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Willard van Orman Quine

First published Fri Apr 9, 2010; substantive revision Fri Apr 30, 2010

Willard Van Orman Quine (1908–2000) worked in theoretical philosophy and in logic. (In practical philosophy, ethics and political philosophy, his contributions are negligible.) He is perhaps best known for his arguments against Logical Empiricism (in particular, its use of the analytic-synthetic distinction). This argument, however, should be seen as part of a comprehensive world-view which makes no sharp distinction between philosophy and empirical science and thus requires a wholesale reorientation of the subject.

1. Quine's life and work

(Note: for the sake of brevity only Quine's most notable publications are listed.)

2. Quine's Naturalism and its Implications

2.1 Introduction

Quine's philosophical thought is remarkably consistent over the course of his long working life. There are, of course, developments, as he comes to appreciate difficulties in his view, or its implications, or distinctions that need to be made. Outright changes of mind, however, are relatively rare and mostly on relatively minor points. We can, for the most part, treat him as holding a single philosophical view; what he calls naturalism is fundamental to that view. This is not to say that his naturalism was self-conscious and explicit from the start. It was, rather, something that he became clearer about over the years. The term “naturalism” has been understood in various ways; we need to see what Quine's naturalism comes to.

At one point, Quine describes naturalism as “the recognition that it is within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described” (1981, 21). Two points are important to note about the idea of “science” here. First, it is less restrictive than it may seem. Quine certainly takes the natural sciences, especially physics, as paradigmatic. As he says himself, however, he uses the word broadly; he explicitly includes psychology, economics, sociology, and history under that heading (see 1995, 49). Second, Quine does not see scientific knowledge as different in kind from our ordinary knowledge; he sees it, rather, as the result of attempts to improve our ordinary knowledge of the world. In the 1954 essay, “The Scope and Language of Science”, he says: “Science is not a substitute for common sense but an extension of it” (1957, 229). The scientist, he says, “is indistinguishable from the common man in his sense of evidence, except that the scientist is more careful” (1957, 233). We might add that the scientist is more narrowly focused on issues of truth and objectivity and, as contributing to these goals, clearer and more systematic.

Many philosophers would no doubt accept that the methods and techniques of science are the best way to find out about the world. (With or without the points just noted about the word “science”.) The distinctiveness of Quine's naturalism begins to emerge if we ask what justifies this naturalistic claim: what reason do we have to believe that the methods and techniques of science are the best way to find out about the world? Quine would insist that this claim too must be based on natural science. (If this is circular, he simply accepts the circularity.) This is the revolutionary step, naturalism self-applied. There is no foundation for Quine's naturalism: it not based on anything else.

The point here is that Quine denies that there is a distinctively philosophical standpoint, which might, for example, allow philosophical reflection to prescribe standards to science as a whole. He holds that all of our attempts at knowledge are subject to those standards of evidence and justification which are most explicitly displayed, and most successfully implemented, in the natural sciences. This applies to philosophy as well as to other branches of knowledge. The epistemologist, therefore, reflects on science from within science; there is no theory of knowledge distinct from science. (“Epistemology”, Quine says, “…is contained in natural science, as a chapter of psychology”; 1969, 83.)

In Quine's view, philosophers can, therefore, do no better than to adopt the standpoint of the best available knowledge; for Quine that means science, in some suitably broad sense. We adopt what he calls, in the last paragraph of (1960), “the fundamental conceptual scheme of science and common sense” (1960, 276). Philosophers are thus to be constrained by scientific standards. In (1974) he puts it this way: “In our account of how science might be acquired we do not try to justify science by some prior and firmer philosophy, but neither are we to maintain less than scientific standards. Evidence must regularly be sought in external objects, out where observers can jointly observe it…” (174, 34f.).

2.2 Negative Aspects

The view sketched above has both positive and negative aspects. The latter aspect is better-known and Quine is perhaps often thought of as a negative philosopher, primarily concerned to criticize others. Quine casts doubt on terms which many philosophers take for granted. He does not dismiss such terms as meaningless but simply as not meriting a place in an objective account of the world. A well-known and important example is his criticism of the idea of meaning. Quine says: “Meaning… is a worthy object of philosophical and scientific clarification and analysis, and… it is ill-suited for use as an instrument of philosophical and scientific clarification and analysis.” (1981, 185). The point here is that the term does not merit a place in serious science: it is insufficiently clear, and putative explanations which employ it are in fact unexplanatory. (By engendering the illusion of explanation they tend to impede the development of genuine explanations; this may well account for Quine's animus against the term.) It follows, in Quine's view, that philosophers should not rely on the term to bear any explanatory burden.

Quine makes similar remarks about “thought”, “belief”, “experience”, “necessity” and other terms which many philosophers assume are legitimate and available for philosophical use without themselves requiring explanation and justification in other terms. He says about the first two on this list (and would no doubt extend the comment to the others): “If some one accepts these notions outright for such use, I am at a loss to imagine what he can have deemed more in need of clarification and analysis than the things he has thus accepted.” (1981, 184).

This criticism of certain ordinary terms goes along with rejection of philosophical questions which make essential use of those terms. The term “knowledge” is an example. He finds the word vague, and consequently rejects it for serious use, saying that the word is “useful and unobjectionable in the vernacular where we acquiesce in vagueness, but unsuited to technical use because of lacking a precise boundary” (Quine, 1984, 295). Many philosophers have found the vagueness or unclarity of the term to be a fertile field in which to cultivate what they take to be important philosophical problems: What exactly are the conditions on knowledge? Do we really know anything at all? For Quine, by contrast, such questions may simply be dismissed.

2.3 Positive Aspects: Knowledge

As we have just seen, Quine's views issue in very general criticism of much philosophy. (Far more than is generally recognized.) It is, nevertheless, a mistake to think of him as primarily a critical or negative thinker. His criticisms rely on his positive doctrine; articulating and defending that doctrine generates questions and problems. As for whether those are genuinely philosophical questions and problems, it is perhaps implicit in what has already been said that he would not acknowledge such a category as the “genuinely philosophical” if that is meant to imply questions which are different in kind from those of science. But certainly he accepts that some questions are sufficiently general, abstract, and remote from experiment and observation, that they may be classified as philosophical. At times he assimilates the questions with which he is concerned to those which have traditionally occupied philosophers. An example is scepticism, and epistemology more generally, although Quine's approach to these subjects is quite different from that of many philosophers.

In some places, Quine approaches epistemology through the problem of scepticism about the external world. Quine has no room for the kind of scepticism which asks the following kind of question: even if our alleged knowledge, our science, is completely successful on its own terms, how do we know that it tells us the way the world really is? Thus he says: “What evaporates is the transcendental question of the reality of the external world…” (1981, 22). The next paragraph enlarges on the theme:

Our scientific theory can go wrong, and precisely in the familiar way: through failure of predicted observation. But what if, happily and unbeknownst, we have achieved a theory that is conformable to every possible observation, past and future? In what sense could the world then be said to deviate from what the theory claims? Clearly in none…. (1981, 22; emphasis added)

There is, however, a kind of scepticism, or a way of understanding the sceptical question, which Quine can make sense of. He addresses the issue most directly in the early pages of Roots of Reference. Invoking gestalt psychology, he argues that the simple sensory idea which Berkeley and Hume had claimed were given by the senses are not in fact given, that we see things in three-dimensions, for example, instead of having to infer the third. He does not, however, claim that there is no problem which Berkeley and Hume were trying to address. Rather, he says, “the problem was real but wrongly viewed” (1974, 2). “The crucial logical point”, he continues, “is that the epistemologist is confronting a challenge to natural science that arises from within natural science” (loc. cit.). What is the challenge? It starts with the what Quine takes to be “a finding of natural science itself” (1990a, 19), namely “that the only information that can reach our sensory surfaces from external objects must be limited to two-dimensional optical projections and various impacts of air waves on the eardrums and some gaseous reactions in the nasal passages and a few kindred odds and ends” (1974, 2). The challenge is then: “How… could one hope to find out about that external world from such meager traces? In short, if our science were true, how could we know it?” (loc. cit.).

