Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Mar 16, 2011

Proclus of Athens (*412–485 C.E.) was the most authoritative philosopher of late antiquity and played a crucial role in the transmission of Platonic philosophy from antiquity to the Middle Ages. For almost fifty years, he was head or ‘successor’ (diadochos, sc. of Plato) of the Platonic ‘Academy’ in Athens. Being an exceptionally productive writer, he composed commentaries on Aristotle, Euclid and Plato, systematic treatises in all disciplines of philosophy as it was at that time (metaphysics and theology, physics, astronomy, mathematics, ethics) and exegetical works on traditions of religious wisdom (Orphism and Chaldaean Oracles). Proclus had a lasting influence on the development of the late Neoplatonic schools not only in Athens, but also in Alexandria, where his student Ammonius became the head of the school. In a culture dominated by Christianity, the Neoplatonic philosophers had to defend the superiority of the Hellenic traditions of wisdom. Continuing a movement that was inaugurated by Iamblichus (4th c.) and the charismatic figure of emperor Julian, and following the teaching of Syrianus, Proclus was eager to demonstrate the harmony of the ancient religious revelations (the mythologies of Homer and Hesiod, the Orphic theogonies and the Chaldaean Oracles) and to integrate them in the philosophical tradition of Pythagoras and Plato. Towards this end, his Platonic Theology offers a magisterial summa of pagan Hellenic theology. Probably the best starting point for the study of Proclus' philosophy is the Elements of Theology (with the masterly commentary by E.R. Dodds) which provide a systematic introduction into the Neoplatonic metaphysical system.

1. Life and Works

Since Proclus' extant works contain almost no evidence about his biography, we have to rely on the information transmitted by his direct pupil Marinus of Neapolis in the eulogy he devoted to his predecessor Proclus or on Happiness. Moreover, some scattered remarks on Proclus and valuable information about the schools in Athens and Alexandria can be found in Damascius' Life of Isidorus (called by other scholars The Philosophical History). As with Porphyry's Life of Plotinus, both Marinus' and Damascius' works are biographies written by students praising extensively the achievements of their teachers both in doctrine and in philosophical life.

On Proclus' works see Beutler (1957), 190–208, Saffrey-Westerink (1968), lv–lx, Rosán (²2009), 266-274, and the overview given below (1.2). Although a large part of his numerous writings is lost, some major commentaries on Plato have survived (though incomplete) and some important systematic works. Moreover, later Neoplatonists such as Damascius, Olympiodorus, Simplicius, and Philoponus have conserved many extracts of lost work, but these fragments have never been collected.

1.1 “Proclus or On Happiness” (Marinus' Life of Proclus)

Proclus or On Happiness sets out to prove that Proclus reached in his life the culmination of happiness (eudaimonia) and wisdom because he ascended the scale of all virtues, the natural, the ethical, the political, the purifying, the intellectual, and the so called theurgic virtues, the latter of which make humans ‘act with the gods.’ (The different virtues have been interpreted in various ways in the Neoplatonic tradition; ultimately they refer to different stages in the purification and ascent of the human soul, see Saffrey/Segonds 2001, lxix–c.)

Proclus was born in Constantinople/Byzantium (now Istanbul) into a rich Lycian family in 412. Not long after his birth his parents returned to their hometown Xanthos in Lycia, a maritime area of what is now southwest Turkey. He began his education in Xanthos and moved from there to Alexandria (Egypt) to pursue the study of rhetoric in order to become a lawyer, as was his father. However, during a journey to Byzantium he discovered philosophy as his vocation. Back in Alexandria he studied Aristotle and mathematics. Marinus reports that the very gifted pupil easily learned all of Aristotle's logical writings by heart.

In 430–431, 18 years old, Proclus moved to Athens, attracted by the fame of the Platonic School there. He studied for two years under the direction of Plutarch (of Athens; to be distinguished from the 1st-2nd c. philosopher/biographer), reading with him Plato's Phaedo and Aristotle's De anima. After Plutarch's death in 432, Syrianus became the head of the Academy. Proclus followed with him the usual curriculum of the school (going back to Iamblichus), reading first Aristotle's works and after that entering the ‘greater mysteries,’ the Platonic dialogues. Under Syrianus, Proclus also came into contact with the older traditions of wisdom such as the theology of the Orphics and the Chaldaean Oracles. Among Syrianus' lost works we find a treatise On the harmony of Orpheus, Pythagoras and Plato with the Chaldaean Oracles. As the Suda lexicon attributes a work with this title also to Proclus, it is not unlikely that he published Syrianus' treatise, adding comments of his own. Since Syrianus and Proclus worked intensively together for six years, Proclus was strongly influenced by his teacher. On many occasions Proclus praises the philosophical achievements of his teacher and he never criticizes him. Because of this, it is almost impossible to distinguish between Proclus' original contribution and what he adopted from Syrianus.

