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Challenges to Metaphysical Realism

First published Thu Jan 11, 2001; substantive revision Tue Feb 1, 2011

According to metaphysical realism, the world is as it is independently of how humans take it to be. The objects the world contains, together with their properties and the relations they enter into, fix the world's nature and these objects exist independently of our ability to discover they do. Unless this is so, metaphysical realists argue, none of our beliefs about our world could be objectively true since true beliefs tell us how things are and beliefs are objective when true or false independently of what anyone might think.

Many philosophers believe metaphysical realism is just plain common sense. Others believe it to be a direct implication of modern science, which paints humans as fallible creatures adrift in an inhospitable world not of their making. Nonetheless, metaphysical realism is controversial. Besides the analytic question of what it means to assert that objects exist independently of the mind, metaphysical realism also raises epistemological problems: how can we obtain knowledge of a mind-independent world? There are also prior semantic problems, such as how links are set up between our beliefs and the mind-independent states of affairs they allegedly represent. This is the Representation Problem.

Anti-realists deny the world is mind-independent. Believing the epistemological and semantic problems to be insoluble, they conclude realism must be false. In this entry I review a number of semantic and epistemological challenges to realism all based on the Representation Problem:

  1. The Manifestation Argument: the cognitive and linguistic behaviour of an agent provides no evidence that realist mind/world links exist;
  2. The Language Acquisition Argument: if such links were to exist language learning would be impossible;
  3. The Brain-in-a-Vat Argument: realism entails both that we could be massively deluded (‘brains in a vat’) and that if we were we could not even form the belief that we were;
  4. The Conceptual Relativity Argument: it is senseless to ask what the world contains independently of how we conceive of it, since the objects that exist depend on the conceptual scheme used to classify them;
  5. The Model-Theoretic Argument: realists must either hold that an ideal theory passing every conceivable test could be false or that perfectly determinate terms like ‘cat’ are massively indeterminate, and both alternatives are absurd.

I proceed by first defining metaphysical realism, illustrating its distinctive mind-independence claim with some examples and distinguishing it from other doctrines with which it is often confused, in particular factualism. I then outline the Representation Problem and explain why it is a problem for metaphysical realism before presenting the anti-realist challenges to metaphysical realism that are based on it. I discuss metaphysical realist responses to these challenges, indicating how the debates have proceeded, suggesting various alternatives and countenancing anti-realist replies. I review the objection that the Representation Problem is based upon a mistake before finishing with my own evaluation of the problems facing metaphysical realism and anti-realism and prospects for their resolution.

1. What is Metaphysical Realism?

Metaphysical realism is the thesis that the objects, properties and relations the world contains exist independently of our thoughts about them or our perceptions of them. Anti-realists either doubt or deny the existence of the entities the metaphysical realist believes in or else doubt or deny their independence from our conceptions of them.

Some of the metaphysical issues over which realism and anti-realism have locked horns are the following:

These represent only a small sample of current realist/anti-realist debates about the existence of certain sorts of entities or properties. Similar questions could be and have been raised about the mind-independence of the disputed entities or properties.

For example, many think that colours are mind-dependent. That is, whilst they do not dispute the existence of things that are red, green, blue, etc., they think that if no sentient creatures had ever evolved, then nothing would have been coloured. The tomato's redness is, if not in the eye of the perceiver, non-existent. Others deem moral values mind-dependent. Again, they do not doubt the existence of moral values but instead question their independence from the mind, believing them instead to be psychological or social constructs of some sort.

An obvious problem with this characterization of realism is that it seems to require anti-realism about minds (or experience)! For the existence of minds is surely ‘mind-dependent’ and indeed it is in the sense that if there were no minds there'd also be no experiences.

This is not what is intended by the ‘mind-independence’ formulation of realism, however. The ‘mind-independence’ in question is epistemic. So a realist cannot accept that minds are ‘mind-dependent’. For that would be to concede to the anti-realist that whether minds exist (and what they are like if they do) depends on what we happen to believe about the issue. A realist about mental states or conscious experiences is one who holds that our world contains creatures who are sometimes in states of believing, desiring, remembering, perceiving, etc. and that the existence and nature of such states in no way contingent on our recognition of them. The world is as it is independently of what we think about it.

This characterization of realism is not universally accepted. Some object that the mind-independence thesis is obscure. Others maintain that realism is committed, in addition, to a distinctive (and tendentious) conception of truth [Putnam 1981, 1985, 1992; Wright 1991] or, more radically, that realism just is a thesis about the nature of truth—that truth can transcend the possibility of verification, ruling statements for which we can gather no evidence one way or the other to be determinately either true or false. An example would be “Julius Caesar's heart skipped a beat as he crossed the Rubicon.” Thus the realist on this view is one who believes the law of bivalence (every statement is either true or false) holds for all meaningful (non-vague) statements [Dummett 1978, 1991, 1993].

These semantic formulations of (or incursions into) metaphysical realism are unacceptable to realists who are deflationists about truth, denying that truth is a substantive notion which can be used to characterise alternative metaphysical views [see the entry truth: deflationary theory of]. Such realists tend to ignore the anti-realist's semantic and epistemological challenges to their position.

Some examples may help to illustrate the mind-independence characterization. Most of us are realists about elephants. We believe the world contains elephants and that its containing them in no way depends upon our having perceived them or thought about them.

What about Yeti? Yeti realism is nowhere near as persuasive as elephant realism. Yes, there are lots of stories about large woolly ape-men hiding in the recesses of the Himalayas and occasionally interacting with humans (scaring them, mainly), but we're not sure what status to accord those stories. They may be veridical observations of some enormous rare ape mistaken for an ‘ape-man’, or they may be erroneous observations of sociopaths in Yak coats? Alternatively, these supposed ‘sightings’ might simply be stories Tibetans tell their children.

If Yeti reports were to prove credible and definite enough we might decide that we knew what it would take for a creature to be a Yeti and, after an exhaustive search, that the world contained no such creatures or admit, in the absence of any such search, that the world might well contain Yeti, and that whether it does or doesn't in no way depends upon our speculations on the matter.

We would be Eliminativists about Yeti if we decided that the world contained none, adopting an Error Theory towards the reports of Yeti, alleging some perceptual or other type of error behind them. We would be agnostic about Yeti if we decided that, although the reports may be veridical and there may well be such creatures, there is now no good reason to believe there are any.

Suppose, on the other hand, that all we ever will have are the vague Yeti legends we now have, in particular that no credible reports of any sightings of huge ape-like creatures ever come to light. We might then wonder whether the ‘sightings’ were even supposed to be reports. Perhaps the Yeti stories are like Santa Claus stories and not intended to be taken literally. Their function might be to chasten obstreperous Tibetan children just as Santa Claus stories function to reward good Western children, even though, naturally, both stories can only play their roles if the children mistakenly believe they are factual. This would be to take a Non-Factualist attitude to Yeti stories. The function of such stories is not to describe reality. Of course we should be cautious in adopting such a non-Factualist attitude since we could quite easily be wrong about the status of these so-called legends: perhaps there really was a creature more or less fitting the Yeti descriptions? So our non-Factualist attitude even in these circumstances would be at best provisional.

Most of us are Eliminativists about Yeti. We think there aren't any. This is because we either think that the reports are erroneous or that the ‘sightings’ are not meant to be taken literally. Those who are agnostic about Yeti take a more charitable attitude to the reports—they think that the world may well contain the sort of creature described therein. This sounds pretty unlikely to most ears. That's why we're Yeti Eliminativists for the most part and not Yeti Agnostics.

One thing we don't think is that it would never be rational to believe any report of a Yeti. To the contrary: the discovery of some huge new hairy ape by a team of reputable scientists in roughly the right vicinity should certainly lead us to reassess our Non-Factualist attitudes to Yeti reports. Given the indeterminacy of our ‘Yeti specifications’, such a discovery would still leave it open whether the creature was a Yeti. A more temperate conclusion would be that it had spawned the (rather fanciful) Yeti stories.

What of a new hairy hominid? This could very plausibly be a Yeti since the stories all agree that the Yeti is an ape-man. Still we would need further information before rushing to claim it was. Perhaps this hominid had never been seen before its discovery by the scientists and the legends were all based on perceptual errors of the sort canvassed above. It would just be a fluke that this creature fitted the descriptions. Homo Himalayus might then be called ‘Yeti’ by the scientists as a way of paying deference to the legends, rather than vindicating their authenticity.

These discussions can be contrasted with the anti-realist views to be discussed below. Anti-realists do think that it would never be rational to believe in the existence of the mind-independent entities the realist believes in. No evidence could convince us that some entity existed mind-independently because the very idea of mind-independent existence is incoherent.

To avoid misunderstanding, though, we should note that metaphysical realism and scientific realism are distinct. That the world's constituents exist mind-independently does not entail that its constituents are as science portrays them. One could adopt an instrumentalist attitude toward the theoretical entities posited by science, whilst continuing to believe that whatever entities the world actually does contain exist independently of our conceptions and perceptions of them.

2. Realism, Factualism and Mind-Independent Existence

2.1 A survey of senses of ‘metaphysical realism’

‘Metaphysical realism’ is a term that seems to have a number of different meanings. It is sometimes used, pejoratively, to refer to a philosophical tendency to seek metaphysical solutions to empirical problems, such as the question of how children learn language. Alternatively, ‘metaphysical realism’ can be used to denote realism within metaphysics (anti-nominalism) or a ‘realist attitude’ towards metaphysical disputes.

A metaphysical realist in the sense discussed in this article need not endorse any of these views or tendencies. She might seek empirical answers to empirical questions, rejecting any incursion of metaphysics. She might embrace nominalism or might even adopt a sceptical or an irrealist stance on metaphysical questions, going so far as to dismiss as unanswerable or meaningless all “ultimate” questions about the existence of properties or universals or numbers or sets, along with others of their kind such as about past and future times, selves, free will or God.

The realism at issue here is ‘metaphysical’ because it says something about the ultimate nature of things that exist in the world. In fact, the metaphysical realist need not even believe in the existence of the world. She may follow Bas Van Fraassen's lead in holding that ‘world’ is not a count noun: there are things that exist mind-independently but no entity that is the collection of things that so exist.

It is often claimed that, since the notion of mind-independent existence is obscure, metaphysical realism is best cast as a thesis about discourse or theories: sentences in some discourse or theory are to be construed literally as fact-stating ones. This is Factualism. It is often added that what these sentences state is largely true, although this is not a requirement of Factualism per se. Call this view Factualism*

It is a mistake to identify metaphysical realism with either Factualism or Factualism*. The anti-realist views to be discussed below are Factualist* about discourse describing certain contentious domains. What they contest is that the entities in these domains exist mind-independently, since they find the notion of mind-independent existence incoherent.

Given some term F, we can ask: “does the world contain Fs?” Amongst views that generally accept the notion of mind-independent existence, a selective realism about Fs vies with selective eliminativism and agnosticism as answers to such questions. The realist says “Yes”, the eliminativist says “No”, the agnostic says “We can't say”. All three views agree that the existence of Fs in no way depends upon our ability to determine that they exist.