Scepticism, understood in this fashion, is a challenge to Quine's form of naturalism. It claims that our knowledge cannot be accounted for in terms which are, by Quine's standards, purely naturalistic. Quine's response is thus to sketch an austerely naturalistic account of how our knowledge, and the cognitive language in which that knowledge is embodied, arises, or might arise. This project, as he sees it, is both essential to the defence of his naturalistic world-view and “an enlightened persistence” (1974, 3; see below) in the problem that had motivated earlier epistemologists; section 4. will go into a little more detail about the project.

It is worth noting that this form of scepticism does not abstract from our ordinary and scientific knowledge. It is a naturalistic version of scepticism: it does not assume a standard of reality which is not answerable to that knowledge. It is, rather, a question internal to our science. When Quine asks: “How… could one hope to find out about that external world from such meager traces?” this is not a rhetorical question. It is, rather, a serious question, to be answered by deploying the full resources of our knowledge, it is a scientific question. Quine recognizes that the question, thus construed, is not exactly what earlier epistemologists had in mind, but argues that the change is justified: “A far cry, this, from the old epistemology. Yet it is no gratuitous change of subject matter, but an enlightened persistence rather in the original epistemological problem” (1974, 3).

2.4 Positive Aspects: the Nature of the World

The defence and articulation of Quine's naturalism thus requires Quinean epistemology, an analogue, at least, of traditional epistemology but carried out as a scientific enterprise. It also requires that he set out just what is to be included in a naturalistic account of the world; in other words, it requires an account of the world, at least in broad outline. We shall sometimes speak of this project as “metaphysics” but it is metaphysics naturalized; it is not carried out a priori, or by reflection on the nature of Being quâ Being, or anything of that sort. (Quine himself does not much use the word “metaphysics” but he does speak freely about ontology, and advances substantive ontological views.)

Quine's approach to his naturalistic analogue of metaphysics is through the idea of regimented theory. Regimented theory is our overall science, the sum total of our best and most objective knowledge about the world, reformulated in the clearest and simplest form. Quine sees this kind of reformulating as of a piece with ordinary scientific endeavour, but carried further than working scientists are likely to have reason to do. He discusses the distorting effect which language is likely to have on our view of the world and comments:

To some degree…the scientist can enhance objectivity and diminish the interference of language, by his very choice of language. And we [meaning we philosophers, we scientists at the abstract and philosophical end of the spectrum], concerned to distill the essence of scientific discourse, can profitably purify the language of science beyond what might reasonably be urged upon the practicing scientist. (1957, 235)

Regimented theory is, of course, something of an idealization. It is not a complete and finished object, available for us to examine. Quine's reflections on it might be considered as something like a thought-experiment: if we were to set about assembling our total theory of the world and recasting it in the best form, what would it look like? Since the enterprise is not in fact going to be carried out all the way we are not going to get a complete answer. But on some important general issues, Quine holds, we can get answers. In particular, Quine argues that the framework of regimented theory is first-order logic with identity, that the variables of this theory range over physical objects and sets, and that the predicates of the theory, the only non-logical vocabulary, are physicalistic, in his somewhat complicated sense. We shall go into greater detail in section 4, below. We should not underestimate the metaphysical ambition here. He says of his regimented theory that “all traits of reality worthy of the name can be set down in an idiom of this austere form if in any idiom” (1960, 228) and speaks of “limning the true and ultimate structure of reality” (1960, 221). The claim that the variables of regimented range only over physical objects and sets is, as far as he is concerned, the same claim as that only physical objects and sets really exist.

3. The Analytic-Synthetic Distinction and the Argument Against Logical Empiricism

The philosophers who most influenced Quine were the Logical Empiricists (also known as Logical Positivists), especially Rudolf Carnap. The distinction between analytic truths and synthetic truths plays a crucial role in their philosophy. (Analytic truths might be characterized as those true solely in virtue of the meanings of the words they contain, synthetics truths as true in virtue of extra-linguistic fact as well as meanings.) Quine famously rejects that distinction, at least as employed by the Logical Empiricists and other philosophers from the 1930s on. (Notable among them is C. I. Lewis, a teacher and then a colleague of Quine.) The issues here are complex, and the argument takes many twists and turns. Our chief concern is to give an account of Quine's mature view, and of the strongest arguments that he has for it.

3.1 Meaning

In (1951), Quine famously criticizes Carnap's attempts to define analyticity as unclear or inadequate. In particular, he claims that most ways of explaining the idea rely on terms which are equally unclear. This has raised questions about Quine's standards for clarity and adequacy, questions which that essay does not address very explicitly. The standards are those indicated by our discussion in the previous section; Quine is asking for an explanation which is acceptable by his naturalistic standards. Such an explanation would not presuppose an idea of meaning, and would use such ideas as definition or convention only in ways which are justified by the most literal sense of those terms.

Besides his criticism, Quine also offers a diagnosis of the persistence of the concept of analyticity. Philosophers find the idea plausible because they tend to assume, sometimes unwittingly, that there is a clear notion of cognitive meaning which relates each sentence to the experiences which count for it or against it and which can be applied to sentences taken one-by-one. Given that sort of notion of meaning, we could say: the synthetic sentences are precisely those to whose truth or falsehood experience is relevant; the analytic ones are those whose truth or falsehood is wholly independent of experience (and which can therefore be known a priori).

Quine criticizes this idea of atomistic (sentence-by-sentence) cognitive meaning. He argues that it requires the sort of radical reductionist position that Carnap had attempted in (1928). Against this latter view Quine invokes holism, the idea that most of our sentences do not have implications for experience when they are taken one-by-one, each in isolation from the others. What has experiential implication is, in most cases, not an individual sentence but larger chunks of theory. Holism, Quine claims, undermines the atomism of atomistic cognitive meaning. Holism is not a very controversial doctrine; by 1934 Carnap had explicitly embraced it, as Quine certainly knew (see Carnap, 1934, 318). It is for this reason that Quine should be seen as offering a diagnosis. He holds that radical reductionism continues to influence Carnap and others even after they have explicitly rejected it; also that without that doctrine the sort of use that Carnap makes of the analytic-synthetic cannot be maintained.

Some responses to Quine's position here argue that it has obviously absurd consequences, such as that meaningful discourse would be impossible or that we could not understand our language. (See for example Grice and Strawson, 1956.) Such responses are unwarranted. Quine's scepticism about meanings does not lead to any scepticism about meaningfulness. If we think of meaningfulness as a matter of having a meaning then we may think that our words cannot be meaningful unless there are meanings. But such a way of thinking is, Quine claims, quite misleading. In the second essay in (1953), he offers a rough and ready behavioural account of meaningfulness; it is clear from the way the definition proceeds that the success of something along those lines would be of no help at all in defining synonymy or analyticity. It is simply a confusion to think that his scepticism about analyticity involves scepticism about meaningfulness. A similar point can be made about what it is to be able to speak a language. If one thinks of this as a matter of knowing (or grasping, or being acquainted with) the meanings of its words and constructions, then a denial that there are meanings will seem to be a denial that we understand our language. Quine, however, takes this as a quite misleading picture. Language mastery is, rather, to be construed in naturalistic (chiefly behavioural) terms. The details of this construal, giving an account of what it is to understand a language, and how a child comes to achieve that happy state, form part of the project of naturalized epistemology.