After Syrianus' death (437), Proclus succeeded as head of the Athenian school, and he kept this position for almost fifty years until his death in 485. His tight schedule of the day, starting with a prayer to the sun at sunrise (repeated at noontime and at sunset), included lectures, reading seminars, discussions with students, and literary work of his own. Besides his philosophical activities, Marinus also portrays Proclus as an experienced practitioner of theurgy (Life of Proclus, § 28–29; on theurgy see below 3.6). The practice of these pagan rites could only be continued in the private sphere of the School's grounds. Though Proclus was in Athens a highly respected philosopher and had some Christian students, he had to be prudent to avoid anti-pagan reactions. Marinus tells that he had to go into exile for about one year to Lydia (in Asia) to avoid difficulties (Life of Proclus § 15).

1.2 Works (extant and lost)

Marinus notes that Proclus was an extremely industrious writer, having an “unbounded love of work” (Life of Proclus § 22). Apart from an impressive teaching-load and several other commitments, Proclus wrote every day about 700 lines (about 20–25 pages). It is unlikely that Proclus published all of them. However that may be, from Proclus' extant works and the information about his lost works it emerges that he was a productive writer indeed. Roughly two thirds of Proclus' output is now lost and several works, especially his commentaries on Plato, have been transmitted in a mutilated form.

Among Proclus' surviving works we have five commentaries on Plato (on Alcibiades, Cratylus, Republic, Timaeus, and Parmenides), one commentary on Euclid, two manuals on physics and metaphysics respectively (Elements of Physics, Elements of Theology), an astronomical work (Hypotypôsis), three monographs (Tria opuscula) on providence, fate, and free will and the origin of evil, and the Platonic Theology, which offers an impressive summa of Plato's theology, as well as theological Hymns. See the supplement on

Proclus’ Works (the main extant works).

Some of his works have been completely lost, such as his commentaries on Aristotle (the Organon), of others only a few fragments remain. See the supplement on

Proclus’ Complete Works (extant, lost, and spurious)

It is difficult to establish a chronology of Proclus' works. The Platonic Theology is generally considered to be his last work. In writing the Theology Proclus heavily depends on his interpretation of the Parmenides and often refers to his commentary on this dialogue, which must have been finished some time before. We know from Marinus (Life of Proclus §13) that Proclus finished his Commentary on the Timaeus by the age of 27. However, it cannot be excluded that Proclus rewrote or modified it later. As the Alcibiades came at the beginning of the curriculum in the school, its commentary may also be an early work. The Commentary on the Republic is not a proper commentary, but a collection of several essays on problems and sections in this dialogue. These essays may have been written at different times in Proclus' life and only later put together (by Proclus himself or by someone else). The Hypotypôsis (Exposition of Astronomical Hypotheses) was written in the year after Proclus' exile in Lydia, but we do not know when exactly that took place. The Tria opuscula all deal with similar topics, but they need not have been composed at the same time. There are plausible arguments to put the second treatise, On What Depends on Us, some years after the events forcing Proclus to go into exile. The first treatise, which in some parts depends very much on Plutarch (of Chaironea, 1st-2nd c. C.E.), could be set earlier in his career. It also contains a discussion on the nature of evil, which is much simpler than what we find in the treatise On the Existence of Evils, which is more sophisticated and probably was composed later. Because of its introductory character, one may be inclined to consider the Elements of Physics as an early work. This has also been claimed for the Elements of Theology, which, however, shows all the sophistication of Proclus's mature thought. It may be possible that Proclus revised this text several times in his career.

2. The Commentator of Plato

The center of Proclus' extensive oeuvre is without doubt his exegesis of Plato, as is shown by the large commentaries he devoted to major dialogues. This Platonic focus is also evident in the composition of his systematic works. The Platonic Theology offers a systematic exposition of theology based on an interpretation of all relevant sections on the gods and their attributes in Plato's dialogues, and in particular on the Parmenides, considered as the most theological of all dialogues. Proclus probably commented on all dialogues included in the curriculum of the school since Iamblichus. In addition Proclus wrote the commentary on the Republic mentioned above. The curriculum consisted of altogether 12 dialogues distributed into two cycles. The first cycle started with Alcibiades (on self-knowledge) and ended with the Philebus (on the final cause of everything: the good), comprising two dialogues on ethics (the Gorgias and the Phaedo), two on logic (the Cratylus and the Theaetetus), two on physics (the Sophist and the Statesman), and two on theology (the Phaedrus and the Symposium). The second cycle included the two perfect dialogues that were considered to encompass Plato's whole philosophy (In Tim. I 13.14–17), namely, the Timaeus (on physics) and the Parmenides (on theology).