Some anti-realists agree that there are Fs but deny that anything could exist mind-independently. Unlike eliminativists and agnostics who accept it, they reject the notion of mind-independent existence. They are factualists about F-discourse and anti-realist about Fs. However, such anti-realists differ from realists in their understanding of ‘Fs exist’ and, as a result, their interpretation of F-discourse in general differs from that of the realist's.

Clearly, adopting a non-factualist or error-theoretic interpretation of discourse about Fs commits one to anti-realism about Fs. If we think Yeti reports are systematically mistaken or that such reports are not meant to be taken literally in the first place, we will deny that the world contains any Yetis. This means factualism is a necessary condition for realism.

But it is not a sufficient condition. Verificationists who reject the idea that something might exist even though we might never be able to confirm that it did, can be factualists about F-discourse. Still, they are anti-realist about Fs since they deny that Fs could exist mind-independently.

Realism about a given class of entities may entail that discourse about them is factual but it certainly does not entail that most of our assertions concerning them are true (Factualism*). To the contrary, all our claims about the relevant domain could be mistaken. Consider mediaeval discourse about the cosmos. The mediaevals surely did believe that the cosmos was as it was, independently of what anyone thought about it. They were realists about the cosmos. Yet most of their beliefs were false, not true.

2.2 Mind-independent existence

Why do some find the notion of mind-independent existence obscure or inadequate for the task of formulating metaphysical realism? One reason is that it appears to starve anti-realists of any entitlement to the notion of objective existence. This appears tendentious. The most common complaint, however, is that the notion is either obscure, or, more strongly, incoherent or cognitively meaningless. An eloquent spokesman for this strong view was Rudolf Carnap: “My friends and I have maintained the following theses,” Carnap announces [Carnap 1963, p.868], “(1) The statement asserting the reality of the external world (realism) as well as its negation in various forms, e.g. solipsism and several forms of idealism, in the traditional controversy are pseudo-statements, i.e., devoid of cognitive content. (2) The same holds for the statements about the reality or irreality of other minds (3) and for the statements of the reality or irreality of abstract entities (realism of universals or Platonism, vs. nominalism).”

In spite of his finding these disputes meaningless, Carnap indicates how he thinks we could reconstruct them so as to make some sense of them: if we were to “replace the ontological theses about the reality or irreality of certain entities, theses which we regard as pseudo-theses, by proposals or decisions concerning the use of certain languages. Thus realism is replaced by the practical decision to use the reistic language”. Those who'd hoped this might have heralded a Factualist* reformulation of metaphysical realism will be disappointed. For this “reistic” language is strictly limited to the description of “intersubjectively observable, spatio-temporally localized things or events”. Scientific realists might feel a little cheated by this trade.

What matters for our purposes is not Carnap's sense of a commensurability between a metaphysical thesis about reality and a practical decision to speak only about observable things, but rather that he thinks he can explain how the illusion of meaningfulness arises for the metaphysical theses he declares “devoid of cognitive content”.

His explanation has to do with a distinction between two types of questions: internal and external questions. By way of illustration Carnap shows how the distinction works in the controversy over the existence of abstract entities:

An existential statement which asserts that there are entities of a specified kind can be formulated as a simple existential statement in a language containing variables for these entities. I have called existential statements of this kind, formulated within a given language, internal existential statements. [Carnap 1963, p. 871]

Carnap contends that

Just because internal statements are usually analytic and trivial, we may presume that the theses involved in the traditional philosophical controversies are not meant as internal statements, but rather as external existential statements; they purport to assert the existence of entities of the kind in question not merely within a given language, but, so to speak, before a language has been constructed. [1963, p. 871]

Declaring all such external existential questions devoid of cognitive content, Carnap now feels emboldened to dismiss both realism that asserts the ontological reality of abstract entities and nominalism that asserts their irreality as “pseudo-statements if they claim to be theoretical statements” (ibid).

More importantly, Carnap has hit upon an explanation for the persistent allure of the notion of mind-independent reality: we often wish to know whether some existence claim is true. Provided we realize existence claims can only be properly formulated and evaluated within a language L our query is perfectly reasonable and can very often be answered by examining the specification of the domain of L's quantifiers. Thus, to use Carnap's own example, suppose a theorist wishes to know for a language L′ whose domain contains material objects, classes of objects and classes of classes of objects, the answer to the following existential question:

(1) Does there exist an x and a y such that x is an element of an element of y?

Carnap maintains (ibid) that an affirmative answer to this question is both true and provable in L′ (though he does not specify any theory expressible in L′ in which (1) is derivable).

But suppose that instead of L′, our theorist had asked the same question of another language L″ the universe of discourse for which contained material objects and classes of these but no classes of classes of them. Then the following universal statement would now be provable in L″, Carnap claims (again without specifying any theory expressible in L″ for which this might hold), as well as true in that language:

(2) For every x and y, x is not an element of an element of y

Suppose our theorist, Al let's call him, though initially attracted to L′ for its superior expressive and deductive power when compared to L″, now starts to have misgivings about the content and consistency of some of its existential assertions. After deliberating he decides:

(3) There are classes of objects.

But he also accepts:

(4) There are no classes of classes of objects.

This brings him into conflict with his good friend Bob. For Bob believes not only in classes of objects but also in classes of classes of objects and thus endorses L′ as a language best suited to represent his ontological beliefs. That is, like Al, Bob believes (3), but Bob also accepts (5):

(5) There are classes of classes of objects.

Is there a genuine dispute between Al and Bob? Is there a fact of the matter as to who is right, whose ontological views reflect the way the world is really structured? Carnap says “No”: seeking to elevate the modal status of their linguistic decisions from mere preferences for one language over another to unconditional obligations to reflect how reality is independently of any representaton, Al and Bob have temporarily lost sight of the particular linguistic contexts that give meaning to the existential claims they respectively advanced at (4) and (5). All that can be meaningfully said, according to Carnap, is that whilst (4) is true in L″ it is false in L′ and, conversely, whilst (5) is true in L′, it is false in L″. The cognitive content of (5) for Bob is given by (1) and that of (4) for Al by (2). They have each fallen victim to the constant temptation to project features of our representations of reality onto reality itself with the result that they are left pondering a senseless external question instead of its meaningful internal counterpart. As Carnap puts it:

Thus we see the difference between (them) is not a difference in theoretical beliefs [as Bob seems to think] when he makes the pseudo-assertion at (5); it is merely a practical difference in preferences and decisions concerning the acceptance of languages. [loc. cit., p. 873]

This is a beguiling story but it does not do what Carnap wishes it to do: it does not spirit away all troubling metaphysical questions about mind-independent existence by parlaying them into (or replacing them with) sanitized questions about the entities the quantifiers range over in this or that language. Here's why. Consider the following case. Suppose the year is 1928, the year Carnap published his Aufbau. A mathematician, Cass, working in classical mathematics (sometimes shortened to simply “CM”), comes across the following question:

(Q) Are there irrational numbers a and b such that ab is rational?

Cass realizes at once that she can answer this question, reasoning from premise (A):

(A) Either √2√2 is rational or it is irrational.

The reasoning continues:

Suppose this number is rational. Then our problem is solved taking a = √2, b = √2. Suppose alternatively that √2√2 is irrational. Then that very number raised to the power √2 must be rational. So in this latter case, select a = √2√2, b = √2.

Whence, we have a solution to our problem:

(C) Either a = √2, b = √2 or else a = √2√2, b = √2 are such that ab is rational

Now as the background logic for CM is classical there is nothing wrong with Cass's reasoning proceeding, as it does, from an instance of the classically valid Law of Excluded Middle at (A). It is an example of a “non-constructive” existence proof: demonstrating that one or another alternative must hold without providing a means for ascertaining which one does hold.

Suppose now we ask Cass which of the two statements below is true in classical mathematics:

  1. √2 is an irrational number such that √2√2 is a rational number.
  2. √2√2 and √2 are irrational numbers such that (√2√2)√2 is a rational number.

Cass, working in 1928, believes one or the other of these statements must be true in classical mathematics but she has no means for determining which is true. So she cannot answer our question. Further, let us suppose that no one ever does find a method for determining which alternative holds good.

Aside: As it turns out (and this is the reason for indexing the example to a particular time) this last supposition is contrary to fact. In 1934 Gelfond and Schneider independently proved that if a, b are algebraic numbers with a ≠ 0 or 1 and b not rational then any value of ab [= Exp (b log a)] is a transcendental number. The Gelfond-Schneider Theorem answered in the affirmative David Hilbert's Seventh Problem: whether 2√2 is transcendental. It also follows that √2√2 is irrational so that (II) is true-in-CM.

Now even though she lacks any method for deciding which alternative holds, according to Cass either (I) is true-in-CM or else (II) is true-in-CM. But if so, Cass in 1928 has (and we could have had today on the pretence that the Gelfond-Schneider Theorem had lain forever undiscovered) an instance of a mind-independent existence claim holding of an internal existence statement: one of these two pairs of numbers (a, b) in question, either (a=√2, b=√2) or else (a=√2√2, b=√2) is such that a and b are both irrational but ab is rational even though we may never be able to determine which pair of numbers it is.

Consider now the views of Cass's contemporary, Dora. Dora eschews classical mathematics with its classical logic in favour of intuitionistic mathematics (sometimes shortened to simply “IM”). Cass's reasoning above cannot be replicated in intuitionistic mathematics since the Law of Excluded Middle does not hold in intuitionistic logic for cases, such as occur in classical mathematics, where the disjunction is undecidable. How then should we characterize the disagreement between Cass and Dora? Where Cass thinks that there are certain irrational numbers which when raised to irrational powers are rational, Dora demurs. She thinks that there is no warrant for believing Cass' disjunctive proof as we lack a proof of either of its disjuncts. Cass sees no reason to doubt that numbers might possess properties we may never be able to ascertain. Dora on the other hand sees no warrant for believing they do. We might consider Cass a Platonist viewing numbers as existing independently of our cognitive circumscription of them, where Dora is a constructivist regarding numbers as mental constructs.

But what should Carnap say about this case? Even if he were to protest that Cass's and Dora's dispute is no theoretical disagreement just as for the Al/Bob case, he cannot protest that Cass's assertion that one or other element of the inscrutable sentence pair {(I),{II}) is true-in-CM is a pseudo-statement as he did for Bob's assertion (5) that there are classes of classes of objects. For the statement that either (I) is true-in-CM or else (II) is true-in-CM is an internal statement and thus, by Carnap's lights, has cognitive content.

Hence, one cannot undermine the notion of mind-independent reality in the simple way Carnap imagines, namely, by the internal/external distinction coupled with the claim that external statements are pseudo-statements. For, whatever its other virtues, the internal/external distinction cannot explain why someone should believe that exactly one of (I) or (II) has to be true in a certain language even though we might never be in a position to determine which. And this is precisely what the belief in mind-independent reality amounts to.

Had Carnap been right, a direct and easy path to anti-realism would have opened up. For if all questions of mind-independent existence were external, then rejecting the intelligibility of external questions as Carnap does would also be to reject the concept of mind-independent existence, so that metaphysical realism would have been rendered untenable. But we have just seen that internal existence statements can reflect a mind-independent reality. As a result, there is nothing inimical to metaphysical realism in the rejection of metaphysical questions. Non-factualism about metaphysics is one thing, metaphysical realism quite another. For the metaphysical realist might be a reductionist of a certain type—a common-sense realist, for instance, believing only in the common-sense objects encountered in experience or, at another extreme, a scientific realist, accepting as real only the basic entities posited by science.