A further objection to Quine focuses on the idea of translation. Quine's argument against meanings in (1951) goes via the idea that we have no sufficiently clear explanation of synonymy (sameness of meaning), and Quine accepts that if we had such an explanation then we could make sense of meanings: they become sets of synonymous expressions. Now the objection is the claim that since the idea of correct translation clearly makes sense, there must, contrary to Quine, be a clear idea of synonymy. One version of this is simply the idea that correct translation means supplying for each expression of the target language one or more synonyms in the home language. (Not excluding the case in which the two languages are the same.) In that view, rejecting synonymy is rejecting the very idea of translation. This view, however, begs the question against Quine; as we shall see in section 6, he offers a behavioural account of correct translation which does not rely on any antecedently understood sense of synonymy. Another version, which addresses Quine on his own terms, is the claim that since we have behavioural criteria for correct translation we must also have behavioural criteria for synonymy, which thus does make clear sense. This response, however, presupposes that correct translation is unique (at least if we ignore stylistic factors which, presumably, do not matter for synonymy in the relevant sense). Quine has cast this presupposition in doubt, with his famous (or notorious) thesis of the indeterminacy of translation, the idea that there may be more than one correct method of translation (with more than stylistic variation between them). Some philosophers hold that the indeterminacy of translation is crucial for Quine's general position on analyticity. There are reasons to doubt this connection, however, as we shall see over the next few pages. (For a more detailed discussion see Hylton (2007), especially Chapter 3.) We shall therefore postpone the discussion of indeterminacy to section 6.

3.2 The Wider Significance of the Analytic-Synthetic Distinction

If we reject the atomistic idea of cognitive meaning then one easy way of making sense of the analytic-synthetic distinction is blocked. It does not follow, however, that no sense at all can be made of it. (On this point, Quine might be thought to overstate his case in (1951).) In later works, indeed, Quine shows how (partial) sense can be made of that idea in terms of how language is learned. In (1991) he goes so far as to claim that by his criterion all of first-order logic is analytic.

Given that claim, what exactly is it that Quine rejects, in his mature view of the analytic-synthetic distinction? More important: in what way do his arguments on this score tell against the views of Carnap and others? A conception of analyticity which can play the role in which Carnap has cast it must have two features. First, it must include the right sentences. In particular, it must include classical mathematics (or at least as much mathematics as is required for physics). The conception of analyticity which Quine comes to accept will not do that. It is thus not an acceptable explication of the a priori; providing such an explication, however, is an important part of the role that analyticity plays for Carnap.

The second feature is less straightforward. Carnap's view, at least as Quine interprets it, requires that the distinction between the analytic and the synthetic have epistemological significance; Quine argues it does not. This point connects with the most general differences between the two philosophers.

Carnap holds that the role of philosophy is to analyze and clarify the language of science, and to formulate and recommend alternative languages. He accepts that there are languages which differ in expressive power, not as merely notational variants. (The difference between intuitionistic logic and classical logic is an important example here, as is the difference between the language of Newtonian mechanics and the language of relativistic mechanics.) He also holds that there is no one correct language. Different languages may be useful for different purposes; it is no part of the philosopher's job to prescribe this or that language, merely to analyze, to clarify, and to suggest alternatives. This idea has become known as the Principle of Tolerance; from the 1930s on, it is fundamental to Carnap's view of what philosophy is and how it differs from science. (That there is such a difference is a point which Carnap never questions.)

The Principle of Tolerance requires that, for any language, there be a clear difference between the analytic sentences of the language and its synthetic sentences. The former are (roughly) those the truth of which is constitutive of the language. If we change our mind about the truth of such a sentence we have, in effect, adopted a new language. This kind of change is thus a suitable matter for tolerance. A change of mind about a synthetic sentence, by contrast, is not a change of language, and not a matter in which we should apply the Principle of Tolerance. For the principle to make sense, each sentence of the language must fall clearly into the one category or the other. This does not hold under the definition of analyticity which Quine accepts.

As Quine sees the matter, the use of the Principle of Tolerance also requires that analytic sentences are on an entirely different epistemological footing from synthetic sentences. According to that principle, the truth or falsehood of synthetic sentences is answerable to evidence; justification is required, and such sentences are true or false. The case is quite different if we consider abandoning an analytic sentence which we previous held to be true. A change of that sort is a change of language and is not a matter of theoretical justification. One language may be more or less convenient than another for a given purpose, but this is pragmatic, purpose-relative, and a matter of degree.

Our being able to distinguish the analytic sentences from the synthetic sentences does not by itself show that there is this sort of epistemological difference between them. In particular, it does not show that we could not have reasons to reject analytic sentences as well as synthetic sentences. This point is hard to see if one focuses on examples such as “All bachelors are unmarried”. The matter is otherwise if one considers examples such as “Force equals mass times acceleration”. (See Putnam, 1962.) A change of mind about an analytic sentence would be a change in the language; we might, however, have reasons to make such a change and, crucially, such reasons might be of the same sort that lead us to make revisions which do not involve analytic sentences or changes in the language. Our being able to define some sort of distinction between the analytic and the synthetic does not by itself ensure the distinction is of any epistemological significance. As Quine says in (1991): “I recognize the notion of analyticity in its obvious and useful but epistemologically insignificant applications” (1991, 271; emphasis added).

Quine's deepest disagreement with Carnap is precisely over the Principle of Tolerance. Quine does not accept it; he sees all our cognitive endeavours, whether they involve formulating a new language or making a small-scale theoretical change, as having the same very general aim of enabling us to deal with the world better; all such endeavours have the same kind of justification, namely, contributing to that end. For this reason, he does not accept the epistemological distinction which is crucial to the use that Carnap makes of the analytic-synthetic distinction. For the same reason, Quine can accept cases of analyticity without lessening the force of his disagreement with Carnap.

Without the Principle of Tolerance, there is no basis for Carnap's insistence that philosophy is in principle different from science. Quine, accordingly, recognizes no separation in principle between philosophy and science. Clarifying, simplifying, and otherwise improving the language of science is not different in principle from the ordinary activity of working scientists. Ontological questions may indeed turn on the choice of language but that choice is not subject to tolerance but, rather, is like the choice of a scientific theory: it is to be made so as to maximize the efficacy of our system as a whole. Hence: “[o]ntological questions… are on a par with questions of natural science” (1951, 45).

Quite generally, Quine holds that philosophical concerns are typically more abstract and more general than those of other disciplines, but that these differences are a matter of emphasis and degree; there is no sharp difference in kind. Philosophy has no special vantage point, no special method, no special access to truth. Here we have the crucial idea of Quine's naturalism, discussed in the previous section.

3.3 Allegedly A Priori Knowledge

To this point we have said very little about the issue of (alleged) a priori knowledge. Quine's position might be summarized by saying that he denies that there is any a priori knowledge to be explained. We described his position as the view that all of our epistemological endeavours have the same very general status; the sort of knowledge usually classified as a priori, our knowledge of mathematics, most obviously, is included. It is not that our knowledge of a particular truth of mathematics, say, rests on some readily identifiable range of experiences; Quine's view is not that mathematics is empirical in that sense. But he does hold that mathematics as a whole is justified by the role that it plays in our theory of the world and that that theory is justified because it enables us to deal with experience better than any other that we have. (When we find a better one, we adopt it, a process which, at least on a small scale, happens all the time.) Here again, as at the start of this section, holism plays a crucial role. As indicated holism is not a particularly controversial doctrine. Its implications, however, are another matter.

4. Quinean Epistemology

4.1 The Epistemological Project

As we saw in section 2, Quine takes the fundamental epistemological problem to be that of showing how we come to have knowledge of the world. He seeks an account which is, in his sense, naturalistic. A constraint which naturalism imposes is the idea that we know about the world only from impacts of various forms of energy on our sensory nerves. How do we get from such impacts to something recognizable as the knowledge of the world which we take ourselves to have? In the words of the title of Quine's last monograph: how do we get from stimulus to science?

This question is central for Quine's scientific naturalism in general. An answer would show that this world-view can accommodate an account of human knowledge. If no answer is available, that world-view is cast in doubt (perhaps in favour of the idea that the human mind must be understood in fundamentally different terms from those appropriate for understanding the rest of the world). For these purposes it is perhaps enough if Quine can sketch an account, compatible with his naturalistic view, of how we might acquire the knowledge which we take ourselves to have, whether or not it is correct in detail. (See Quine 1990c, 291.)

Quine takes it that our knowledge is, for the most part, embodied in language. Apart from other considerations, language-use is observable and thus subject to scientific inquiry. Quine's concern with how we might acquire knowledge thus takes the form of a concern with how we might acquire cognitive language. His interest here, however, is in epistemology, rather than in language for its own sake: “I am interested in the flow of evidence from the triggering of the senses to the pronouncements of science…. It is these epistemological concerns, and not my incidental interest in linguistics, that motivate my speculations” (1990b, 3).