In the form and method of his commentaries, Proclus is again influenced by Iamblichus. He assumes that each Platonic dialogue must have one main theme (skopos) to which all parts of the arguments ought to be related. To interpret the text, different approaches are possible (theological, mathematical, physical, ethical exegesis), but they are all interconnected according to the principle ‘everything in everything’ (panta en pasin). Thus, the Timaeus has in all its parts as its purpose the explanation of nature (physiologia). Even the introductory sections, the summary of the discussion in the Republic and the anticipation of the story about Atlantis, must be understood from this point of view; for they contain, in the mode of ‘images and examples,’ a description of the fundamental forces that are at work in the physical world. Also the long treatise on human nature, which concludes Timaeus' exposition, has ultimately a cosmological meaning, as the human animal is a microcosmos wherein all elements and all causes of the great universe are found. More problematic was the determination of the skopos of the Parmenides. In a long discussion with the whole hermeneutical tradition since middle-Platonism, Proclus defends a theological interpretation of the dialogue. According to him, the dialectical discussion on the One and the Many (ta alla) reveals the first divine principles of all things.

With the exception of the commentary on the Cratylus, of which only a selection of notes from the original commentary is preserved, the exegetical works of Proclus have a clear structure. They divide the Platonic text in different lemmata or cited passages, discussing first the doctrine exposed in the particular section (pragmata, later called theoria), next commenting on the formulation of the argument (called lexis) [see Festugière 1963]. Whereas modern scholars usually accept a development in Plato's thought and distinguish between an early, middle, and late Plato, the Neoplatonists take the Platonic corpus as the expression of a divinely inspired and unitary philosophical doctrine. This enables them to connect different Platonic dialogues into one system and to see numerous cross-references within the Platonic oeuvre. What may seem to be contradictions between statements made in different dialogues, can be explained by different pedagogical contexts, some dialogues being rather maieutic than expository, some elenctic of the sophistic pseudo-science, some offering a dialectical training to young students.

A Neoplatonic commentary offers much more than a faithful interpretation of an authoritative text of Plato. Plato's text gives the commentator an opportunity to develop his own views on the most fundamental philosophical questions, the first principles, the idea of the Good, the doctrine of the Forms, the soul and its faculties, nature, etc. As was said, the two culminating dialogues, the Timaeus and the Parmenides, offer together a comprehensive view of the whole of Platonic philosophy.

Since the whole philosophy is divided into the study of intelligibles and the study of things within the cosmos – and quite rightly so, as the cosmos too is twofold, the intelligible and the sensible, as Timaeus himself will say in what follows (Timaeus 30c) – the Parmenides comprehends the study (pragmateia) of the intelligibles and the Timaeus the study of things within the cosmos. For the former teaches us all the divine orders and the latter all processions of things within the cosmos. (In Tim. I 12.30–13.7)

The interpretation of the Parmenides thus prepares the way for the Platonic Theology, offering the systematic structure for a scientific demonstration of the procession of all the orders of gods from the first principle. As Proclus explains at Theol. Plat. I 2, p. 9.8–19, the Platonic Theology falls into three parts (after a long methodological introduction). The first part (Theol. Plat. I 13–29) is an investigation into the common notions (koinai ennoiai) of the gods as we find them in Plato's dialogues: it is a treatise on the divine names and attributes. The second part (Theol. Plat. II–VI), which is incomplete, unfolds in a systematic way the procession of the divine hierarchies, from the One, that is the first god, to the ‘higher kinds,’ i.e., angels, daimones, and heroes, while the third part, which is altogether missing, was supposed to deal with the individual hypercosmic and encosmic gods.

Before presenting his own views, Proclus usually critically evaluates the opinions and interpretations of his predecessors. In this respect, his commentaries are a rich and indispensible source for the history of Middle and Neo-Platonism. Thus, in his Commentary on the Timaeus Proclus reports and criticizes the views of Atticus, Numenius, Longinus, Plotinus, Porphyry, Iamblichus, Theodorus of Asine and many others, ending usually in full agreement with the explanation of his master Syrianus. Besides, in explaining Plato's text, Proclus frequently seeks confirmation of his exegesis in the Chaldaean Oracles or the Orphic tradition. As Syrianus (see Helmig 2009), Proclus is often very critical of Aristotle and refutes his criticism of Plato's views. He is certainly not an advocate of the “harmony of Plato and Aristotle,” which became the leading principle of the Alexandrian commentaries (of Ammonius and Simplicius). Proclus notes significant differences between the two philosophers in epistemology (theory of abstraction vs. learning as recollection), metaphysics (first principle, theory of Forms, theory of universals), physics (Plato's Timaeus vs. Aristotle's Physics), political philosophy (Aristotle's criticism of Plato's Republic), and language (Cratylus vs. De Interpretatione). According to Proclus, Plato is not only far superior to Aristotle in his theology (as only Plato ascended beyond the intellect to posit the One as the ineffable principle of all things), but in all other philosophical disciplines, where we owe to him all important discoveries. Whereas the Peripatetics were accustomed to defend the superiority of Aristotle over Plato with reference to his impressive physical project, Proclus considers the latter as inferior to the great achievement of Plato in the Timaeus (see Steel 2003). Aristotle's natural philosophy is the work of a zealous admirer, a disciple who tried to be better than the master:

It seems to me that the excellent Aristotle emulated the teaching of Plato as far as possible when he structured the whole investigation about nature. (In Tim. I 6.21–24)

Following Plato, Aristotle explains in his Physics the general principles of natural things: form, matter, nature, the essence and principles of movement, time and place; again taking inspiration from the Timaeus, he studies in other works the specific principles of the distinct regions of the physical world, thus in the De Caelo the celestial and the sublunary realm, and in On generation and corruption and in Meteorologica the sublunary realm. In this domain, it cannot be denied, Aristotle did much more than his master. According to Proclus, however, he developed the subject ‘beyond what is needed’. The same remark must be made about Aristotle's extensive zoological research. Whereas Plato limited himself in the Timaeus to an analysis of the fundamental principles of all living organisms, Aristotle gave most of his attention to the material components of animals and scarcely, and only in few cases, did he consider the organism from the perspective of the form. Plato, on the contrary, when explaining the physical world, never got lost in a detailed examination.

3. Philosophical views

When trying to determine Proclus' profile as a philosopher, one has to keep in mind that Platonists were not keen on introducing new elements into the Platonic doctrine. They despised innovation (kainotomia). Yet it cannot be denied that Neoplatonic philosophy differs considerably from what we read in Plato's dialogues. There is also overwhelming evidence for continual discussions in the school on the right interpretation of Plato or on certain doctrinal points (such as the transcendence of the One, or the question whether the soul wholly descended from the intelligible world). In order to evaluate Proclus' originality, one ought to compare his views with those of the Neoplatonists before him, such as Plotinus, Porphyry, Iamblichus, and Syrianus. Only with regard to Plotinus is this possible to a great extent, because we still have the full corpus of Plotinus' writings. Proclus certainly admired the first ‘founder’ of the new Platonism and even devoted a commentary to the Enneads, of which, alas, we have only some fragments. He shared Plotinus' views on the three principal hypostases the One, the Intellect and the Soul, and often uses language inspired by his reading of Plotinus, as in his description of the union of the soul with the ineffable One. Yet on many points, he is very critical of Plotinus, pointing to contradictions, rejecting provocative views such as the thesis that One is cause of itself (causa sui), the doctrine of the undescended soul, or the identification of evil with matter. Another radical difference from Plotinus (and Porphyry) is the importance attributed to theurgy for the salvation of the soul and the authority of Chaldaean Oracles.

As said before, it is very difficult to mark off Proclus' originality with regard to his teacher Syrianus, the only predecessor he never criticizes. Of the literary production of the latter, we have only his Commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics. It is possible that most of Syrianus' courses on Plato never were published, but were continued and further worked out by Proclus himself. We have, however, the commentary on the Phaedrus by Hermeias, who was sitting together with Proclus, in Syrianus' course. One gets the impression that Syrianus was very interested in Orphic theogony, whereas for Proclus the Chaldaean Oracles are more authoritative when developing a Platonic theology. But here again, it is difficult to compare as we do not possess Proclus' own commentary. Is Proclus after all then not so original, but only an excellent teacher and wonderful systematizer of the new Platonic doctrines which became dominant in the school since Iamblichus on? We shall never know, and it is after all not so important when assessing the philosophical merits of his works. To praise Proclus' philosophical achievements, Marinus devotes in Life of Proclus one chapter to the discussion of the doctrines we owe to him (§ 23). Surprisingly, for all his admiration for the master, he can only enumerate a few innovative doctrines; and they are of such a minor importance that we shall not even discuss them in this article.

3.1 Metaphysics and Theology

In late antiquity, Aristotle's Metaphysics was considered to be a theological work, because Aristotle investigates in this treatise the first principles of all being.