3. Representation and Mind-Independence

Realism is a metaphysical thesis about what the world is like and what it contains. It is not a semantic thesis concerned with how humans represent the world in thought or language. How can it then be vulnerable to semantic or epistemic challenge?

Quite simply: if the world is as resolutely mind-independent as the realist makes out, there is a problem, first, how we succeed in representing it, and, second, how we succeed in getting to know about it. Wouldn't a truly mind-independent world make any representation of it, in thought or language, unreliable, if not impossible? On what grounds can we trust our theories if they could all be radically mistaken? These are precisely the questions anti-realist urge in their various semantic and epistemological challenges to realism.

Realists generally do think that we are able to represent the world reliably. Scientific realists think science is the best representation that we have of what the world is like and that its representations correspond pretty closely to the way things actually are. Yet it is crucial to their position that even our best scientific theories—General Relativity, Quantum Theory, Theory of Evolution etc.—could be radically mistaken. Be that as it may, according to scientific realists, when scientists talk about muons and quarks, gravitational constants, entropy, quantum fluctuations, the curvature of space-time etc. they are not just exploiting some useful linguistic devices for organizing their observational data, they are telling us what the world contains, independently of what anyone might think it contains.

For the scientist's representations of the world to be reliable, there must be a correlation between these representations and the states of affairs which they portray. So the cosmologist who utters the statement “the entropy of the Big Bang was remarkably low” has uttered a truth if and only if the entropy of the Big Bang was remarkably low.

A natural question to ask is how the correlation between the statement and the mind-independent state of affairs which makes it true is supposed to be set up. How does it come about that the word ‘entropy’ refers to the amount of disorder in a system, that the descriptive name ‘the Big Bang’ refers to the event with which the Universe began? It is not as if, unbeknownst to us, the shock waves of that cataclysmic event continue to reverberate some fourteen billion years later in human minds dislodging a mental symbol as if it were a loose tooth, this symbol referring to whatever it was that shook it free. How then does that mental symbol get to refer to the Big Bang?

The only plausible answer has to do with us as cognitive beings. It is something about the way we use our words or deploy our mental symbols in thought and action which effects this correlation between mental symbol and worldly referent.

Suppose this is not so. Assume instead that God or Nature has solved this problem for us. God or Nature has set up just the right connections between our mental symbols and the bits of the world which we take ourselves to be referring to in thought.

Still we face the problem not only of finding evidence that this has occurred, but also, and more importantly, of how this has come to be. Yet it seems the relevant evidence will be just what it was if God or Nature had not been so obliging—linguistically, it will be the use speakers make of their words, the statements they endorse and the statements they dissent from, the rationalizations they provide for their actions, their defence and explanations of their views and criticisms of opposing views etc.; cognitively, it will be the functional role of mental symbols in thought, perception, language learning etc.

4. The Anti-Realist Challenges to Metaphysical Realism

4.1 Language Use and Understanding

The first anti-realist challenge to consider focuses on the use we make of our words and sentences. The challenge is simply this: what aspect of our linguistic use could provide the necessary evidence for the realist's correlation between sentences and mind-independent states of affairs? Which aspects of our semantic behaviour manifest our grasp of these correlations, assuming they do hold?

When we look at how speakers actually do use their sentences, anti-realists claim, we see them responding not to states of affairs that they cannot in general detect but rather to agreed upon conditions for asserting these sentences. Scientists assert “the entropy of the Big Bang was remarkably low” because they all concur that the conditions justifying this assertion have been met.

What prompts us to use our sentences in the way that we do are the public justification conditions associated with those sentences, justification conditions forged in linguistic practices which imbue these sentences with meaning.

The realist believes we are able to mentally represent mind-independent states of affairs. But what of cases where everything that we know about the world leaves it unsettled whether the relevant state of affairs obtains? Did Socrates sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock or did he not? How could we possibly find out? Yet realists hold that the sentence “Socrates sneezed in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock” will be true if Socrates did sneeze then and false if he did not and that this is a significant semantic fact.

The Manifestation challenge to realism is to isolate some feature of the use agents make of their words, or their mental symbols, which effects the link between mind-independent states of affairs and the thoughts and sentences that represent them. Nothing in the thinker's linguistic behaviour, according to the anti-realist, provides evidence that this link has been forged—linguistic use is keyed to public assertibility conditions, not undetectable truth-conditions. In those cases, such as the Socrates one, where we cannot find out whether the truth-condition is satisfied or not, it is simply gratuitous to believe that there is anything we can think or say or do which could provide evidence that the link has been set up in the first place. So the anti-realist claims [Dummett 1978, 1991, 1993 Tennant 1997; Wright 1993].

Why should we expect the evidence to be behavioural rather than, say, neurophysiological? The reason anti-realists give is that the meanings of our words and (derivatively for them) the contents of our thoughts are essentially communicable and thus must be open for all speakers and thinkers to see [Dummett 1978, 1993].

An interesting question arises as to whether our linguistic dispositions suffice to determine what we mean by our words. Saul Kripke has argued, on behalf of Wittgenstein, that the answer to this is ‘No’—that there are simply no facts that correspond to one's meaning Yeti by the word ‘Yeti’ irrespective of whether these facts are restricted to behavioural ones. The resultant meaning scepticism has been argued by some to lead to a very radical global anti-realism which is dubiously coherent [Boghossian 1989, Wright 1984].

4.2 Language Acquisition

The second challenge to be considered concerns our acquisition of language. Suppose God had linked our mental representations to just the right states of affairs in the way required by the realist. If so, this is a semantically significant fact. Anyone learning their native language would have to grasp these correspondences between sentences and states of affairs. How can they do this if even the competent speakers whom they seek to emulate cannot detect when these correspondences hold? In short, competence in one's language would be impossible to acquire if realism were true [Dummett 1978, 1993; Wright 1993].

4.3 Radical Scepticism

It has been argued that states of affairs that are truly mind-independent engender radical scepticism. The sceptic contends that for all we could tell we could be brains in a vat—brains kept alive in a bath of nutrients by mad alien scientists. All our thoughts, all our experience, all that passed for science would be systematically mistaken if we were. We'd have no bodies although we thought we did, the world would contain no physical objects, yet it would seem to us that it did, there'd be no Earth, no Sun, no vast universe, only the brain's deluded representations of such. At least this could be the case if our representations derived even part of their content from links with mind-independent objects and states of affairs. Since realism implies that such an absurd possibility could hold without our being able to detect it, it has to be rejected, according to anti-realists.

A much stronger anti-realist argument uses the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis to show that realism is internally incoherent rather than, as before, simply false. A crucial assumption of the argument is semantic externalism, the thesis that the reference of our words and mental symbols is partially determined by contingent relations between thinkers and the world. This is a semantic assumption many realists independently endorse.

Given semantic externalism, the argument proceeds by claiming that if we were brains in a vat we could not possibly have the thought that we were. For, if we were so envatted, we could not possibly mean by ‘brain’ and ‘vat’ what unenvatted folk mean by these words since our words would be connected only to neural impulses or images in our brains where the unenvatteds' words are connected to real-life brains and real-life vats. Similarly, the thought we pondered whenever we posed the question “am I a brain in a vat?” could not possibly be the thought unenvatted folk pose when they ask themselves the same-sounding question in English. But realism entails that we could indeed be brains in a vat. As we have just shown that were we to be so, we could not even entertain this as a possibility, realism is incoherent [Putnam 1981].

4.4 Conceptual Schemes and Pluralism

If the notion of mind-independent existence is incoherent, as anti-realists contend, what should we put in its stead? Berkeley famously answered “Mind-dependent existence!” where the Mind in question, for the good Bishop, was, of course, the Mind of God. Modern anti-realists tend not to be theists and tend not to relativize existence to any single mind. Instead of God they posit conceptual schemes as that on which the notion of existence depends. To that extent they follow Kant rather than Berkeley, though unlike Kant they tend to be pluralists—it is conceptual schemes which they endorse rather than The One Conceptual Scheme which Kant held to be obligatory for all rational creatures.

According to this view, there can no more be an answer to the question “What objects and properties does the world contain?” outside of some scheme for classifying entities than there can be an answer to the question of whether two events A and B are simultaneous outside of some inertial frame for dating those events. The objects which exist are the objects some conceptual scheme says exists. ‘mesons exist’ really means ‘mesons exist relative to the conceptual scheme of current physics’.

Realists think there is a unitary sense of ‘object’, ‘property’ etc., for which the question “what objects and properties does the world contain?” makes sense. Any answer which succeeded in listing all the objects, properties, events etc. which the world contains would comprise a privileged description of that totality. Anti-realists reject this. For them ‘object’, ‘property’ etc., shift their senses as we move from one conceptual scheme to another. Some anti-realists argue that there cannot be a totality of all the objects the world contains since the notion of ‘object’ is indefinitely extensible and so, trivially, there cannot be a privileged description of any such totality.

How does the anti-realist defend conceptual relativity? One way is by arguing that there can be two complete theories of the world which are descriptively equivalent yet logically incompatible from the realist's point of view. For example, theories of space-time can be formulated in one of two mathematically equivalent ways: as an ontology of points, with spatiotemporal regions being defined as sets of points; or as an ontology of regions, with points being defined as convergent sets of regions. Such theories are descriptively equivalent since mathematically equivalent and yet are logically incompatible from the realist's point of view, anti-realists contend [Putnam 1985, 1990].

4.5 Models and Reality

Putnam's Model-Theoretic Argument is the most technical of the arguments we have so far considered although we shall not reproduce all the technicalities here. The central ideas can be conveyed informally, although some technical concepts will be mentioned where necessary. The argument purports to show that the Representation Problem—to explain how our mental symbols and words get hooked up to mind-independent objects and how our sentences and thoughts target mind-independent states of affairs—is insoluble.

According to the Model-Theoretic Argument, there are simply too many ways in which our mental symbols can be mapped onto items in the world. The consequence of this is a dilemma for the realist. The first horn of the dilemma is that he must accept that what our symbols refer to is massively indeterminate. The second horn is that he must insist that even an ideal theory, whose terms and predicates can demonstrably be mapped veridically onto objects and properties in the world might still be false, i.e., that such a mapping might not be the right one, the one ‘intended’.

Neither alternative can be defended, according to anti-realists. Conerning the first alternative, massive indeterminacy for perfectly determinate terms is absurd. As for the second, for realists to contend that even an ideal theory could be false is to resort to dogmatism, since on their own admission we cannot tell which mapping the world has set up for us. Such dogmatism leaves the realist with no answer to a scepticism which undermines any capacity to reliably represent the world, anti-realists maintain.