Much of Quine's work in epistemology is thus a more or less speculative discussion of how a child might acquire cognitive language. This genetic project may seem to be a long way from the traditional concerns of epistemology. Quine claims, however, that the project in fact affords us the best obtainable insight into the nature of the evidence for our theories, and into the relation between theory and evidence: “the evidential relation is virtually enacted, it would seem, in the learning” (1975c, 74B75).

4.2 Observation Sentences

Central to Quine's naturalistic account of knowledge is the idea that all our knowledge is in some way based upon stimulations of our sensory nerves. For much of our knowledge, the relation is quite indirect and remote: a given sentence is accepted because it is part of an overall system of knowledge which, taken as a whole, best enables us to deal with sensory experience. In the case of most sentences that we take ourselves to know, our willingness to accept them is clearly not directly based on stimulations of nerve ending. The connection goes via other sentences, and may be quite indirect and remote. (This is one way of expressing holism, briefly discussed in the previous section.) But then there must presumably be some parts of our language which embody knowledge which is directly related to stimulations. This is the role that observation sentences play in Quine's thought. Acts of uttering such sentences, or of assenting to them when they are uttered by others, are shared responses to stimulation. (We shall enter some qualifications to this claim shortly.) It is a sign of Quine's naturalistic approach that his account of the crucial idea of a shared response to stimulation applies both to non-human animals as well as to people.

Observation sentences are the starting point for our acquisition of knowledge, the child's entry into cognitive language. They are also the sentences which are evidentially basic. What fits them to play both roles is that they are independent of other parts of our language. Hence they can be mastered by a child otherwise without linguistic competence and they can be known without presupposing other parts of our theory.

Many philosophers are content to take for granted the idea of evidentially basic sentences. Quine, however, cannot take that attitude; he needs to show how we get “from stimulus to science”. The first step is to show that we can give a purely naturalistic account of how some linguistic utterances can be directly tied to the occurrence of stimulations of the sensory nerves, an account of observation sentences, more or less. Quine expends enormous labour on this point.

Quine considers acts of assenting to sentences (or dissenting, but I shall mostly leave that as understood). He focuses, in particular, on our dispositions to assent to sentences[1]. To be an observation sentence, a sentence must fulfill two criteria. The individualistic criterion is that a sentence is an observation sentence for a given person if he or she is disposed to assent to it when (and only when) he or she is undergoing appropriate sensory stimulations, regardless of her internal state (e.g. the ancillary information which he or she possesses). “It's warm in here” presumably satisfies this criterion; my willingness to assent to it perhaps depends only on which of my sensory nerves are stimulated at the given moment. “There's milk in the refrigerator” presumably does not; unless I am actually looking into the refrigerator at the time, my willingness to assent to it depends not on what I am experiencing at the time but on my internal state, what I remember. The social criterion is that the individualistic criterion hold across the linguistic community as a whole. To specify this more precisely is tricky, and we shall postpone the matter for a few paragraphs.

Even the individualistic criterion raises considerable complications and difficulties. We speak of a disposition to assent (or dissent) in response to a pattern of stimulation but this is not quite accurate. Such a pattern, a complete list of which sensory nerves are firing, and in which order, will hardly ever repeat itself. So what we need is, rather, the idea of a correlation of a response with a type of stimulation pattern. But the relevant idea of a type here is complicated[2]. The physical resemblance of two stimulation patterns, what Quine calls receptual similarity, is not enough to make them constitute events of the same type, in the relevant sense of type; two such patterns may resemble each other very closely yet lead to quite different responses. (Two occasions on which I am driving a car may be almost identical in terms of my stimulation pattern, except that on one occasion I see a red light and on the other I see a green light. As far as my reaction goes, that small difference outweighs all the similarity.) What is wanted is a more complex notion which Quine calls perceptual similarity. Very roughly, two stimulation patterns count as similar (for an animal, at a time) if they tend to lead to the same response[3].

With the account of perceptual similarity in place, we can say what it is for a sentence to be observational for me: if I am disposed to assent to it on one occasion on which I have a certain neural intake, then I will also be disposed to assent to it on any other occasion on which I have a perceptually similar neural intake.

It is worth emphasizing the fact that the definition of the key notion of perceptual similarity is behavioural. It avoids any idea of experience, of awareness, of what strikes the person (or other animal) as more similar to what. It is simply a matter of responses. This is in accord with Quine's insistence on what he takes to be scientific standards of clarity and rigour. One consequence of it is that the notion cannot be invoked to explain behaviour. Quine is under no illusions on this score. (See 1975b, 167, where the point is explicit.) The behavioural account does not explain our understanding of observation sentences; explanation, if possible at all, comes at the neuro-physiological level. What the behavioural account does is to make it clear exactly what behaviour constitutes that understanding and, hence, what the neuro-physiological account would have to explain. (It also makes it clear that there is indeed something to be explained.)

So far we have only an account of what it is for a sentence to be an observation sentence for a particular person. But our language is shared, so we need to generalize the criterion across the linguistic community. One might at first think that the social criterion would be: if one person is disposed to assent to the sentence on any occasion on which they have a certain neural intake, then any other person having the same neural intake will also be disposed to assent to it. Quine gives essentially this account in (1960). As he quickly comes to see, however, it is not tenable, for it assumes that we can make sense of the idea of “same neural intake” between different people. But different people have different sensory nerves.

The problem was one that Quine returned to on and off over the next thirty-five years or so. His solution is that a sentence only counts as an observation sentence for us if an occasion which leads to my having neural intake which disposes me to assent to it also leads to your having neural intake which disposes you to assent to it. Here there is no cross-person identification of neural intake or cross-person standards of perceptual similarity. The solution does, however, require that our standards of perceptual similarity line up in the right sort of way. Two occasions which produce in me neural intakes which are perceptually similar by my standards must also (often enough) produce in you neural intakes which are perceptually similar by your standards. Quine is happy enough with this assumption of mutual attunement and suggests that it can be explained along evolutionary lines (see 1996, 160f.).

We have been explaining what is involved in our having shared responses to stimulation. For the most part, Quine assumes that assent to an observation sentence simply is such a response. This assumption, however, cannot be quite correct. It may look for all the world as if there were a rabbit in front of me, even though there is not. If I have no reason to be suspicious I will be disposed to assent to “Rabbit?”; if I know about the deception, however, I will not be. So my disposition to assent does not, after all, depend solely on my sensory stimulations at the time. It depends also on my internal state, whether I know that in this case the rabbit-like appearance is misleading. The difficulty arises from the corrigibility of “There's a rabbit”, a feature which, on most accounts, it shares with just about every sentence other than those about the speaker's current experience. If a sentence is corrigible then there will be circumstances in which it is false even though they will produce in observers stimulation patterns which would generally lead them to assent to it. But then some observers may know that the circumstances are of this deceptive kind and not be disposed to assent, while others have no such knowledge and are disposed to assent. The moral of this is that assent, even to observation sentences, is not a mere response to stimulation; the responder's internal state (their having ancillary knowledge, or not) may also play a role.

Quine does not seem to have fully appreciated this point, though some of his later discussions come close to doing so[4]. It is not fatal to his general account; it complicates the story rather than requiring a radical change. There may be no sentences which can be wholly mastered simply by acquiring appropriate dispositions to assent and dissent in response to current stimulations. But for some sentences acquiring such dispositions comes close to mastering the use of the sentence, sentences which are almost always true in those cases where observers receive sensory stimulations which dispose them to assent. (Clearly this will be a matter of degree.) So then acquisition of the relevant dispositions, and partial mastery of the sentence, can be used as a basis on which more of the language, and more about the world, can be learned. This further learning in turn allows the child to modify their original disposition to assent and dissent merely in response to current stimulation.