This discipline may be called theology, because the principles of beings and the first and most perfect causes of things are what is most of all divine. (Asclepius, In Metaph. 4.1–3)

Proclus himself often uses the term ‘theology’ in this metaphysical sense for the study of the first (‘divine’) principles of all things. His Elements of Theology can in fact be considered an introduction to his metaphysics. The work is a concatenated demonstration of 217 propositions, which may be divided into two halves: the first 112 propositions establish the One, unity without any multiplicity, as the ultimate cause of reality and lay down basic metaphysical concepts/structures such as causality, participation, the relation of wholes to parts, infinity, and eternity. The second half deals with the three kinds of true causes within reality recognized by Proclus: gods (which he calls henads or “unities”, see below), intellects, and souls. This elaborate metaphysical framework makes it possible for Proclus to develop a scientific theology, i.e., a demonstration of the procession and properties of the different classes of gods. In what follows we will only discuss some characteristic features of Proclus' metaphysics (see further Steel 2011).

On the whole, Proclus’ doctrine of first principles is a further development of Plotinus' innovative interpretation of Platonic philosophy. With Plotinus, Proclus recognizes three fundamental levels of reality called ‘hypostases’ (or self-subsistent entities): One, Intellect, and Soul. However, following a concern of his predecessor Iamblichus for greater precision in the relationship and distinction between the One and Intellect, Proclus distinguishes between the intelligible Being (to noêton—what is the object of intellectual intuition) and the intellective (to noeron—what is intelligizing), and introduces between both, as an intermediary level, the noêton-noeron (what is being intelligized and intelligizing). These three ontological levels thus correspond to the triad of Being, Life, and Intellect, which already play an important role in Plotinus' and Porphyry's speculations about the procession or ‘emanation’ of the intelligible world from the One, without, however, being hypostasized. Since Zeller (influenced by Hegel) the application of the triadic structure to reality has been seen as the characteristic feature of Proclus' system, but see Dodds 19632, pp. xii and 220, on possible sources of the doctrine.

Although the distinction of aspects of reality as distinct hupostases and the multiplication of triads might suggest a loss of Plotinus’ intuition of the unity of reality, it is important to stress that each part of the triad of Being, Life and Intellect, mirrors within itself their triadic relationship. This redoubled triadic structure must be understood as expressing an intrinsic and essential relation between successive levels of being. The intimate relation between Being, Life, and Intellect is the origin of the basic structure uniting all causes to their effects, namely the relation of immanence, procession and reversion (monê-prohodos-epistrophê, see Elem. Theol. § 35). This triad has been called the “triad of triads,” the underlying principle of all triadic structures:

Every effect remains in its cause, proceeds from it, and reverts upon it. For if it should remain without procession or reversion, it would be without distinction from, and therefore identical with, its cause, since distinction implies procession. And if it should proceed without reversion or immanence [sc. in the cause], it would be without conjunction or sympathy with its cause, since it would have no communication with it. And if it should revert without immanence [sc. in the cause] or procession, how can that which has not received its being from the higher revert existentially upon a principle thus alien? [Elem. Theol. § 35, transl. E.R. Dodds]

Another fundamental triad is the triad Unparticipated-Participated-Participating (amethekton-metechomenon-metechon). Plato's theory of participation, which explains the relation between the intelligible world and the sensible reality it grounds, raised many problems, several of which Plato himself brings up in the first part of his Parmenides. Most pressing was the puzzle: How can a Form be at the same time one and the same and exist as a whole in many participants? (see Plato, Parmenides 131a-b). The basic idea of the triad of participation, which can also be seen as responding to Aristotle's criticism of participation, is to maintain the transcendence, and hence, the unity of the Form, while allowing for its presence in the participants. Thanks to the existence of an ‘unparticipated’ principle, that is, one that is not such as to be participated in by anything, to which the ‘participated’ entities, the ones that are participated in by something, are connected by means of “the triad of triads” (Elem. Theol. § 23), the universal nature of the Form can be safeguarded.

Proclus, however, also applies this principle to explain the most difficult problem facing Neoplatonic metaphysics, namely, how to understand the procession of the manifold from the One. How can the One be wholly without multiplicity, when it must somehow be the cause of any and all multiplicity? The One remains in itself absolutely unparticipated; the many different beings proceeding from it participate in a series of participated henads or unities (gods). According to some scholars it was Iamblichus who introduced this innovative doctrine, others attribute it to Proclus' teacher Syrianus. Even if the doctrine does not originate as such from Iamblichus himself, the existence of the divine henads somehow follows from his law of mean terms. This law states that “every producing cause brings into existence things like to itself before the unlike.“ (Elem. Theol. § 28). Thus there are no leaps in the chain of being, but everything is linked together by similar terms. The henads fulfill this function, for as participated unities they bridge the gap between the transcendent One and everything that comes after it. The doctrine of the henads can thus be seen as a way of integrating the traditional gods of Greek polytheistic religion into the Neoplatonic metaphysics of the One.

