights that she wants to justify, then gives a “just so” story in terms of an optimal distribution of interests that leads to exactly those rights. (Tushnet 1984, Frey 1985) Moreover all instrumental justifications rely on empirical predictions concerning which ascriptions of rights would produce which consequences, and there will typically be enough slack in these empirical predictions for instrumental theorists to fudge their derivations in order to reach the desired rights.

Both status theories and instrumental theories of rights have held an enduring attraction. Because of this, many have been tempted to search for a hybrid approach that would combine what is plausible in each. (e.g., Sen, 1982)

6.3 Contractual Rights

A third approach to the justification of rights might be called “contractual.” Here rights are characterized neither as naturally fitting for independent beings, nor as tools to promote the best state of affairs. Rather, rights define principles that would be chosen by properly situated and motivated agents agreeing to the basic terms of their relations (e.g., principles chosen in Rawls's original position, or principles within Scanlon's contractualism that no one could reasonably reject). The fact that these principles would be agreed to under the specified conditions is their justification.

Rights define fundamental principles within these theories because of the close connection between rights and what the theories' agents have strong reason to want. So, for example, Rawls states that the role of the right of personal property “is to allow a sufficient material basis for a sense of personal independence and self-respect, both of which are essential for the development and exercise of the two moral powers.” (Rawls 1993, 298) And Scanlon says that reasonable individuals “have reason to insist... on basic rights, which give them important forms of protection and control over their own lives.” (Scanlon 2003, 4) This third, contractual approach to the justification of rights has received surprisingly little scholarly attention (Martin, 1985, Gilbert 2004).

7. Critiques of Rights

Critiques of rights come in two forms. The first is an attack on the substance of doctrines that give rights a central place. These critiques allege that the content of such doctrines is, in one way or other, malformed or unjustified. Here we find, for example, the criticism that natural rights doctrines are “so much flat assertion,” and that utilitarian rights tend to be implausibly weak. The second form of critique attacks the language of rights itself. The objection here is that it is inappropriate or counterproductive to express at least some kinds of normative concerns in terms of rights. We should, according to the second form of critique, reduce or avoid “rights talk.”

7.1 Critiques of Rights Doctrine

Marx attacked the substance of the revolutionary eighteenth century American and French political documents that proclaimed the fundamental “rights of man”: liberty, equality, security, property, and the free exercise of religion. Marx objected that these alleged rights derive from a false conception of the human individual as unrelated to others, as having interests can be defined without reference to others, and as always potentially in conflict with others. The rights-bearing individual is an “isolated monad… withdrawn behind his private interests and whims and separated from the community.” (Marx 1844, 146)

The right of property, Marx asserted, exemplifies the isolating and anti-social character of these alleged rights of man. On the one hand, the right of property is the right to keep others at a distance: the legal equivalent of a barbed wire fence. On the other hand, the right of property allows an owner to transfer his resources at his own pleasure and for his own gain, without regard even for the desperate need for those resources elsewhere.

Similarly, Marx held that the much-celebrated individual right to liberty reinforces selfishness. Those who are ascribed the right to do what they wish so long as they do not hurt others will perpetuate a culture of egoistic obsession. As for equality, the achievement of equal rights in a liberal state merely distracts people from noticing that their equality is purely formal: a society with formally equal rights will continue to be divided by huge inequalities in economic and political power. Finally, these so-called “natural” rights are in fact not natural to humans at all. They are simply the defining elements of the rules of the modern mode of production, perfectly suited to fit each individual into the capitalist machine.

Communitarians (Taylor, Walzer, MacIntyre, Sandel) sound several of the same themes in their criticisms of contemporary liberal and libertarian theories. The communitarians object that humans are not, as such theories assume, “antecedently individuated.” Nozick's “state of nature” theorizing, for example, errs in presuming that individuals outside of a stable, state-governed social order will develop the autonomous capacities that make them deserving of rights. Nor should we attempt, as in Rawls's original position, to base an argument for rights on what individuals would choose in abstraction from their particular identities and community attachments. There is no way to establish a substantive political theory on what all rational agents want in the abstract. Rather, theorists should look at the particular social contexts in which real people live their lives, and to the meanings that specific goods carry within different cultures. This criticism continues by accusing liberal and libertarian theories of being falsely universalistic, in insisting that all societies should bend themselves to fit within a standard-sized cage of rights. Insofar as we should admit rights into our understanding of the world at all, communitarians say, we should see them as part of ongoing practices of social self-interpretation and negotiation— and so as rules that can vary significantly between cultures.