4.3 More Complex Forms of Cognitive Language

To this point, our focus has been on observation sentences. Quine's treatment of more sophisticated parts of language is notably sketchier and more speculative than his detailed discussion of observation sentences. In part this may be because he holds that it is most important to understand the very first step into cognitive language, how such language is possible at all. It may also be that the difficulty in getting a satisfactory account of observation sentences impeded him.

Beyond these points, there is, from a Quinean perspective, a limit to how detailed an account we should expect to have of sophisticated cognitive language. Mastery of an observation sentence corresponds (more or less) to a relatively straightforward disposition: to assent when receiving a stimulation pattern within a certain range. For most sentences, however, this is not the case. What disposition must one have acquired in order to count as understanding a sentence such as “The economy is in recession”? Perhaps one must be able to give evidence if pressed, but what counts as evidence is almost unmanageably diffuse; what evidence one actually has will vary greatly from one person to another. One's assent to the sentence is no doubt tied to sensory stimulations that one has received, if only the sight of those words in a newspaper. These links, however, are “multifarious [and] not easily reconstructed even in conjecture” (1960, 11). The relatively clear-cut account that Quine gives of observation sentences is simply not available.

For these reasons, Quine does not offer any sort of detailed account of the acquisition of cognitive language beyond the observation sentences. What he puts forward instead are stages on the way, forms of language which one might suppose could be easily acquired by a child who has mastered observation sentences and which might provide steps on the way to yet more advanced language.

One such step, which is emphasized in Quine's later work, is the mastery of what he calls observation categoricals. These are sentences of the form “Whenever X happens, Y happens”, where the variables are to be replaced by observation sentences. (E.g. “Whenever there's smoke, there's fire.”) It is plausible to suppose that a child who has learnt the observation sentences can come by a mastery of the relevant observation categorical. The observation sentences are what Quine calls occasion sentences, true on some occasions and false on others, whereas the observation categoricals are eternal sentences, true or false once for all. Quine suggests that we can think of observation categoricals as a plausible first step into mastering eternal sentences, of which our serious theoretical knowledge is composed.

Another step of the same kind is what Quine calls eternal predications, subject-predicate sentences true once for all, such as “Fido is a dog”. Assuming the child has learnt both terms as observation sentences, the sight of the dog will dispose him to assent to each. Quine speculates that the sound of the word “Fido” may have something of the same effect as the sight of the beast, inclining our learner to assent to “Dog” and thus to “Fido is a dog”. It is notable that there is a sort of use-mention confusion operating here, if Quine's suggestion is correct. It is overwhelmingly plausible that language is learned by confusion and “short leaps of analogy” rather than by “continuous derivation” (1975c, 178–9); indeed a holistic language cannot be learnt without such leaps.

A further advance, in Quine's view, takes place when the child comes to use similar sentences but with two general terms, such as “Dogs are animals”. Such a sentence, Quine remarks is “really a universal categorical, ‘Every α is a β’” (1974, 66). This kind of sentence, can be represented using pronouns (“If something is a dog then it is an animal”) or, more or less equivalently, using the logical device of quantifiers and variables. Such sentences have a particular importance for Quine in connection with the idea of reference. Merely to be able to use a name, to be able to name Fido upon seeing him, for example, is not yet to refer; one might simply be using the term as a response to the sight of the beast, hence as an observation sentence. Reference, as Quine sees the matter, requires the capacity to reidentify the object over time and changing circumstances: if a dog is barking then it, that very same dog, is hungry; hence the importance of pronouns.

4.4 Other aspects of epistemology

Quine also has things to say on more familiar epistemological themes. In some cases he indicates how they can be integrated into his approach; thus he suggests that we can (albeit unrealistically) schematize the testing of a scientific theory by thinking of ourselves as deriving observation categoricals which can then be directly tested against observation sentences. In other cases he is content to adopt more or less unchanged the account given by earlier authors, as in his list of the virtues of a theory (see 1990a, 20). The account above has stressed the most novel parts of his epistemology.

5. Metaphysics Naturalized

Quine takes seriously the idea that “it is within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described” (1981, 21). A consequence is that our best theory of the world tells us as much as we know about reality. (Our best theory at given time tells us as much as we know at that time; no doubt our views will progress.) So setting out the broad outlines of that theory, the aspects that might be looked on a philosophical, is the Quinean version or analogue of metaphysics. This subject interacts with that of the last section: Quine's account of the world lays down the constraints within which an account of knowledge must proceed.

5.1 Method: Regimented Theory

How does Quine think we should establish the sort of claims that we are calling “metaphysical”? Some points are familiar from our discussion in section 2. First, we do not resort to any special kind of philosophical insight; we rely upon our ordinary knowledge. Second, what matters is ordinary knowledge as refined and improved upon by science. Third, we rely upon the idea of regimented theory, science formulated in a language that is clarified and simplified “beyond what might reasonably be urged upon the practicing scientist” (1957, 235; quoted in context in section 2). A further point is that in striving for the clarity and simplicity of our theory we must consider the whole theory; local gains may be offset by global losses. It is thus to overall regimented theory that we look when we are “limning the true and ultimate structure of reality” (1960, 221), when we are concerned with metaphysical questions.

In some cases, the answers that Quine gives to such questions are, as we shall see, quite different from what unreflective common sense (or ‘intuition’) might suggest. What is Quine's justification for relying on the idea of regimented theory, rather than on our ordinary conceptual scheme? (Cf. Strawson, 1959, Introduction.) Part of the answer here relies on a point we have already emphasized: the idea of science as in the same line of business as ordinary knowledge, so to speak, but doing it better. But part of the answer relies on another point. Quine holds that “our ordinary conceptual scheme” does not pick out anything definite enough to answer metaphysical questions. Thus he says: “…a fenced ontology is just not implicit in ordinary language…. Ontological concern is not a correction of a lay thought and practice; it is foreign to the lay culture, though an outgrowth of it” (1981, 9).

Regimentation, in Quine's view, involves paraphrase into logical notation. Such paraphrase greatly clarifies and simplifies our theory. Inferences which are a matter of logic will be revealed as such; where additional assumptions are required it will be explicit just what is needed. The logic which Quine takes as the structure of regimented theory is classical (bivalent) first-order logic with identity. Bivalence is justified on the grounds of simplicity. It is not that we have some insight into the nature of the world which is independent of our regimented theory and that this insight shows us the metaphysical truth that every sentence of regimented theory is either true or false. It is, rather, that the simplicity that we gain from making this assumption, at least about sentences of regimented theory, justifies our using a bivalent language; the metaphysical claim follows along. (This reversal of direction should remind us of Carnap. The difference is that Carnap uses the Principle of Tolerance to deny that the idea of theoretical justification for the adoption of a bivalent language is appropriate; Quine, as we emphasized in section 2, does not accept that principle.)

Quine's choice of first-order logic, rather than second-order logic, has been more controversial than his adoption of bivalence. One reason he gives for the decision is that every formalization of second-order logic (unlike first-order logic) is incomplete, relative to the standard semantics. A further reason is that one purpose of the canonical framework is to enable us to assess the ontology of a theory. From this point of view it is surely an advantage that first-order logic has no ontological presuppositions of its own. (By adopting that logic we do commit ourselves to there being some object or other, but not to the existence of any particular entity.) Here again there is a clear contrast with second-order logic, which does have ontological presuppositions. Exactly what those presuppositions are is unclear and has been debated; for Quine, this unclarity is a reason to avoid the subject entirely.

Paraphrasing a theory into classical logic imposes extensionality on it: a predicate may be replaced by a co-extensive predicate without change of truth-value of the containing sentence; likewise an embedded sentence by a sentence by another of the truth-value[5]. Extensionality imposes quite severe restrictions. It requires, for example, that attributions of belief, or other propositional attitudes, be regimented into a form quite different from that which they may appear to have. So one might suppose that Quine accepts extensionality reluctantly, as the price to be paid for the advantages of the use of logic in regimenting theory. Such is not his attitude, however. To the contrary, he thinks of the clarity that extensionality brings as a great advantage, and of theories that lack it as not fully comprehensible: “I find extensionality necessary, indeed, though not sufficient, for my full understanding of a theory” (1995, 90f.).