3.2 Causality

a. Auxiliary and true causes. From Middle Platonism onwards, various attempts were made to integrate the Aristotelian doctrine of causes within the Platonic philosophy (see Steel 2003). In Plato's work, it was argued, one can find the four types of causality that Aristotle distinguishes, to wit formal, material, efficient, final, and, besides, the paradigmatic cause, which Aristotle wrongly rejected. This system of causes (with the addition of the instrumental cause as a sixth) became standard in later Neoplatonism. In his commentary on the Timaeus, Proclus observes that Aristotle never rises to the proper level of causality. For the four causes, as Aristotle understands them, can only be applied to the explanation of processes in the sublunary world. In the Platonic view, however, the material and formal causes are only subservient or instrumental causes. Those causes are in fact immanent in their effects and constitutive elements of the thing they produce. As Proclus asserts in prop. 75 of the Elements of Theology, “that which exists in the effect is not so much a cause as an auxiliary cause (sunaition) or an instrument of the producer.” Causes in the proper sense must act upon their effects from outside, while transcending them. For a proper understanding of what the true causes are of all things, Proclus argues, one must follow Plato, who lifts us up to the level of the transcendent Forms and makes us discover the creative causality of the demiurge and the finality of the Good as the ultimate explanation of all aspirations.

Although Aristotle also discusses efficient and final causes, he falls short of a true understanding of creative causality because he abandons the hypothesis of the Forms. Without the transcendent Forms, there can be no explanation of the being of things, only an explanation of their movement and change. Given Aristotle's narrow understanding of nature, it must come as no surprise, Proclus notices, that he admits of cases of ‘spontaneous generation’ in the sublunary realm, which again restricts the purport of efficient causality. Moreover, because of his rejection of the demiurge (and of the One), Aristotle is also forced to limit efficient causality to the sublunary realm. In fact, in his view there is no cause of existence of the celestial bodies or of the sensible world as a whole: they exist necessarily in all eternity. But, as Proclus argues, such a position will force him to admit that the world has the capacity to constitute itself, which is absurd (see below).

The Neoplatonic concept of causality is therefore quite different from that of the Peripatetics, even if both share the same terminology, such as final or efficient cause. Aristotle's causes are primarily intended to explain how things move and change, come to be and cease to be, but also offer to explain what given things are. For the Neoplatonists, generalizing a principle formulated in the Philebus — “that everything that comes to be comes to be through a cause” (26e, cf. Tim. 28a) — causality is of much wider application than the explanation of change and motion, it is not only about what things are, but about what constitutes (hupostatikos) their being, and it can be, analogously, used to explain relations between all levels of being. Thus we can say of the One that it is the cause of Intellect, and of Intellect that it is cause of Soul. In the Timaeus, however, the main interest is to understand what is the cause of the sensible world and all the cosmic beings: this is primarily the demiurge or creator of the world (the One is not the ‘creator’ of Intellect).

b. Corporeal and incorporeal causes. According to the Stoics only bodies and powers or qualities of bodies are capable of acting and being acted upon (see Steel 2002). The Platonists often criticized the Stoic view and pointed to what they thought were the many contradictions involved, in particular, in the materialistic explanation of psychic activities or dispositions such as virtues. They defended the opposite view: all forms of causality must ultimately be explained as emanating from incorporeal entities. Proclus adopts Plotinus' view (IV, 7 [2] 8a), that only incorporeal beings can be causes in the strict sense, and includes it among the basic theorems of his metaphysics. See Elem. Theol. § 80 (cf. Theol. Plat. I 14, p. 61.23–62.1):

Every body has by its own nature the capacity to be acted upon, every incorporeal thing the capacity to act, the former being in itself inactive, the latter impassive; but through association with the body, the incorporeal too is acted upon, just as bodies too can act because of the participation in incorporeal entities.

In this proposition Proclus first sets apart the corporeal and incorporeal as being active/impassible and passive/inactive respectively. However, the two realms are not absolutely separate from each other. The soul, which is an incorporeal substance, enters into association with the body and thus becomes itself, though only accidentally, subject to different passions. The body, on the contrary, may gain great profit from the association with the incorporeal. This is evident in the case of animated bodies, which owe all their vital activities to the presence of the soul in them. But also inanimate natural bodies acquire all capacities and powers from nature and its inherent logoi or organizing rational principles (see Steel 2002).

c. The relation of cause to its effect. The relation between a cause and its effect is characterized by both similarity and dissimilarity. For every cause produces something that is similar to it, and every effect thus resembles its cause, though in a secondary and less perfect way. But in so far as the effect is really distinguished from its cause, it acquires its own characteristic form of being, which was not yet developed on the level of its cause. For this reason each thing can be said to exist in three manners (Elem. Theol. § 65). First, it is in itself as expressing formally its own character (kath’ hyparxin). Second, it exists in a causal manner (kat’ aitian) being anticipated in its cause. Finally, it exists as being participated (kata methexin) by the next level of being, which is its effect. Thus life is a property of a living organism as being participated by it. Life characterizes the soul formally. Life also exists qua Form in the divine mind. Finally, Proclus stresses that the higher a cause, the more comprehensive it is, and the further its effects reach (Elem. Theol. § 57). All things, including matter, which has in itself, apart from the forms existing in it, no ‘being’, participate in the One; all beings participate in Being; all plants and animals participate in Life; all rational souls participate in Intellect.