Why can't an ideal theory be false? To admit that this is possible is to admit that there is a gap between what is true and what is ideally warranted by our best theory, something no anti-realist can afford. But an argument is needed to show this is not possible. Anti-realists have one in the Model-Theoretic Argument. It proceeds thus:

Suppose we had an ideal theory which passed every observational and theoretical test we could conceive of. Assume this theory could be formalized in first-order logic. Assume also that the world is infinite in size and that our formalized ideal theory T says it is. Assume, finally, T is consistent. Then given these assumptions, anti-realists argue, we can show that T is also true:

Firstly, as T is syntactically consistent, by the Completeness Theorem for first-order logic, T will have a model. Then by the Löwenheim-Skolem-Tarski Theorem, there exists a model elementarily equivalent to the model generated by the Completeness Theorem that is of the same size as the world (since by Löwenheim-Skolem-Tarski Theorem T will have models of every infinite size). Call this model M.

Nothing in the construction of M guarantees that the objects in its domain are objects in the real world. To the contrary, the domain of M may be comprised wholly of real numbers for example. So to obtain, as required, a model whose domain consists of objects in the world, use Löwenheim-Skolem-Tarski Theorem once more to project the model M onto the world by generating from M a new model W whose domain consists of the objects in the world and which assigns to all the predicates of T subclasses of its domain and relations defined on that domain.

We now have a correspondence between the expressions of the language L in which T is expressed and (sets of) objects in the world just as the realist requires. T will then be true if ‘true’ just means ‘true-in-W’.

If T is not guaranteed true by this procedure it can only be because W is not the intended model. Yet all our observation sentences come out true according to W and the theoretical constraints must be satisfied because T's theses all come out true in W also. So the realist owes us an explanation of what constraints a model has to satisfy for it to be ‘intended’ over and above its satisfying every observational and theoretical constraint we can conceive of.

Suppose on the other hand that the realist is able to somehow specify the intended model. Call this model W*. Then nothing the realist can do can possibly distinguish W* from a permuted variant P which can be specified following Putnam 1994b, 356–357:

We define properties of being a cat* and being a mat* such that:
  1. In the actual world cherries are cats* and trees are mats*.
  2. In every possible world the two sentences “A cat is on a mat” and “A cat* is on a mat*” have precisely the same truth value.

Instead of considering two sentences “A cat is on a mat” and “A cat* is on a mat*” now consider only the one “A cat is on a mat”, allowing its interpretation to change by first adopting the standard interpretation for it and then adopting the non-standard interpretation in which the set of cats* are assigned to ’cat’ in every possible world and the set of mats* are assigned to ’mat’ in every possible world. The result will be the truth-value of “A cat is on a mat” will not change and will be exactly the same as before in every possible world. Similar non-standard reference assignments could be constructed for all the predicates of a language. [See Putnam 1985, 1994b.]

5. Realist Responses

5.1 Language Use and Understanding

We now turn to some realist responses to these challenges. The Manifestation and Language Acquisition arguments allege there is nothing in an agent's cognitive or linguistic behaviour that could provide evidence that they had grasped what it was for a sentence to be true in the realist's sense of ‘true’. How can you manifest a grasp of a notion which can apply or fail to apply without you being able to tell which? How could you ever learn to use such a concept?

One possible realist response is that the concept of truth is actually very simple, and it is spurious to demand that one always be able to determine whether a concept applies. As to the first part, it is often argued that all there is to the notion of truth is what is given by the formula “‘p’ is true if and only if p”. The function of the truth-predicate is to disquote sentences in the sense of undoing the effects of quotation—thus all that one is saying in calling the sentence “Yeti are vicious” true is that Yeti are vicious.

It is not clear that this response really addresses the anti-realist's worry, however. It may well be that there is a simple algorithm for learning the meaning of ‘true’ and that, consequently, there is no special difficulty in learning to apply the concept. But that by itself does not tell us whether the predicate ‘true’ applies to cases where we cannot ascertain that it does. All the algorithm tells us, in effect, is that if it is legitimate to assert p it is legitimate to assert that ‘p ‘ is true. So are we entitled to assert ‘either Socrates did or did not sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock’ or are we not? Presumably that will depend on what we mean by the sentence, whether we mean to be adverting to two states of affairs neither of which we have any prospect of ever confirming.

Anti-realists follow verificationists in rejecting the intelligibility of such states of affairs and tend to base their rules for assertion on intuitionistic logic, which rejects the universal applicability of the Law of Bivalence (the principle that every statement is either true or false). This law is a foundational semantic principle for classical logic.

As to the claim that it is spurious to require one always be able to determine whether a concept applies, an analogy might be drawn with vagueness where borderline instances of a vague predicate may not permit one to tell whether the predicate applies or not. If one accepts the epistemic conception of vagueness then one will hold that a ‘penumbral’ case of red could indeed be red even though we could not in principle determine that it was. Since this is precisely how the realist thinks of truth, as applying (or failing to apply) independently of our capacity to determine this, the analogy would be apt. But the epistemic theory of vagueness is highly controversial and other theories of vagueness deny that borderline red surfaces must either be red or not. Perhaps the realist could then link the two theories, claiming that since there is no incoherence in the epistemic interpretation of vagueness, there is no incoherence in the realist notion of truth? Predictably, though, the anti-realist will reply that if these two theories really must stand or fall together, then they fall together.

A more direct realist response to the Manifestation challenge points to the prevalence in our linguistic practices of realist-inspired beliefs to which we give expression in what we say and do. We assert things like “either there were an odd or an even number of dinosaurs on this planet independently of what anyone believes” and all our actions and other assertions confirm that we really do believe this. Furthermore, the overwhelming acceptance of classical logic by mathematicians and scientists and their rejection of intuitionistic logic for the purposes of mainstream science provides very good evidence for the coherence and usefulness of a realist understanding of truth.

Anti-realists reject this reply. They argue that all we make manifest by asserting things like “either Socrates sneezed in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock or else he didn't” is our pervasive misunderstanding of the notion of truth. They apply the same diagnosis to our belief in the mind-independence of elephants and to the counterfactual above which expresses this belief. We overgeneralize the notion of truth, believing that it applies in cases where it does not. An apparent consequence of their view is that reality is indeterminate in surprising ways—we have no grounds for asserting that Socrates did sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock and no grounds for asserting that he did not and no prospect of ever finding out which. Does this mean that for anti-realists the world contains no such fact as the fact that Socrates did one or the other of these two things? Not necessarily. For anti-realists who subscribe to intuitionistic principles of reasoning, the most that can be said is that there is no present warrant to assert that Socrates either did or did not sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock.

Perhaps anti-realists are right about all this. But if so, they need to explain how a practice based on a pervasive illusion can be as successful as modern science. Anti-realists perturbed by the manifestability of realist truth are revisionists about parts of our linguistic practice, and the consequence of this revisionist stance is that mathematics and science require extensive and non-trivial revision.

Much could be and has been said by anti-realists in response to this point. Standing back from the debate between the two sides is not always easy but at least this point should be made. Nothing said so far solves the Representation Problem, the problem of how our mental symbols get to target mind-independent entities in the first place, let alone the right ones. Some natural mechanism for effecting the right links must be at work for it cannot just be a primitive inexplicable fact that ‘the Big Bang’ refers to the Big Bang. If this problem could be solved, the Manifestation and Acquisition challenges would, presumably, be answered. It would then, of course, be the burden of the other anti-realist challenges to show that the realist cannot solve the Representation Problem. In introducing the Representation Problem in section 3 the suggestion that Nature has set up the right connections between our mental symbols and the bits of the world which we take ourselves to be referring to in thought appeared to receive fairly short shrift. In section 6 when we look at the question of whether the Representation Problem is based on a mistake we shall consider some evidence for thinking this may in fact be the right answer.

5.2 Language Acquisition

The challenge to realism posed by language acquisition is to explain how a child could come to know the meanings of certain sentences within his/her language: the ones which the realist contends have undetectable truth-makers associated with them. How could the child learn the meanings of such sentences if these meanings are determined by states of affairs not even competent speakers can detect?

Consider (S):

(S) Socrates sneezed in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock.

Realists say (S) is either true or false even though we may (and almost certainly will) never know which it is. The state of affairs which satisfies (S)'s truth-condition when it is true, its ‘truthmaker’, and the state of affairs which satisfies the truth-condition of the negation of (S) when (S) is false are supposed to be able to hold even though competent speakers cannot detect whether they do. How could the child ever learn about this undetectable relation?

This challenge is exacerbated by the anti-realist's assumption that since the linguistic meaning of an expression E is determined solely by competent speakers' use of E the child's task in all cases is to infer the meaning of E from its use. Thus Dummett [1978 pp. 216–217], in discussing the meaning of mathematical statements, proposes a thesis he argues holds for the meanings of every kind of statement:

The meaning of a mathematical statement determines and is exhaustively determined by its use. The meaning of a mathematical statement cannot be, or contain as an ingredient, anything which is not manifest in the use made of it, lying solely in the mind of the individual who apprehends that meaning: if two individual agree completely about the use to be made of the statement, then they agree about its meaning. The reason is that the meaning of a statement consists solely in its role as an instrument of communication between individuals, just as the powers of a chess-piece consist solely in its role in the game according to the rules.

W.V.O. Quine is even more insistent on the public nature of linguistic meaning. Displaying his unshakable faith in Skinnerian models of language-learning he writes [1992, pp. 37-38]:

In psychology one may or may not be a behaviourist, but in linguistics one has no choice. Each of us learns his language by observing other people's verbal behaviour and having his own faltering verbal behaviour observed and reinforced or corrected by others. We depend strictly on overt behaviour in observable situations. As long as our command of our language fits all external checkpoints, where our utterance or our reaction to someone's utterance can be appraised in the light of some shared situations, so long all is well. Our mental life between checkpoints is indifferent to our rating as a master of the language. There is nothing in linguistic meaning beyond what is to be gleaned from overt behaviour in observable circumstances.

How should realists respond to this challenge? They should question the publicity of meaning principle as it applies to language learning and they should question this principle on empirical as well as conceptual grounds. That the meaning of a word is in some sense determined by its use in a given language is little more than a platitude. That the meaning of a word is exhaustively manifest in its use as an instrument of communication is not. The evidence from developmental psychology indicates some meaning is pre-linguistic and that some pre-linguistic meaning or conceptual content does indeed relate to situations that are not detectable by the child. We shall review some of this evidence in Section 6 when we consider the question of whether the Representation Problem rests on a mistake. The realist might also wish to argue that if meaning really were exhaustively determined by use in the way Dummett thinks, it would almost certainly be massively indeterminate. This, of course, was precisely the conclusion Quine drew but Dummett is not prepared to concede massive indeterminacy for natural languages. To the contrary, many of his arguments against realism can only succeed if one assumes determinacy.

5.3 Radical Scepticism

Realists who are naturalistic in their thinking are perhaps better placed than others to respond to this particular challenge. Recall that the Brain-in-a-Vat argument purports to show that realism is incoherent on the grounds that it is both committed to the genuine possibility of our being brains in a vat and yet entails something inconsistent with this: namely, that were we to be so envatted we could not possibly have the thought that we were!

Realists have two obvious responses. They may either forswear commitment to brains in a vat or else deny the semantic externalism which allegedly implies we could not think that we were brains in a vat were we to be so.