5.2 Metaphysical Claims

Quine's regimented theory, then, is the sum total of our knowledge, the best that we have, reformulated so as to fit into the framework of first-order logic. All we have are truth-functional connectives, variables and quantifiers, and extra-logical predicates. All metaphysical questions can thus be boiled down to two: What objects do the variables range over? and: What sorts of primitive predicates are to be admitted?

To the first of these questions Quine offers a straightforward answer: his ontology consists of physical objects and sets. He counts as a physical object the matter occupying any portion of space-time, however scattered the portion and however miscellaneous the occupants; such an object need not be what he calls a “body”, such as a person or a tree or a building (see 1981, 13). He briefly entertains the idea that we could manage without postulating matter at all, simply using the sets of space-time points where these are understood as sets of quadruples of real numbers, relative to some co-ordinate system, an ontology of abstract objects only. He seems to see no knock-down argument against this but abandons it, perhaps because the gain is too small to justify the magnitude of the departure from our ordinary views. That he is willing to consider such a view, and take it seriously, shows something about his general attitude.

Regimented theory contains no abstract objects other than sets. Many abstracta, however, can be defined in terms of sets: numbers, functions, and other mathematical entities being the most obvious. Other alleged abstracta, such as propositions, and possible entities, Quine excludes. The chief reason for this is that the identity-criteria for such entities are, he claims, unclear. He holds, quite generally, that we should not postulate entities without having clear identity-criteria for them. (This is the view that he sums up in the slogan “no entity without identity”; see (1969, 23) and elsewhere.) Doing so would threaten the clarity and definiteness which the notion of identity brings to theory; local gains from postulating propositions are not worth this global loss.

Regimented theory also has no place for mental entities, most obviously minds, if those are taken to be distinct from physical entities. The qualification is important. We can admit some mental entities as special cases of physical objects. Thus my act of thinking about Fermat's Last Theorem at a particular time can simply be identified with my body during that period of time (see 1995, 87f.). The things that we might want to say about my act of thinking (that it was inspired, or stupid, or what have you) can simply be reconstrued as predicates true or false of physical objects. This is the view sometimes known as anomalous monism or as token-token identity theory, as distinct from type-type identity theory. I may think of the theorem at many times, over the years, and on each occasion that act is identified with a physical state that I am in at the time. Token-token identity theory does not claim that these physical states have anything in particular in common, still less that all acts of thinking about the theorem have something in common. There is no claim that each acts of thinking about the theorem can be identified with, e.g. a repeatable pattern of the firing of brain cells. It is enough for Quine's purposes that each particular act of thinking can be identified with a physical object. (Note that this view excludes disembodied minds and mental entities. Quine thinks that is no loss at all. Note also that it can be construed either as eliminating mental entities or simply as identifying them with physical objects. Quine prefers the latter phrasing but thinks there is no real difference here; cf. 1960, 265.) This ontological physicalism might seem trivial. Quine would not disagree; he speaks of it as “[e]ffortless monism … form without substance” (1995, 85).

On the issue of the admissibility of predicates, Quine's physicalism is more substantive and more complicated. (This is in keeping with his general idea that we can think of the admissibility of predicates, rather than ontology, as “where the metaphysical action is”; 1976, 504). The requirement here is that the difference between a predicate's being true of a given object and its being false of it should, in all cases, be a physical difference: “nothing happens in the world, not the flutter of an eyelid, not the flicker of a thought, without some redistribution of microphysical states…. physics can settle for nothing less” (1981, 98). If a predicate such as “…is thinking about Fermat's Last Theorem” picks out genuine events in the world then there is a physical difference between its being true of a person and its not being true of them, a fact of the matter.

A difficulty in making sense of this is that the idea of a physical fact is not one that we can definitively specify. To tie the idea too closely to current physics would rule out fundamental changes in that subject; to leave it floating free might seem to allow anything to count. But clearly Quine does not mean just any subject that someone might call by the name “Physics”. He has in mind a subject continuous with our physics, alike or superior in its coherence and in its explanatory power. (In particular, it would not have “an irreducibly psychological annex”: 1986a, 403f.). If phenomena occurred which could not be explained by any such theory then Quine's physicalism would, of course, go by the board.

The most controversial application of this view is to the realm of (alleged) mental phenomena. Within that realm, Quine focuses on attributions of propositional attitudes, statements that so-and-so believes that such-and-such, or hopes that, or fears that, etc. (One reason for this focus may be that his interest is primarily in human knowledge; another that some other mental states, such as pain, can perhaps be identified with certain types of neurophysiological events.)

On the face of it, ascriptions of belief (to stick to that case) violate extensionality. If Mary is the Dean, still Tom's believing that the Dean sings well is not the same as his believing that Mary sings well, since her accession to the Deanship may be unknown to him. Quine escapes this sort of problem by taking an attribution of belief to express a relation between the believer and a sentence, understood to be, in the usual case, in the language of the ascriber.

It is worth noting the idea of another sense of belief-ascription which would not be vulnerable even prima facie to problems of extensionality, so-called de re belief, as distinct from de dicto belief. In the 1950s Quine argued that there must be such a sense. In the late 1960s, however, he abandoned the idea, for lack of clear standards of when it is correct to ascribe a de re belief to someone. (See (Quine, 1956) for a statement of the distinction, and (Quine, 1973) for retraction.) Other philosophers, however, continue to hold the idea.

Construing attributions of belief as statements of attitudes towards sentences gives them a syntax and an ontology that Quine can accept. That does not mean, however, that the idiom “A believes that p” satisfies his physicalistic criterion, i.e. that all statements of this form correspond to (physical) facts. The matter is complicated. Quine certainly accepts that most uses of this idiom do correspond to facts of the matter. Such facts are neurophysiological states of the person concerned, and those states are causally connected with actions which the person performs, or would perform under certain circumstances, and which we count as manifestations of the belief, or lack of belief. (Assenting or dissenting if one were asked is one such action, but only one among a myriad.) In cases where we have evidence for or against the ascription of a belief, the evidence consists in behaviour and there is presumably one or more neurophysiological states which explain the behaviour. The person's being in those states, although not specifiable in neurophysiological terms, is among the physical facts in which the truth of the ascription consists. The same point will hold in many cases where we have no evidence. In some such cases we simply do not know of the relevant behaviour; in others, there was no behaviour but still there were dispositions to behave in relevant ways, and these are physical states in which the truth of the ascription consists. So in most cases where we ascribe belief, there is a fact of the matter which makes the ascription true or false.

The belief idiom, however, also lends itself to use in other cases, where there is no fact of the matter. These are cases in which we have no evidence, and in which no behavioural tests which we might have carried out would have supplied evidence, cases in which there simply is nothing in the subject's neurophysiology, and hence nothing in their actual or potential behaviour, which would decide the matter. Quine puts the point like this: “Some beliefs, perhaps belief in the essential nobility of man qua man, are… not readily distinguishable from mere lip service, and in such cases there is no fact of the matter…. But most attributions or confessions of belief do make sense…. The states of belief, where real, are… states of nerves” (1986a, 429)

Quine explicitly acknowledges that we could not in practice manage without idioms of propositional attitude, and that most uses of such idioms are entirely unobjectionable. But since such idioms allow the formation of sentence which do not correspond to facts of the matter, they are not part of regimented theory and should not be used when we are concerned with “limning the true and ultimate structure of reality” (1960, 221). (Some philosophers might insist: “Either you accept the concept of belief or you don't”; Quine would not agree.)

A somewhat similar point can be made about subjunctive or counterfactual conditionals: some are factual but the general counterfactual idiom conditionals allows for the formation of sentences which are not. Like propositional attitudes, counterfactual conditionals have an important role in our practical lives. They are also closely connected with dispositions which, as we have seen, play a central role in Quine's account of language and how it is learned. The connection is easily seen: to call an object fragile is to say that it would break if it were dropped onto a hard surface from a significant height.