3.3 Psychology and Epistemology

Proclus' epistemology is firmly rooted in his theory of the soul. For Proclus, souls as self-moving principles represent the lowest level of entities that are capable of reverting upon itself (so called self-constituted beings [authypostata], see Elem. Theol. § 40–51). They are incorporeal, separable from bodies and indestructible/immortal (Elem. Theol. § 186–7). Yet, they are principles of life and of movement of bodies (Elem. Theol. § 188). In accordance with Proclus' general metaphysical principles (cf. above 3.1), from the unparticipated soul-monad proceed different kinds of participated soul: divine souls, daemonic souls, human souls, souls of animals). As with other Platonists, Proclus frequently discusses the vexed question as to why a soul would descend into a body at all (‘fall of the soul’) (see Dörrie / Baltes (2002.2) 163–218). Moreover, the Neoplatonist distinguishes between altogether three so-called vehicles (ochêmata) of the soul. The rational soul is permanently housed in the luminous vehicle, while the non-rational soul is located in the pneumatic vehicle. By being incarnated in a human body, soul, or rather, the vegetative soul attains thus a (third) ‘shell-like’ vehicle. The theory of the different vehicles or the psychic ‘astral body,’ familiar nowadays from modern theosophic theories, fulfils several crucial functions in Neoplatonic psychology: it explains (a) how an incorporeal soul can be linked to a body, (b) how souls can move in space, (c) how souls can be punished after death (cf. Plato's myths), (d) where certain faculties of the soul such as imagination are located. Proclus distinguishes between two kinds of vehicles, one mortal and the other immortal (In Tim. III 236.31 ff. and Elem. Theol. § 207–210). Proclus also adheres to the Platonic theory of transmigration, but argues that human souls never enter animal bodies as their constitutive forms. For only animal souls can be organizing principles of animal bodies. If some rational souls are ‘degraded’ in the next life and forced to live in an animal body because of their misdemeanour in this life, they are only ‘relationally’ (schesei) present to this animal body.

Proclus distinguishes between the following faculties of soul: sense perception, imagination (phantasia), opinion, discursive thought, and intellection. While sense perception and imagination belong to the non-rational soul, opinion forms the lowest level of rationality. The aim of epistemological ascent is to free oneself eventually from the lower psychic faculties, including the lower rational ones, in order to enjoy a state of pure contemplation.

As with many other Platonists, Proclus' epistemology is based on a theory of innate knowledge (in accordance with the Platonic dictum that ‘all learning is recollection [anamnêsis]’). Proclus refers to the innate contents of the soul as its reason-principles (logoi) or Forms (eidê). These innate reason-principles constitute the essence of soul. That is why they are called ‘essential reason-principles’ (logoi ousiôdeis) (Steel 1997). The traditional translation reason-principles was chosen on purpose, because on an ontological level these same logoi serve as principles of all things. They are extended or unfolded images of the Forms that exist in intellect; and by means of them the world-soul with the assistance of Nature brings forth everything. In other words, the psychic logoi are instantiations of Platonic Forms on the level of soul as are the logoi in Nature and the forms immanent in matter. According to the fundamental Neoplatonic axiom panta en pasin (‘all things are in all things’), Forms exist on all levels of reality. But the logoi in soul also offer the principles of all knowledge and are the starting points of demonstration. At In Parm. IV 894.3–18 (ed. Steel) Proclus argues that only with reference to these notions within the soul predication is possible (see Helmig 2008), since they are universal in the true sense of the word. On the other hand, both transcendent Platonic Forms and forms in matter are not taken to be universals proper by Proclus. The former are rather intelligible particulars, as it were, and cannot be defined (Steel 2004), while the latter are strictly speaking instantiated or individualised universals that are not shared by many particulars (see Helmig 2008, cf. above 3.1–2). For this reason, it does not make much sense to talk about ‘the problem of universals’ in Proclus.