Naturalistic realists do question the coherence of the very idea of our being brains in a vat. For them there is no external vantage point from which one can assess our best overall theory and yet the sceptic's hypothesis feigns to occupy just such a vantage point. How so? By using terms which derive their meaning from successful theory to pose a problem which, if intelligible, would rob those very terms of meaning. In a similar vein some naturalistic realists have claimed that the mad scientists face an insoluble problem of combinatorial explosion the moment they give you any significant exploratory and volitional powers in the virtual world in which you are imprisoned.

As to the latter, it may be that the clever alien scientists have generated a convincing illusion of significant exploratory and volitional powers in the mind of the poor envatted brain. Whether the sceptic's prospect is intelligible only at the cost of robbing the very terms in which it is framed of meaning is much more difficult to assess, however.

What of denying semantic externalism? Is this really a live option for realists? The answer is “Yes”. Many realists think that the Representation Problem is just a pseudo-problem. When we say things like “’cat’ refers to cats” or “’quark’ refers to quarks” we are simply registering our dispositions to call everything we consider sufficiently cat-like/quark-like, ‘cat’/’quark’. According to these semantic deflationists, it is just a confusion to ask how the link was set up between our use of ‘the Big Bang’ and the event of that name which occurred some fourteen billion years ago. Some naturalistic story can, presumably, be told about how creatures like us developed the linguistic dispositions we did, in the telling of which it will emerge how we come to assert things like “the entropy of the Big Bang was very low”.

But it is a moot question whether semantic deflationism really dissolves the Representation Problem or merely fails to face up to it. However the story about the origins of our linguistic dispositions is told, it had better be that our utterances of “the entropy of the Big Bang was very low” somehow end up evincing just the right sort of differential sensitivity to the Big Bang's having low entropy. For if all there is to the story are our linguistic dispositions and the conditions to which they are presently attuned, the case has effectively been ceded to the anti-realist who denies it is possible to set up a correlation between our utterances or thoughts and the mind-independent states of affairs which, according to the metaphysical realist, uniquely make them true.

A different response questions the implementation of externalist constraints in the argument. It may well be that if we were brains in a vat we could not express the thought the unenvatted express when they say ‘we might be brains in a vat’ but this does not prove this thought is inexpressible tout court for such a brain. Perhaps the brain can contemplate the possibility of its own incarceration using some sophisticated indirect theoretical reasoning?

Realists in general see it as a fatal weakness of anti-realism that it does not permit fallible, finite creatures to be radically mistaken in the beliefs they form about the world. Many realists favourably disposed to semantic externalism do wish to hold both that we could indeed be brains in a vat and that even so we could form the conjecture that we were. Of course the burden of proof is then placed on the realist to show how, compatibly with externalism, the brains can become aware of the possibility that they are envatted.

How does Putnam prove we can know we are not brains in a vat? Anthony Brueckner [1992] has reconstructed Putnam's argument so that the conclusion that I'm not a brain in a vat can be shown to follow from 3 assumptions:

  1. Externalism. “I” refers to a putative English speaker who speaks English iff s/he does not speak Vattish.
  2. Disquotational Truth (DT). My utterances of “I'm a brain in a vat” are true iff I'm a brain in a vat.
  3. Disquotational Reference (DR). In my utterances of “I'm a brain in a vat”, the word “I” refers to me, ‘brain’ refers to brains, ‘in’ refers to the inclusion relation, and ‘vat’ refers to vats.

Putnam's proof then proceeds from the claim that either I am a brain in a vat or else I'm not via these 3 assumptions to establish that in each case, envatted and not, a significant intermediate conclusion follows: if I'm a brain in a vat then my utterances of “I'm a brain in a vat” are uniformly false! An important question, in the light of the assumption of externalism at (I), concerns the language in which the argument is supposed to be formulated. Normally we require sound arguments to retain their soundness when translated from one natural language to another—an argument that's sound in English ought also to be sound in Urdu or Malagasay, allowing for certain peculiarities of linguistic form that might help determine the truth of a premise in one language but which might have no translational correlate in the other. Ex hypothesi, the language of the argument will either be English or Vattish (or, more generally, L or Vat-L for some specified natural language L). Yet if the language is Vattish, principles (II) and (III) governing disquotational truth and reference respectively will no longer apply. This is because these principles are only defined for the language one speaks, here English. So a translation manual is needed to extend (DT) and (DR) to Vattish:

  1. Extended Disquotational Truth for Vattish (XDVT). My utterances of “I'm a brain in a vat” are true iff I-in-the-image am a brain-in-a-vat-in-the-image.
  2. Extended Disquotational Reference for Vattish (XDVR). In my utterances of “I'm a brain in a vat”, “I” refersXDVR to me-in-the-image, ‘brain’ refersXDVR to brains-in-the-image, ‘in’ refersXDVR to the image inclusion relation, ‘vat’ refersXDVR to vats-in-the-image.

But applying the principles (XDVT) and (XDVR), as required for the case where I am assumed to be a brain in a vat, undermines Putnam's proof. For it robs the sub-derivation proceeding in accord with that hypothesis of a crucial lemma needed to establish the intermediate conclusion mentioned above: that if I'm a brain in a vat then my utterances of “I'm a brain in a vat” are uniformly false. The lemma in question states that my utterances of “I'm a brain in a vat” are true only if my “I” tokens refer to me and my ‘brain-in-a-vat’ tokens refer to brains in vats [Khlentzos 2004]. Further, even if Putnam's proof that we can know we are not brains in vats could be recast to avoid this problem it is doubtful that an anti-realist would wish to avail herself of it. This is because it proceeds from an instance of Excluded Middle in the form of the leading claim that either I'm a brain in a vat or I'm not.

Realists influenced by Saul Kripke's views on metaphysics and epistemology might wish to argue that we do in fact know a priori that we are not brains in a vat. However, this is not because it is incoherent to suppose that we are. To the contrary, since we could have been brains in a vat the speculation that we in fact are is perfectly coherent. It is simply false. That we are not brains in a vat is thus a contingent a priori truth for such realists who see the brain-in-the-vat argument as conflating epistemological questions of what can be known a priori with metaphysical questions as to what is and is not genuinely possible.

This response is all well and good provided we really can know a priori that we are not brains in a vat. Yet it is difficult to shake the doubt that we can know any such thing a priori: isn't it merely a better explanation of the actual course of our experience that we are not envatted?

At least this should be said. The anti-realists who reject the sceptic's thesis as unintelligible are not alone in doing this. Naturalistic realists often do as well. However, a demonstration that anti-realism alone can justifiably reject scepticism would be a very powerful point in its favour.

Yet it has to be said that the reasons anti-realists have so far offered for thinking they alone can confute the sceptic are not fully convincing. Either they give the hypothesis that I am a brain in a vat the same short shrift some naturalistic realists do, though for different reasons (having to do with the lack of assertibility conditions for the sentence “I am a brain in a vat”) or else they attempt to show that if I were a brain in a vat I'd be able to deduce that I am not since my utterances of “I am a brain in a vat” would come out uniformly untrue. In the latter case, even if the conclusion is sustained by the reasoning (which is highly debatable) it is open to the realist to endorse it. So there is no ground at present for thinking that anti-realism alone can stave off radical scepticism as unintelligible.

Of course, anti-realists do not need to reject radical scepticism as unintelligible. They might join Kripkean realists in claiming that we know a priori that the brain-in-the-vat hypothesis is false although their reasons for asserting this would differ sharply from the realist's.

5.4 Conceptual Schemes and Pluralism

In this section I present responses to arguments from conceptual relativity that metaphysical realists might endorse and shall not try to distinguish between conceptual relativism and conceptual pluralism. To the extent that it seems to make the existence of all things relative to the classificatory skills of minds, the thesis of conceptual relativity looks highly counter-intuitive. Whilst it may be quite plausible to think that colours or moral values might disappear with the extinction of sentient life on Earth, it is not at all plausible to think that elephants and Yetis (if there are any) let alone trees, rocks and microbes would follow in their train! If our intuitions are anything to go by, then, the idea of conceptual relativity looks highly suspect.

Kant had a story to tell about why our intuitions about conceptual relativity were unreliable. This had to do with his distinction between empirical realism and transcendental idealism. According to the latter, our knowledge of what exists is nothing other than knowledge of how various objects appear to us. Of necessity, the knowing mind cannot reach behind those appearances to how things are in themselves.

Dividing Kant's One True Conceptual Scheme into The Many suggested by modern anti-realists need not alter the basic distinction between how things are and how knowing minds represent them—unless, of course, that distinction is itself questionable. In fact, many anti-realists do reject any such division, finding the whole idea of our being able to factor our knowledge of the world into separable contributions made by representational scheme and represented reality, quite objectionable. To them, Kant's problem with ‘noumena’ stems from a lingering, unrecognized attachment to realist metaphysics.

To the realist who complains that elephants would not cease to exist if humans vanished from the planet, the anti-realist should reply “Of course not!” To the contrary we accept a theory which licenses us to assert “Elephants exist” and also licenses us to assert “if humans were to disappear from this planet, elephants need not follow in their train” since the theory assures us that the existence of elephants in no way causally depends on the existence of humans. For the anti-realist the true picture is that our well-founded practices of assertion ground at one and the same time our conception of the world and our conception of humanity's place within it.

Realists are unlikely to be satisfied with this response, however. The worry is not that elephants might disappear, along with the rest of the mind-dependent world, with some plague that wiped out humanity but rather that whether there are to be any elephants in the first place apparently depends upon the conceptual schemes humans happen to chance upon. The relativity of existence to conceptual scheme is, in this respect, quite unlike the relativity of simultaneity to frame of reference.

Still, we have actual instances of conceptual schemes which explain the same phenomena equally well yet which are logically incompatible from the realist's point of view, anti-realists maintain. The earlier example of competing theories of space-time was a case in point. Recall that according to the first theory space-time consists of unextended spatiotemporal points and regions of space-time were to be explained as sets of these points whilst according to the second space-time consists of extended spatiotemporal regions and points were merely logical constructions, identifiable with convergent sets of regions.

In order to assess such examples we need a criterion of descriptive equivalence. Anti-realists have suggested that two theories are descriptively equivalent if each theory can be interpreted in the other and both theories explain the same phenomena.

Realists reject the anti-realist claim that there are two descriptively equivalent logically incompatible theories in cases such as the space-time one. Within the context of the relative interpretation of the one theory within the other, all the two alternative constructions of points in terms of regions and regions in terms of points actually show, the realist will say, is that there is a systematic way of assigning a point space to a region space and vice versa.

Anti-realist respond that the two theories really are incompatible since the region theory denies that points are physical entities. It is very hard to see how the region theory and the point theory can be both descriptively equivalent and logically incompatible, however. For if we restrict ourselves to the topology of space-time the punctate and the region theory are descriptively equivalent in the sense that each can be translated into the other: points as convergent sets of regions, regions as sets of points. So it is hard to see how the two theories can be logically incompatible topologically.

Differences do emerge over the contents of space-time: the properties, relations and functions definable on space or time. For punctate theories may contain details that are not duplicated in the region theories: at the stroke of midnight Cinderella's carriage changes into a pumpkin—it is a carriage up to midnight, a pumpkin thereafter. According to the region-based theory which takes temporal intervals as its primitives, that's all there is to it. But if there are temporal points, instants, there is a further fact left undecided by the story so far—viz, at the moment of midnight is the carriage still a carriage or is it a pumpkin?