Quine does not accept the general counterfactual idiom, “if X were to happen then Y would happen”, as part of regimented theory. As in the case of belief, the unrestricted use of this idiom allows us to form sentences whose truth-conditions are, at best, unclear. A famous example is the pair, presumably alluding to the Korean war of the early 1950s: “If Caesar were in charge he would use the atom bomb”; “If Caesar were in charge he would use catapults”. In such cases, we have no reason to think that some (physical) fact is being claimed. Many dispositions, however, are perfectly acceptable by Quinean standards. To call the glass fragile is to attribute to it a structure which would lead its breaking if it were dropped from a significant height onto a hard surface; the structure is a physical state, even if not specifiable in physical terms.

Quine claims that the dispositions he relies on in his account of language are like the case of fragility rather than the case of Caesar. The disposition to assent to an observation sentence when receiving certain stimulations is a physical state of the person concerned, in particular, presumably, of his brain. The claim that a given person has such a disposition is thus a claim about the state of a physical object. It is, moreover, a claim that we can test, at least under favourable conditions. There is no reason to exclude it from regimented theory.

Another idiom which Quine famously excludes from regimented theory is that of modality, statements that such-and-such must be the case, or cannot be the case, and so on. Such idioms have been the subject of much discussion on the part of Quine and (especially) his critics; the discussion here shall be very brief. Technically, there are similarities with the case of belief. There is prima facie violation of extensionality which can, however, be avoided by taking necessity to apply to sentences; some philosophers have claimed that there is a de re sense of necessity which does not lead to even prima facie violations of extensionality. Quine's attitude towards modality, however, is far less sympathetic than his attitude towards belief. He holds that the best we can do by way of making sense of necessity is to construe it as an attribute applicable to sentences and identified with analyticity. Since he does not think we can in general make sense of the latter idea, he does not accept even that notion of necessity. He has no sympathy at all with other attempts to make sense of necessity, none, in particular, with the alleged de re sense of that term.

What frames these critical points is the fact that Quine holds that regimented theory, the best, clearest, and most objective statement of our knowledge, simply has no need for a notion of necessity. The benefit of including such idioms in regimented theory is not worth the cost in unclarity that it would bring.

5.3 Truth

Truth, in Quine's view, is immanent to our theory of the world. In accord with his fundamental naturalism, he sees judgments of truth as made from within our theory of the world. For this reason, he is in sympathy with what is sometimes called the disquotational theory of truth: to say that a sentence is true is, in effect, to assert the sentence. Two qualifications must be made. First, the disquotational view is not a definition of “is true”. It enables us to eliminate the predicate when it is applied to a finite number of specific sentences but not from contexts where it is applied to infinitely many. Such contexts are of particular importance to logical theory. We say, for example, that a conjunction is true just in case both conjuncts are true; here “is true” cannot be eliminated. Second, calling a sentence true is in one way unlike asserting it. If we subsequently change our verdict on it we say that we used to believe it but now we don't. We do not, however, say that it used to be true but now it isn't; rather we say that it was never true. Quine, however, sees this as simply a point of usage, with no particular philosophical implications.

The immanence of truth, on Quine's account, might suggest that his realism is threatened by what has become known as the underdetermination of theory by evidence: that two or more rival theories might have all the same observational consequences, and thus be empirically equivalent. Quine finds underdetermination harder to make sense of than might appear and, in any case, does not see a threat to realism; we shall defer further discussion to the next section.

6. Underdetermination of Theory by Evidence; Indeterminacy of Translation

In this section we take up two ideas briefly alluded to in earlier discussion. Neither is essential for an understanding of Quine's overall philosophy, although some commentators have argued the contrary position, especially in the case of indeterminacy. (See, for example, Ebbs (1997); for a defense of the position taken here see section 3, above, and Hylton (2007).)

6.1 Underdetermination

In Quine's idealized schematization of the relation between theory and evidence, evidence for theory consists of observation categoricals. (These latter can, in turn, be tested by observing or contriving situations in which relevant observation sentences are true.) The case which most obviously poses a potential threat to realism is that of a final global theory, a perfected and completed version of our own, which would perhaps imply all true observation categoricals. (Note that the theory will not be implied by all the true observation categoricals; apart from other considerations, some sentences of the theory will essentially contain terms which do not occur in observation categoricals.) What if there are two or more final global theories, each of which implies all true observation categoricals, and which possess other theoretical virtues, such as simplicity, to an equal degree?

From a Quinean point of view there are difficulties in making sense of this kind of underdetermination in non-trivial fashion. Quine identifies theories with sets of sentences, not with sets of sentence-meanings (otherwise known as propositions). Given this view, we can quite trivially obtain an empirically equivalent alternative to any theory: simply spell one of the theoretical terms differently at every occurrence. The result is a different set of sentences which imply all the same observation categoricals. The difference from the original theory, however, is merely orthographic; this possibility is clearly not of any philosophical significance.

A closely related point can be made in terms of translation. Translation of observation categoricals is, presumably, quite unproblematic in principle. So we can count two theories as empirically equivalent not merely if they imply the same observation categoricals but also if they imply intertranslateable observation categoricals. In that sense, however, the theory we are postulating has many empirical equivalents; if it is in English it can presumably be translated into German, or Japanese, or any other language. But this kind of underdetermination, like that of the previous paragraph, is not likely to be of any great philosophical significance.

A version of underdetermination that might threaten realism would thus assert that our postulated complete global theory of the world will have empirically equivalent alternatives with no translation from one to the other being possible, i.e. that we cannot obtain one from the other by reconstruing the predicates of the theory. Quine comments: “This, for me, is an open question” (1975a, 327). Much of his subsequent discussion of underdetermination takes place in terms of the weaker idea that our theory might have empirically equivalent alternatives such that “we would see no way of reconciling [them] by reconstrual of predicates” (loc. cit, emphasis added; cf. also 1990, 97).

To this point, we have said very little about what response would be justified if some version of underdetermination were true. This is an issue on which Quine not merely changed his mind but vacillated, going back and forth between what he calls the “sectarian” and the “ecumenical” responses. The sectarian response is to say that we should not let the existence of the alternative in any way affect our attitude towards our own theory; we should continue to take it seriously, as uniquely telling us the truth about the world. (We are assuming that the two theories possess all theoretical virtues to equal degree; clearly Quine would say that if we found a superior theory, a simpler one, for example, then we would have reason to adopt it.) The ecumenical response, by contrast, counts both theories as true. In almost his last word on the subject he suggests that there may be little at stake since the “fantasy of irresolubly rival systems of the world” takes us “out beyond where linguistic usage has been crystallized by use” (1990, 100f). In an even later piece of writing, however, Quine speaks of himself as “settled into the sectarian [attitude]” (1986b, 684f.).

Quine can afford to vacillate on the issue because, in his view, nothing very much turns on the issue. In particular, he never holds that underdetermination, in any version, would threaten realism; at no time does he suggest that it might show that our theory is less than unqualifiedly true. That is not what is in question between the sectarian and the ecumenical positions; all that is in question is whether the alternative theory should also be counted as true. Nor is this surprising. The terms in which underdetermination are stated, notably the appeal to observation categoricals, are part of our theory, as would be the demonstration that another theory was empirically equivalent. The point here is the naturalism which we have emphasized throughout. Nothing in our epistemology pronounces on the status of theory from an independent standpoint; to the contrary: it presupposes the truth of our theory. This central idea is not cast in doubt by underdetermination.

6.2 Indeterminacy of Translation

The general claim of the indeterminacy of translation is that there might be different ways of translating a language which are equally correct but which are not mere stylistic variants. The claim includes what one might think of as the limiting case of translation, that in which a given language is ‘translated’ into itself.

Some philosophers have held that the idea of indeterminacy is absurd, or that it amounts to an extreme form of scepticism about whether we ever understand one another, or whether correct translation is possible at all. It is not hard to see how such opinions arise. One picture of communication is like this: you have an idea, a determinate meaning, in your mind and convey it me by your utterance. To those who have that picture, indeterminacy may seem to threaten the idea of communication, for it seems to suggest that the conveying is always vulnerable to drastic failure. In the case of translation, one view is that synonymy, sameness of meaning, is the criterion of correct translation; in that case, indeterminacy may appear as a denial that translation is possible at all.