These kinds of criticisms have been discussed in detail (e.g., Gutmann 1985, Waldron 1987b, Mulhall and Swift 1992). Their validity turns on weighty issues in moral and political theory. What can be said here is that a common theme in most of these criticisms—that prominent rights doctrines are in some way excessively individualistic or “atomistic”—need not cut against any theory merely because it uses the language of rights. Ignatieff (2003, 67) errs, for example, when he charges that “rights language cannot be parsed or translated into a nonindividualistic, communitarian framework. It presumes moral individualism and is nonsensical outside that assumption.”

As we saw above, the language of rights is able to accommodate rightholders who are individuals as such, but also individuals considered as members of groups, as well as groups themselves, states, peoples, and so on. Indeed the non-individualistic potential of rights-language is more than a formal possibility. The doctrine of international human rights—the modern cousin of eighteenth century natural rights theory—ascribes several significant rights to groups. The international Convention against Genocide, for example, forbids actions intending to destroy any national, ethnic, racial or religious group; and both of the human rights Covenants ascribe to peoples the right to self-determination. Such examples show that the language of rights is not individualistic in its essence.

7.2 Critiques of the Language of Rights

The language of rights can resist the charge that it is necessarily complicit with individualism. However, critics have accused rights talk of impeding social progress:

Our rights talk, in its absoluteness promotes unrealistic expectations, heightens social conflict, and inhibits dialogue that might lead toward consensus, accommodation, or at least the discovery of common ground. In its silence concerning responsibilities, it seems to condone acceptance of the benefits of living in a democratic social welfare state, without accepting the corresponding personal and civic obligations…. In its insularity, it shuts out potentially important aids to the process of self-correcting learning. All of these traits promote mere assertion over reason-giving.

Glendon (1991, 14) here draws out some of the detrimental practical consequences of the popular connection between rights and conclusive reasons that we saw above. Since rights assertions suggest conclusive reasons, people can be tempted to assert rights when they want to end a discussion instead of continuing it. One plays a right as a trump card when one has run out of arguments. Similarly, the ready availability of rights language may lead parties initially at odds with each other toward confrontation instead of negotiation, as each side escalates an arms-race of rights assertions that can only be resolved by a superior authority like a court. One line of feminist theory has picked up on this line of criticism, identifying the peremptory and rigidifying discourse of rights with the confrontational masculine “voice.” (Gilligan 1993)

It is not inevitable that these unfortunate tendencies will afflict those who make use of the language of rights. As we have seen, it may be plausible to hold that each right is “absolute” only within a elaborately gerrymandered area. And it may be possible to produce deep theories to justify why one has the rights that one asserts. However, it is plausible that the actual use of rights talk does have the propensities that Glendon suggests. It seems no accident that America, “the land of rights,” is also the land of litigation.

Another deleterious consequence of rights talk that Glendon picks out is its tendency to move the moral focus toward persons as rightholders, instead of toward persons as bearers of responsibilities. This critique is developed by O'Neill (1996, 127–53; 2002, 27–34). A focus on rightholders steers moral reasoning toward the perspective of recipience, instead of toward the traditional active ethical questions of what one ought to do and how one ought to live. Rights talk also leads those who use it to neglect important virtues such as courage and beneficence, which are duties to which no rights correspond. Finally, the use of rights language encourages people to make impractical demands, since one can assert a right without attending to the desirability or even the possibility of burdening others with the corresponding obligations.

Criticisms such as O'Neill's do not target the language of rights as a whole. They aim squarely at the passive rights, and especially at claim-rights, instead of at the active privileges and powers. Nevertheless, it is again plausible that the spread of rights talk has encouraged the tendencies that these criticisms suggest. The modern discourse of rights is characteristically deployed by those who see themselves or others as potential recipients, entitled to insist on certain benefits or protections.

Describing fundamental norms in terms of rights has benefits as well as dangers. The language of rights can give clear expression to elaborate structures of freedom and authority. When embodied in particular doctrines, such as in the international human rights documents, the language of rights can express in accessible terms the standards for minimally acceptable treatment that individuals can demand from those with power over them. Rights are also associated with historical movements for greater liberty and equality, so assertions of rights in pursuit of justice can carry a resonance that other appeals lack. Whether these benefits of using rights language overbalance the dangers remains a live question in moral, political and legal theory.


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