So does the region-based theory fail to recognize certain facts or are these putative facts merely artefacts of the punctate theory's descriptive resources, reflecting nothing in reality? We cannot declare the two theories descriptively equivalent until we resolve this question at least.

In general, then, realists either dismiss cases of apparent logical incompatibility between two descriptively equivalent rival theories as merely apparent or question the descriptive equivalence of the two theories.

The conceptual relativity we have been discussing has its roots in Carnap's views about linguistic frameworks. As we saw in section 2, Carnap rejected the idea that we could answer existence questions in any absolute sense. If we ask, as we did before, whether there are irrational numbers a, b such that ab is rational, Carnap requires we first specify a framework before tendering any reply. If we choose classical mathematics the answer is “Yes” but if we choose intuitionistic mathematics, the answer is “There is no warrant for asserting such a and b exist.” So according to Carnap whilst the claim that irrational numbers a, b such that ab is rational exist-in-CM is perfectly true, the claim that such a, b exist simpliciter is meaningless.

This has a certain plausibility to it when the discussion concerns numbers or other abstract objects. Nominalists who disbelieve in the existence of abstract objects can in some sense still endorse Euclid's proof that:

(P) There are infinitely many primes

At least they can if they first construe “Infinitely many primes exist-in-classical-mathematics” as saying no more than: classical mathematics implies P. Provided they then go on to specify why P and its ilk are to be accepted though not believed they can avoid any cognitive dissonance caused by conflict with their nominalist scruples. So they will need to say something like “But P is not literally true” if they are to express their Nominalist views and explain why they do not strictly believe P. What could they mean by this? According to Carnap all they could possibly mean is:

(7) P is not true-in-N

where N is Nominalist theory. If they think they mean ‘true simpliciter’ when they say:

(8) P is not true

then they are making the very same mistake as Bob who uttered the pseudo-statement (4):

(4) There are no classes of classes of objects

There is no such thing as truth simpliciter. A belief in Nominalism, by Carnap's lights, is just a misnomer for a preference for Nominalist language or, perhaps, for the decision to adopt a Nominalist stance [see van Fraassen 2002]. Now N implies:

(Neg-P) There are not infinitely many primes

Thus Platonist Cass would affirm P where Nominalist Ness would affirm Neg-P but in so doing they would merely give voice to their respective linguistic preferences and so would not disagree according to Carnap. We saw in section 2, though, that the questions dividing realists from anti-realists appear to survive indexation to frameworks. Dora who objected to non-constructive existence proofs could not plausibly be interpreted as just expressing a preference for constructive methods: she found the notion of non-constructive existence unintelligible not just unappealing.

If rational considerations can be brought to bear on choice of conceptual framework, then the question arises as to whether there might not, after all, be a rationally mandated framework F*—an ideal theory of the world? If so, why not just identify existence-in-F* with existence simpliciter? But it is precisely the triumphalist image of one true theory the pluralist seeks to resist—there are theories of the world that are equally good, according to her.

Suppose all this is so. Consider two pluralists, Trudy and Rudy, who both believe classical and intuitionistic mathematics are equally good frameworks. Despite sharing this belief they take differing attitudes to the proposition Q:

(Q) There are irrational numbers a and b such that ab is rational

Just because classical and intuitionistic mathematics strike her as equally good, Trudy dithers between choosing one of them as her preferred framework. So she decides to distribute her credence equitably between the two theories—on Mondays, Wednesdays and Fridays she believes classical mathematics whereas on Tuesdays, Thursdays and Saturdays she believes intuitionistic mathematics; up until 12:00pm on Sunday she believes classical mathematics and from then until midnight she believes in intuitionistic mathematics. Ask Trudy Monday morning what she thinks about Q and she'll have no hesitation in telling you it's true; suggest to her late Saturday evening that either a = √2, b = √2 or else a = √2√2, b = √2 are such that ab is rational and she'll just stare at you incredulously and declare “There is no reason in the world to believe that's true!”. Whether such irrational numbers as a and b exist, according to Trudy, depends on the day or the time of day she's quizzed on the matter.

Rudy, by way of comparison, is the very model of cognitive stability. Rudy consistently believesCM Q and remains agnosticIM about Q. Alternatively, Rudy believes Q is true-in-CM but sees no reason to believe Q is true-in-IM. What Rudy cannot do, of course, is give a straight answer to the question “Are there irrational numbers a and b such that ab is rational?”, something Trudy finds quite infuriating. Yet even if we were to join Trudy in dismissing Rudy as a mere equivocator, it is Trudy rather than Rudy who strikes us as irrational: it is natural to think a change in cognitive attitude to a proposition ought to result from nothing other than a change in one's evidence for that proposition; it seems very doubtful it could ever justifiably be the result of some policy about how to equally distribute one's cognitive preferences.

However, from the pluralist's point of view, there is nothing at all irrational in Trudy's cognitive behaviour. To the contrary. She rated classical and intuitionistic mathematics as equally good frameworks and adopted a policy of alternating preference that meticulously respected the equal cognitive standing she accorded to classical and intuitionistic mathematics. The fact that this is not how ordinary folk behave when they (mistakenly) believe of their chosen framework that it is superior to all others, is both irrelevant and misleading—the whole point of pluralism is that there is not one defensible standard of rationality but many.

Is the mismatch with ordinary thinking on this matter irrelevant? Judy doesn't think so. Time and again she has remonstrated with Rudy and Trudy, but to no avail:

“Rudy, you're right to recognize that one can consistently adopt divergent cognitive attitudes to Q when construed classically and when construed constructively. Trudy, you're right to insist you cannot consistently believe and refrain from believing one and the same proposition. But there is a straightforward explanation for these two facts—the classical proposition expressed by the sentence ”Q“ is not the same proposition as the intuitionistic proposition ”Q“ can also be used to express. When intuitionists say numbers exist they mean they can construct the numbers in question; when classical mathematicians say numbers exist they are saying just that, they are not saying they can construct or identify the numbers in question”

The onus is on the relativist, then, to explain why Judy is wrong. And the challenge for the relativist or pluralist is to demonstrate that it is preferable to accept the machinery of framework-relative existence and framework-relative truths even when this makes little sense of or even conflicts with our cognitive attitudes as in the case of Rudy and Trudy. Is it really preferable or even desirable to introduce framework indexed attitudes corresponding to each framework in the manner of BeliefCM and BeliefIM? What advantage do they have over ordinary unindexed counterparts that take different propositions as their complements? What does “Believes a and b exist-in-classical mathematics” and “Sees no reason to believe a and b exist-in-intuitionistic mathematics” explain that is not more simply explained by “Believes a and b exist” and “Sees no evidence for thinking we can produce a construction determining the identity of a and b”? To the non-relativist it looks as if pluralists have simply mistaken a plurality of meanings for a plurality of modes of being. Following Quine, non-relativists think that whilst there may be a great variety in the sorts of entities that exist, there is no variety in their existence as such.

The problem doesn't just arise in relation to abstract entities. Suppose Everyday Ernie looks into his bag and sees there are 3 coins and nothing else, so he announces “There are exactly 3 objects in my bag.” Mereological Max looks into Ernie's bag and shakes his head “No Ernie there are 7 objects in your bag!” he corrects him. The Carnapian pluralist feels she can defuse the conflict and accomodate both points of view by maintaining that whilst 3 objects exist-in-E (where E is Ernie's everyday framework), 7 objects exist-in-M (with M Max's mereological framework). But even if Max can endorse both of these claims (since the mereological objects include Ernie's 3 marbles), it is not at all certain Ernie can or should return the favour. For Ernie might be quite unmoved by Max's reasoning. If, for example, Ernie has any doubts about the reality or meaningfulness of mereological objects, then Max's putative truthmaker for his framework-relative existence claim “7 objects exist-in-M” will be as unconvincing to him as classical Cass's disjunctive truthmaker for Q was to the constructivist Dora.

For this case, as for the mathematical one above, there seems little reason to accept the pluralist's description that whilst 3 objects exist-in-E, 7 objects exist-in-M and some good reasons not to. By ‘object’ Ernie means ordinary object, by ‘object’ Max means mereological object. Nothing deeper than that is required to explain their disagreement. Once more, what is relativized in the first instance is not existence or truth but meaning and what it is relativized to in cases such as these are speaker's intentions and other attitudes together with features of context.

This is not to say that all there ever is to such disputes is a misunderstanding about the meanings of words, as the meaning-pluralist Judy would have it. There is still the substantive question of which of two theories conceived as rivals is true. Thus in the dispute between classical and intuitionist logicians the attempt to import distinctive intuitionistic connectives into classical languages containing classical connectives results in the ‘intuitionistic’ connectives obeying classical logical laws.

The point is rather that whether there are mereological (or ordinary) objects ought not to be prejudged by stipulating they exist within some framework nor can it be resolved satisfactorily by this means. By way of comparison, consider the question of whether space-time is continuous or discrete. This looks like a substantive empirical question. If String Theory which says space-time is continuous and Quantum Loop Gravity Theory which says it is discrete were to prove equally good ‘final’ theories of space-time as judged by all the evidence, we would naturally take this to demonstrate that the matter of whether space-time was a continuum had turned out to be empirically undecidable, not that space-time had turned out in one sense to be continuous (continuousST) but in another to be discrete (discreteQLGT)—if we can know this type of thing at all, this is something we can know a priori without heeding any evidence. Rightly or wrongly, we would take the question “Is Space-Time continuous or discrete?” to remain unsolved in the envisaged circumstances, rather than equally well though divergently solved. Where there is nothing to choose between two equally good rival theories we accept neither in circumstances such as these, we don't accept both.

Moreover, the example of Cass and Dora brings to light another problem for pluralism. Dora regarded non-constructive reasoning as incoherent. So she did not accept Cass had shown that the irrational numbers a, b such that ab is rational exist in any sense at all. So she will not agree that the framework of classical mathematics contains such a and b. So if, as seems to be the case, there is no framework-neutral metalanguage neo-Carnapians can deploy to state their purported framework-relative ontological truths, how can there be a fact to the matter as to what things exist in a framework? Along with its manifest inability to make sense of the impact of evidence on our cognitive attitudes and its vulnerability to the semantic accomodationist strategy outlined above, the pluralist's position also threatens to become ineffable.

5.5 Models and Reality

If metaphysical realism is to be tenable at all, it must be possible for even our best theories to be mistaken. Or so metaphysical realists have thought. Whence, such realists reject the Model-Theoretic Argument MTA which purports to show that this is not possible. Here is an informal sketch of the MTA due to van Fraassen [1997]:

Let T be a theory that contains all the sentences we insist are true, and that has all other qualities we desire in an ideal theory. Suppose moreover that there are infinitely many things, and that T says so. Then there exist functions (interpretations) which assign to each term in T's vocabulary an extension, and which satisfy T. So we conclude, to quote Putnam, “T comes out true, true of the world, provided we just interpret ‘true’ as TRUE(SAT)”.