Such views, however, take for granted a view of communication, or of translation, which is very far from Quine's. For Quine, the criterion of successful communication, whether or not translation is involved, is fluent interaction, verbal and nonverbal: “Success in communication is judged by smoothness of conversation, by frequent predictability of verbal and nonverbal reactions, and by coherence and plausibility of native testimony” (1990, 43). From this point of view, talk of synonymy and of ideas in the mind is simply a theoretical gloss which is (at best) in need of justification. Quine doubts that the gloss is justifiable; his scepticism about the theorizing, however, is not scepticism about the data. Smooth communication certainly occurs, sometimes in cases where different languages are involved. That successful translation occurs is not cast in doubt by anything he says; his claim, indeed, is that it may be possible in more than one way.

At this point we need to distinguish the two kinds of indeterminacy. Quine introduces the general idea of indeterminacy, in Chapter Two of (1960), without explicitly making the distinction but subsequently comes to treat them quite differently. The first is indeterminacy of reference: that there is more than one way of translating sentences where the various versions differ in the reference that they attribute to parts of the sentence but not in the overall net import that they attribute to the sentence as a whole. (This doctrine is also known as “ontological relativity” and “inscrutability of reference”.) To use an example which has become famous, a given sentence might be translated as “There's a rabbit” or as “Rabbithood is manifesting itself there” or as “There are undetached rabbit parts”, or in other ways, limited only by one's ingenuity. Something like this, Quine suggests, can be done systematically for terms referring to physical objects: each such term is translated as referring to all of space-time other than the portion occupied by that object; each predicate is translated by one which is true of the space-time complement of an object just in case the original predicate is true of the object. It will not help to ask the person we are translating whether she means to refer to the family dog or to its space-time complement: her answer is subject to the same indeterminacy.

Indeterminacy of reference is akin to a view of theoretical entities put forward by Ramsey: that there is no more to such an object than the role that it plays in the structure of the relevant theory (see Ramsey, 1931). For Quine, however, the point holds for all objects, since he “see[s] all objects as theoretical… . Even our most primordial objects, bodies, are already theoretical” (1981, 20). Quine holds, moreover, that considerations akin to those of the previous paragraph amount to a “trivial proof” of indeterminacy of reference (1986c, 728).

The second kind of indeterminacy, which Quine sometimes refers to as holophrastic indeterminacy, is another matter. Here the claim is that there is more than one correct method of translating sentences where the two translations differ not merely in the meanings attributed to the sub-sentential parts of speech but also in the net import of the whole sentence. This claim involves the whole language, so there are going to be no examples, perhaps except of an exceedingly artificial kind. There is also nothing resembling a proof; in some late work, indeed, Quine refers to it as a “conjecture” (loc. cit.). At some earlier points, he seems to think that sufficiently clear-headed reflection on what goes into translation will suffice to make the idea at least plausible. All that can be required of a method of translation is that it enables us to get along with the speakers of the other language, why should there not be more than one way to do it?

Arguments have been offered for holophrastic indeterminacy based on the idea of underdetermination of theory by evidence. Perhaps there is determinate translation of observation sentences, and thus observation categoricals. Still, if two distinct theories are compatible with all truths stated in observational terms, surely we could plausibly attribute either theory to the speaker of the other language? The weakness of this kind of argument is that translation must presumably preserve more than links between sentences and stimulations, as captured by observation sentences; it must also preserve links among sentences, such that accepting one sentence makes a speaker of the language more or less likely to accept another. Could there be methods of translation which preserved both kinds of links but nevertheless yielded different results? Quine's term “conjecture” seems apt.

Given the interpretation advanced in section 3, above, indeterminacy is not crucial for Quine's rejection of the sort of use that Carnap makes of the idea of analyticity. He has other arguments on that score, as we saw. More generally, indeterminacy is not a crucial part of Quine's overall view. (His coming to speak of it as conjectural, while not abandoning other parts of his philosophy, suggests that he agrees.) If we were sure that translation is determinate, we could perhaps use the idea to define a notion of synonymy, as suggested in section 3. (Agnosticism here favours the contrary position.) And, as Quine has indicated, we could then define the meaning of an expression as the set of synonymous expressions. Such a notion of meaning might make some difference. It might, for example, provide a criterion of identity which enabled us to accept beliefs as entities. It will not, however, play the most important roles in which philosophers have cast the idea of meaning. In particular, it will not play a role in the explanation of how we understand our language, or of how communication between persons functions in successful discourse.

7. Quine's place in the history of philosophy

In the 1930s and 1940s, many scientifically-oriented philosophers tended to assume some form of Logical Empiricism. One important aspect of Quine's influence on the course of philosophy is that he called that view or nexus of views into question. Some of his criticisms are detailed and technical. His target, however, was not a detail but the fundamental ideas of the view, notably that there is a distinction between analytic truths and synthetic truths which can account for a priori truth. After Quine's work of the early 1950s, philosophers, even those who did not accept his detailed arguments, could no longer take it for granted that some form of Logical Empiricism is correct. This was a very major change.

Quine's criticism of Logical Empiricism was examined in section 3, especially 3.2. That discussion also indicated that Quine's positive views are quite different from those of the Logical Empiricists in two very general (and connected) ways. First, Quine rejects the idea of a sharp distinction between philosophy on the one hand and empirical science on the other hand. To the contrary: he sees philosophy as essentially in the same line of work as science, but mostly concerned with more theoretical and abstract questions. This is an integral part of his naturalism. Second, his criticism of Carnap opens the way for something that might be called metaphysics: for very general reflections on the nature of the world, based on the best scientific knowledge that we have and on claims about how that knowledge might be organized so as to maximize its objectivity and clarity.

Both of these Quinean points, his naturalism and his acceptance of something like metaphysics, correspond to very important developments within analytic philosophy over the past half-century. We cannot know to what extent these developments would have taken place even without Quine's work; it is, however, hard to resist the idea that his influence has at least played a significant role. (In the case of metaphysics, in particular, it is notable that two leading figures, Saul Kripke and David Lewis, were students of Quine's.) For the most part, however, those doctrines have taken on forms that Quine himself would be strongly opposed to.

In the case of naturalism, many philosophers have welcomed the idea that they are free to use concepts and results drawn from empirical science. Fewer have accepted that philosophy should also be constrained by scientific standards of clarity, of evidence, and of explanatoriness. The result is that while views which claim to accept naturalism are common, those which accept Quine's standards of what counts as reputable naturalistic philosophy are not.

The case of metaphysics is similar. Quine does accept that the philosopher is in a position to make very general claims about the world (that there are sets but not properties, for example). In his hands, such claims are answerable to the idea of a total system of our scientific knowledge, regimented so as to maximize clarity and system. Many philosophers have welcomed the freedom to speculate about the nature of the world but have not accepted Quine's constraints on the process. The result is a flourishing of metaphysics, often based on ordinary (unregimented) language or on the deliverances of ‘intuition’; much of this work would be anathema to Quine.

On the one hand, then, Quine's work has been extremely influential and has done much to shape the course of philosophy in the second-half of the twentieth century and into the twenty-first. On the other hand, much of the work directly or indirectly influenced by Quine is of a sort that he would have thought quite misguided.


Primary Literature

See the link in the Other Internet Resources to the list of writings of Quine compiled by Eddie Yeghiayan. See also the bibliography in Hahn, Edwin, and Paul Arthur Schilpp, 1986, The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, (Peru, IL: Open Court; second, expanded edition, 1998) which is complete up to 1997.

Works by Quine referred to in the text

Secondary Literature

Note: Works annotated by [*] at the end contain both essays on Quine's work and comments on those essays by Quine himself.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

analytic/synthetic distinction | anomalous monism | epistemology: naturalized | logic: second-order and higher-order | logic and ontology | metaphysics | naturalism | Quine, Willard van Orman: New Foundations | underdetermination, of scientific theories


I am grateful to Dagfinn Føllesdal and Andrew Lugg for their comments on earlier drafts of this entry.