Here ‘TRUE(SAT)’ means “true relative to a mapping of the terms of the language of T onto (sets of) items in the world”. But why should we interpret ‘true’ as TRUE(SAT)? Because truth is truth in an intended model and, Putnam argues, amongst all the models of T that make all its theses come out true there is guaranteed to be at least one that passes all conceivable constraints we can reasonably impose on a model in order for it to be an intended model of T.

Realists have responded to the argument by rejecting the claim that a model M of the hypothetical ideal theory T passes every theoretical constraint simply because all of the theory's theses come out true in it. For there is no guarantee, they claim, that terms stand in the right relation of reference to the objects to which M links them. To be sure, if we impose another theoretical constraint, say:

Right Reference Constraint (RRC): Term t refers to object x if and only if Rtx where R is the right relation of reference,

then M (or some model based on it) can interpret this RRC constraint in such a way as to make it come out true.

But there is a difference between a model's making some description of a constraint come out true and its actually conforming to that constraint, metaphysical realists insist [Devitt 1983, 1991; Lewis 1983, 1984].

For their part, anti-realists have taken the metaphysical realist's insistence on a Right Reference Constraint to be ‘just more theory’ — what it is for a model to conform to a constraint is for us to be justified in asserting that it does. Unfortunately, this has led to something of a stand-off. Metaphysical realists think that anti-realists are refusing to acknowledge a clear and important distinction. Anti-realists think realists are simply falling back on dogmatism at a crucial point in the argument.

Many have concluded from the apparent stalemate that this particular debate is dialectically intractable—one sides either with the realists or the anti-realists, depending on whether one thinks of truth as the realist does or as the anti-realist does. This glib conclusion, which would put the argument beyond the pale of rational appraisal, is a little premature, though. As we'll see below, there are ways of explaining and illustrating the crucial issues concerning constraint satisfaction that are surely intelligible to anti-realists, ways which do not appeal to any verification-transcendent notions. More importantly, as the whole purpose of the MTA is to prove metaphysical realism is incoherent proponents of the latter view cannot afford the luxury of the glib conclusion—they need to say why the anti-realist reading of their RRC is mistaken (if they are not to go on assuming the very point that is in question between realists and anti-realists: that there is a genuine distinction between “T meets constraint C” and “It is assertible that T meets constraint C”).

On the face of it, the Permutation Argument presents a genuine challenge to any realist who believes in determinate reference. But it does not refute metaphysical realism unless such realism is committed to determinate reference in the first place and it is not at all obvious that a belief in the mind-independence of reality does commit the metaphysical realist to determinate reference.

Realist responses to this argument vary widely. At one extreme are the ‘determinatists’, those who believe that Nature has set up significant, determinate referential connections between our mental symbols and items in the world. They contend that all the argument shows is that the distribution of truth-values across possible worlds is not sufficient to determine reference.

At another extreme are ‘indeterminatists’, realists who concede the conclusion, agreeing that it demonstrates that word-world reference is massively indeterminate or ‘inscrutable’.

Some infer from this that reference could not possibly consist in correspondences between mental symbols and objects in the world. For them all that makes ‘elephant’ refer to elephants is that our language contains the word ‘elephant’. This is Deflationism about reference.

In between these two extremes are those prepared to concede the argument establishes the real possibility of a significant and surprising indeterminacy in the reference of our mental symbols but who take it to be an open question whether other constraints can be found which pare down the range of reference assignments to just the intuitively acceptable ones. On this view ‘elephant’ may partially refer to elephants according to one acceptable reference assignment and may partially refer to elephant-stages or undetached elephant parts according to other such assignments, but not refer, even partially, to quolls or quarks. In this spirit, Hartry Field [1998] has argued that an objective referential indeterminacy he calls ‘correlative indeterminacy’ could exist quite undetected in linguistic practices such as ours that assume determinacy of reference for terms:

If ‘entropy’ partially refers to E1 and E2, then we can say that relative to an assignment of E1 to ‘entropy’, ‘refers’ refers to a relation that holds between ‘entropy’ and only one thing, viz. E1; and analogously for E2. In this way we can get the result that even if ‘entropy’ partially refers to many things (and hence does not determinately refer to anything), still the sentence “‘Entropy’ refers to entropy and nothing else” comes out true. (Indeed, determinately true: true on every acceptable combination of the partial referents of ‘entropy’ and ‘refers’). The advocate of indeterminacy can still ‘speak with the vulgar’. [loc. cit., p. 254]

So much by way of the logical geography of realist viewpoints. Are there considerations favouring one realist response to the Model Theoretic Argument over others? The simplest and most direct response to the MTA questions its validity—since all versions of the MTA challenge the realist to say why terms are not related to their right referents in the alternative models Putnam constructs, metaphysical realists have been quick to respond. Thus Devitt's and Lewis's claim that Putnam's alternative model M had not been shown to satisfy every theoretical constraint merely by making some description of each theoretical constraint true.

Skolem's Paradox in set theory seems to present a striking illustration of Lewis's distinction. The Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem states that every consistent, countable set of first-order formulae has a denumerable model, in fact a model in the set of integers ℤ. Now in ZF one can prove the existence of sets with a non-denumerable number of elements such as the set ℜ of real numbers. Yet the ZF axioms comprise a consistent, countable set of first-order formulae and thus by the Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem has a model in ℤ. So ZF's theorem φ stating that ℜ is non-denumerable will come out true in a denumerable model μ of ZF! How can this be? One explanation is that μ makes φ true only at the cost of re-interpreting ‘non-denumerable’ so that it no longer means non-denumerable. Thus μ is not the intended model M* of ZF. It looks as if the metaphysical realist has a clear illustration of Lewis's distinction at hand in set theory.

Unfortunately, this is not the only explanation. In fact, Putnam used this very example in an early formulation of the MTA! Just because there are different models that satisfy φ in some of which ℜ is non-denumerable but in others of which (such as μ) ℜ is denumerable, Putnam argued, it is impossible to pin down the intended interpretation of ‘set’ via first-order axioms. Moreover, well before Putnam, Skolem and his followers had taken the moral of Skolem's Paradox to be that set-theoretic notions are indeterminate.

Now the thesis the metaphysical realist has to establish is that an ideal theory could be false. If truth for our imagined ideal theory T is truth on its intended model(s) M* this amounts to the possibility that some thesis of T come out false in M* even if there are other models wherein that thesis along with every other thesis of T comes out true. This brings us to the Right Reference Constraint (RRC) once more and the question of what it is for T to satisfy (RRC). Discussing this issue in connection with set theory Timothy Bays [2001] writes:

When a philosopher claims that the intended models of set theory should be transitive, she is describing the structures which are to count as models for her axioms; she isn't just adding new sentences to be interpreted at Putnam's favorite models. Similarly, when she claims that intended models should satisfy second-order ZFC, she is explaining which semantics (and, more specifically, which satisfaction relation) her axioms should be interpreted under; she isn't just adding new axioms to be interpreted under a (first-order) semantics of Putnam's choosing.

Putnam [1985] responded to this point by charging the realist with question-begging: simply assuming that terms such as ‘satisfaction’ or ‘correspondence’ refer to those relations to which the realist wishes them to refer. But, as Bays points out, no questions are begged if realists assume for the purposes of argument that semantic terms such as these refer to the intended relations. It is up to the anti-realist to show that this assumption is flawed. Nonetheless, merely invoking an intuitive distinction does not show the distinction marks a genuine difference. So if realism is to be sustained, there had better be some more convincing or, at any rate, less contentious examples than Skolem's Paradox to illustrate Lewis's alleged difference between a model satisfying a constraint and its merely making a description of the constraint true. Are there?

Michael Resnick thinks so [Resnick 1987]. Putnam maintained that M, the model he constructs of the ideal theory T, is an intended model because it passes every operational and theoretical constraint we could reasonably impose. It passes every theoretical constraint, he argues, simply because it makes every thesis of T true. But unless the Reflection Principle (RP) below holds, Resnick argues, this inference is just a non-sequitur:

(RP) To any condition f that a model of a theory satisfies, there corresponds a condition C expressible in the theory that that theory satisfies.

However, this principle is false. The simplest counterexample to it, Resnick points out, is Tarskian truth. Suppose we impose as a condition f* on T's model M that M makes all of T's theses come out true. Then, unless T is either inconsistent or too weak to express elementary arithmetic no truth predicate will be definable in T. Whence there will be no condition C expressible in T corresponding to this condition f* on T's model(s) M.

Anti-realists might argue contrapositively that since T cannot contain its own truth-predicate (RP) has to be restricted from the outset so that explicit semantic conditions on models as in f* are disbarred.

Resnick draws attention to an example Putnam discusses in the MTA. This requires some explanation. So-called constructible sets were introduced by Kurt Gödel in the 1930s in his work on independence results in set theory. Gödel used a method of ‘inner models’ to define a class of sets containing all ordinals and enough additional sets to prove within ZF set theory itself that each ZF axiom turns out true when ‘set’ is interpreted to mean ‘constructible set’. This class of sets is the class of constructible sets. Gödel not only showed that each ZF axiom turned out true when ‘set’ is taken to mean ‘constructible set’, but also that the Axiom of Constructibility V=L stating that the class of constructible sets (L) are all the sets there are in the universe of sets (V) comes out true under this interpretation of ‘set’.

The relevance to the MTA is this: Gödel himself believed in a fixed interpretation of set theory relative to which he thought the Axiom of Constructibility V=L would turn out to be false. But in an early formulation of the MTA, Putnam used the ZF + V=L case on the way to arguing that the interpretation of ‘set’ is indeterminate. Briefly, he argued that as long as the only constraints available to fix the interpretation of ‘set’ are theoretical and operational ones (all the measurements humans will ever make) there will be an interpretation of set theory on which V=L turns out true, which since it passes all constraints is an intended one. Since there will also be an intended interpretation on which V=L turns out false, the interpetation of ‘set’ must be indeterminate [Bays 2001].

Now there is some temptation, Resnick points out, to take truth-in-an-inner-model (i.e., one which makes V=L true along with the other ZF axioms) to be truth simpliciter for set theory. For if the ideal theory T contains ZF one can express in T that T has inner models satisfying all the theoretical constraints one could reasonably impose such as: nondenumerability of the domain of T's intended models together with standard identity and truth predicates. Yet in spite of this, there is no guarantee truth-in-an-inner-model of ZF must coincide with truth simpliciter since we can specify in ZF an inner model for which the ZF axioms and the Axiom of Choice, AC, holds yet still show in ZF that AC is independent of the other ZF axioms. Of course, this does not show that AC is false. But it does appear to undermine RP, so we cannot infer from the fact that ZF's inner models satisfy all reasonable theoretical constraints that truth-in-an-inner-model is truth simpliciter.

Resnick concludes (ibid):

Any true interpretation of T whatsoever—even one which does not satisfy C—will make true every thesis of T, including T's assertion that C is satisfied. Which suffices to block the ‘just more theory’ gambit.

If this is right, the metaphysical realist can indeed resist what Lewis calls “Putnam's incredible thesis” that an ideal theory T has to be true. Yet in an intriguing twist, Lewis having himself insisted on the very distinction between T's making C true and genuinely satisfying C that Resnick's example vindicates proceeded to argue that more was needed to answer Putnam's model-theoretic argument [Lewis 1984]. How can this be? His reasoning appears to have been that a global view of Descriptivism about reference, the view that reference is fixed by satisfaction of descriptions, directly entails Putnam's ‘incredible thesis’ (loc.cit.p. 224):

For any world (almost), whatever it is like, can satisfy any theory (almost), whatever it says. We said: “the intended interpretation will be one, if such there be, …” Never mind the proviso—there will be. It is almost certain that the world will afford the makings of an interpretation that will make the theory come true. In fact it will afford countless such interpretations. Ex hypothesi these interpretations are intended. So there is (almost) no way that the theory can fail to come true on its intended interpretations. Which is to say: (almost) no way that the theory can fail to come true simpliciter. This is Putnam's so-called ‘model-theoretic argument’.

Lewis infers from this that:

…global descriptivism is false; or Putnam's incredible thesis is true; or there is something wrong with the presuppositions of our whole line of thought. Unlike Putnam, I resolutely eliminate the second and third alternatives. The one that remains must therefore be the truth. Global descriptivism stands refuted. It may be part of the truth about reference, but it cannot be the whole story. There must be some additional constraint on reference: some constraint that might, if we are unlucky in our theorising, eliminate all the allegedly intended interpretations that make the theory come true (ibid).

Now it may well be that global descriptivism is false but one thing is for certain: if Putnam's model-theoretic argument is invalid it cannot possibly show that it is. For if it is invalid the MTA cannot refute global descriptivism or any other theory of reference. And if Lewis's distinction between genuine constraint satisfaction and a theory's idiosyncratic interpretation of constraint satisfaction holds good then the MTA is invalid so that one precisely cannot infer from the alleged fact that the world will afford countless interpretations of T that these interpretations are intended, even less can this be granted, pace Lewis, ex hypothesi.

Why then did Lewis think otherwise? It is possible that whilst doubting the MTA really refuted realism, Lewis did not realize his own counter to the ‘just more theory’ gambit also showed the MTA was invalid. Wrongly believing the MTA was valid, he then perceived a challenge he thought the MTA posed for the realist: If realism is true then it is impossible to explain how our terms refer to the things we take them to refer to. Be that as it may, perhaps Lewis need not have worried? Perhaps the Representation Problem rests on a mistake?

6. Does The Representation Problem Rest On A Mistake?

Unless mental representation of a mind-independent world is possible, there can be no content to any belief in such a world. So there must be some mental machinery that allows us to mentally target evidence-transcendent states of affairs. Or so it would seem. But not everyone is persuaded. It may be that merely having a sentence in our language does the job just fine. Thus, ‘the world exists mind-independently’ allows us to refer to a mind-independent world and, likewise, we can refer to Socrates nocturnal sneezings simply by saying things like “Socrates sneezed in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock.” That's the view of deflationists at any rate.

A view which could be confused with Deflationism denies the Representation Problem is a philosophical or, at at any rate, metaphysical, problem: since we know as speakers of the language that ‘cat’ refers to cats we can know a priori that any ‘interpretation’ that does not assign cats to ‘cat’ simply has to be wrong. So the ‘metaphysical’ problem of how our terms get their reference fixed is just a pseudo-problem. [See van Fraassen 1997 for defence of this view.] There is a genuine empirical question as to how words get their meaning but this is a problem for the appropriate sciences, not philosophy, to solve.

This view is opposed not to the idea of a mind-independent world nor, necessarily, to non-deflationary accounts of meaning and reference, but rather to metaphysicians meddling in empirical questions. Thus van Fraassen [1997] reacts to Lewis's postulate of metaphysically natural classes [Lewis 1983, 1984] in just this way. As we saw in Section 5.5, Lewis had taken the moral of the Model-Theoretic Argument to be that a certain view of how words get their meaning had been refuted. The view was a global version of the descriptivist view Lewis had himself defended: theoretical terms in a theory are replaced by existentially quantified variables in a Ramsey-sentence. Existential quantification over properties in such Ramsey sentences yields no claim of substance if arbitrary subsets can be instances of the properties. This means the range of the predicate variables have to be restricted so that they together with their quantifiers no longer range over arbitrary subsets of the domain but only certain distinguished subsets. Whence, we have a transcendental argument for the existence of certain ‘natural’ classes, Lewis thought [1984]. Van Fraassen [1997, p.33] responds:

The problem of how we learn language is not a philosophical problem. How new terms are introduced, how their use becomes stable, and how that use is communicated from person to person is a real problem but not a philosophical problem. It is an empirical problem to be investigated scientifically and not bedabbled in the metaphysician's armchair.

Those less hostile to metaphysics than Van Fraassen will object that he has just missed Lewis's point since Lewis does not mean to be addressing the empirical problem of language-learning. However, many a naturalistic-minded realist would want to argue that the ‘meta-semantic’ question Lewis does mean to address has no content over and above its application to language-learning and would thus agree with Van Fraassen's assessment. But then having handed the problem over to cognitive science, they might face a nervous wait: is there any evidence we are able to cognitively represent objects, events and states we cannot investigate or otherwise interact with?

Some suggestive evidence is emerging that we may. For example, psychologists have discovered systems of core knowledge activated in infancy that govern the representation of, inter alia concrete objects and human agents [see Spelke 2003; Spelke and Kinzler 2007]. An interesting finding is that evidence from preferential gaze experiments suggests 4 month old infants represent occluded objects as continuing behind their barriers. Even more surprisingly, there is evidence that 2 day old chicks exposed to occluded objects for the first time do so as well [Spelke 2003]! Chicks who in their first day of life had imprinted on a centre-occluded object were placed in an unfamiliar cage on their second day and presented with a choice between two versions of the object placed at opposite ends of the cage. In one version, the visible ends were connected; in the other these ends were separated by a visible gap matching the occluder they'd seen the day before. “Chicks selectively approached the connected object, providing evidence that they, like human infants, had perceived the imprinted object to continue behind its occluder” [Spelke 2003, p.283].

So there is evidence that ‘verification-transcendent’ conceptual content might be laid down in the earliest stages of cognitive development. Evidence from children's language acquisition also provides putative examples of pre-linguistic content determining the meanings assigned to various expressions including logical words such as ‘or’ and ‘every’ and focus operators such as ‘only’ [Crain and Khlentzos 2010]: to take one example, young Mandarin-Chinese-speaking children and Japanese-speaking children assign meanings to certain logically complex sentences that diverge from those assigned by adults in their speech communities. Thus, consider the English sentence:

(1) The pig didn't eat the pepper or the carrot

This sentence is false if the pig ate either the pepper or the carrot. The translation of (1) in Mandarin-Chinese is:

(2) (Wo cai) Zhu mei chi qingjiao huozhe huluobo
(2′) (I guess) pig not eat pepper or carrot

Meaning: it's the pepper or the carrot that the pig didn't eat but I'm not sure which one he did not eat. (2) is true in the event that the pig ate either the pepper or the carrot (but not both). The same holds for the Japanese sentence (3):

(3) Butasan-wa ninjin ka pi'iman-wo tabe-nakat-ta

where ‘ka’ means or and ‘nakat’ indicates negation. A few years ago, the linguist Takuya Goro predicted something no linguist before him had suspected: that in contrast to Japanese adult speakers, young Japanese children should reject (3) in the circumstance that the pig ate either the pepper or the carrot. His prediction was confirmed (see Goro and Akiba 2004). It was later shown to hold for Mandarin-Chinese speaking children as well. How did he manage to predict such a surprising result?

Goro had conjectured that the meaning of disjunction across all languages was an invariant, meaning inclusive-or, but that the scope relations between logical operators such as disjunction [ka, huozhe] and negation [nakat, mei] was governed by a parameter so that whilst some languages such as English set it with negation taking scope over disjunction, represented as NEG>OR, others such as Mandarin-Chinese and Japanese set it with disjunction taking scope over negation, written OR>NEG. For children learning a language to discover the correct setting of the parameter, Goro reasoned, they would have to start out assuming it was set at the more restrictive reading NEG>OR rather than OR>NEG … And so it proved.

Now to forestall any misunderstanding, neither Japanese nor Mandarin-speaking children arrive at their ‘English’ NEG>OR interpretations of (2) and (3) through serial processing since the word for disjunction in Japanese precedes the word for negation in (2). Nor do they take their words for disjunction to mean exclusive-or, +, since ¬P + ¬C is False in the circumstance which Japanese/Mandarin-speaking children accept: where the pig eats neither the pepper (¬P) nor the carrot (¬C) whereas ¬(P + C) is true in the situation these children reject: where the pig eats both the pepper and the carrot. No, Japanese-speaking children mean by (2) and Mandarin-speaking children mean by (3) precisely what English speaking adults (and children) mean by (1): ¬(PC), where ‘∨’ is inclusive disjunction. However it is that they arrive at this interpretation, it is clearly not by copying adult speakers of their language who mean ¬P ∨ ¬C by (2) and (3) (see Crain and Khlentzos 2010 for further discussion).

From a certain perspective the anti-realist challenges to metaphysical realism appear as straightforward reductios of certain seductive but mistaken a priori views about meaning and mental content. If one believes that all semantic content is learned through observation of adult language use or that all mental content has to be acquired through some sort of inference to the best explanation, then the Manifestation and Acquisition Arguments look hard to resist: how could the language-learner so much as acquire let alone manifest the concept of verification-transcendent truth? How could any thinker do so? But the answer might be that at a certain level of cognitive complexity some content emerges naturally in the normal course of conceptual development that is pre-linguistic (or even non-linguistic) and some of that non-linguistic or pre-linguistic conceptual content is ‘evidence-transcendent’ content representing the difference between how things appear and how they really are as essential to the animal's or child's interactions with the world.

7. Summary

We have considered a number of semantic challenges to realism, the thesis that the objects and properties that the world contains exist independently of our conception or perception of them. On all fronts, debate between realists and their anti-realist opponents is still very much open (Khlentzos 2004). If realists could provide a plausible theory about how correspondences between mental symbols and the items in the world to which they refer might be set up, many of these challenges could be met. Alternatively, if they could explain how, consistently with our knowledge of a mind-independent world, no such correspondences are required to begin with, many of the anti-realist objections would fall away as irrelevant. In the absence of such explanations it is still entirely reasonable for realists to believe that the correspondences are in place, however, and there can, indeed, be very good evidence for believing this. Ignorance of Nature's reference-fixing mechanism is no reason for denying it exists.

For their part, anti-realists themselves need to say more about how mental and semantic content is grounded in linguistic and cognitive practice. It is not obvious that they have any satisfactory answer to their own Representation Problem—how are correlations between mental symbols and mind-dependent objects set up? Merely gesturing in the direction of accepted practices for asserting sentences is no satisfactory answer to this question if it is simply assumed that the asserted sentences have determinate meanings. How does human intervention succeed where Nature fails?


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mental representation | realism | truth | truth: coherence theory of | truth: deflationary theory of


Thanks to: Peter Forrest, Peter Roeper, Jesse Alama and a subject editor for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for their helpful criticisms and corrections.