It is another crucial assumption of Proclus' epistemology that all souls share the same logoi (Elem. Theol. § 194–195). In terms of concept-formation this entails that psychic concepts, once they are grasped correctly, are universal, objective, and shareable (see Helmig 2011). Moreover, if all souls share the same logoi, and these logoi are the principles of reality (see above), then by grasping the logoi souls come to know the true principles or causes of reality. Already Aristotle had written that to know something signifies to know its cause (Met. A 3, 983a25–26 and An. Post. I 2, 71b9–12). In his Commentary on Plato's Timaeus, Proclus introduces an interesting distinction. Taking his start from the problem of how we can recognise certain objects, he considers the example of an apple. The different senses tell us that there is something sweet, red, even, with a nice smell. And while common sense (koinê aisthêsis) can distinguish the different impressions of the special senses, only opinion (doxa) is capable of saying that the object there on the table is an apple. Doxa is able to do this, because it has access to the innate logoi of the soul. However, as Proclus explains (In Tim. I 248.11 ff.), opinion only knows the ‘that’ (hoti), that is, it can recognize objects. Discursive thought (dianoia), on the other hand, also knows the ‘why’ (dihoti), that is, the causes of something. This distinction can also be rephrased in terms of concepts, implying a distinction between factual concepts that allow us to identify or recognise certain objects, and concepts that fulfil an explanatory role. On the whole, Proclus' reading and systematisation of Plato's doctrine of learning as recollection makes Platonic recollection not only concerned with higher learning, since already on the level of object recognition we employ concepts that originate from the innate logoi of the soul (Helmig 2011).

Proclus argues at length that the human soul has to contain innate knowledge. Therefore, one should not consider it an empty writing tablet, as Aristotle does (Aristotle, De anima III 4). He is wrong in asserting that the soul contains all things potentially. According to Proclus, the soul contains all things (i.e., all logoi) in actuality, though due to the ‘shock of birth’ it may seem as if the soul has fallen to potentiality. At In Crat. § 61, Proclus asserts that the soul does not resemble an empty writing tablet (agraphon grammateion) and does not possess all things in potentiality, but in act. In Eucl. 16.8–13 expresses the same idea: “the soul is not a writing tablet void of logoi, but it is always written upon and always writing itself and being written on by the intellect.” As with his philosophy of mathematics, Proclus presents a detailed criticism of the view that universal concepts are derived from sensible objects (by abstraction, induction, or collection). In the fourth book of his Commentary on Plato's Parmenides and in the two prologues of the Commentary on Euclid we find the most comprehensive criticism of abstractionism in antiquity (see Helmig 2010 and 2011).

3.4 Ethics (Providence, fate, freedom of choice, evil)

Proclus devoted three entire books or ‘monographs’ (monobiblia) to problems of providence, fate, free choice, and evil. The first treatise (Ten problems concerning providence) examines ten different problems on providence that were commonly discussed in the Platonic school. For Proclus providence (pronoia) is the beneficent activity of the first principle (the ‘source of goods’) and the gods (henads), who have their existence before intellect (pro-nou). One of the problems discussed is the question of how divine foreknowledge and human free choice can be reconciled. For if god knows not only past and present, but also future events, the outcome of future events is already pre-determined (as god has a determinate knowledge of all things), and hence there is no free choice for humans. Proclus' answer, which ultimately goes back to Iamblichus, consists in applying the principle that the mode of knowledge is not conditioned by the object known but by the knower. In the case of gods, this entails that they know the contingent event in a non contingent manner, the mutable immutably. They have an undivided knowledge of things divided and a timeless knowledge of things temporal (Elem. Theol. § 124, cf. De decem dub. § 6–8). Proclus' answer was later taken up by Ammonius in his Commentary on the De Interpretatione IX and in Boethius' Consolation of Philosophy V 6 as well as in his Commentary on the De Interpretatione IX.

The second treatise (On providence fate and what depends on us) replies to a letter of Theodore, a former friend of Proclus. In this letter Theodore, an engineer, had defended with several arguments a radical determinism, thus entirely excluding free choice. Before refuting Theodore's arguments, Proclus introduces some fundamental distinctions in order to solve the problems raised by his old friend. The first distinction is between providence and fate:

Providence is essentially a god, whereas fate is something divine, but not a god. This is because it depends upon providence and is as it were an image of it. (De prov. § 14)

The second distinction is that between two types of soul: the rational soul is separable from the body, the irrational resides in the body is inseparable from its substrate; “the latter depends in its being upon fate, the former upon providence” (De prov. § 15 ff.). The third distinction concerns knowledge and truth:

One type of knowledge exists in souls that are bound to the process of generation; […] another type is present in souls that have escaped from this place. (De prov. § 3.1–4.3)

These three distinctions taken together make it possible for Proclus to ultimately reconcile providence, fate, and free choice. In so far as we are rational agents and let ourselves being determined in our choices only by intelligible principles, we may transcend the determinism of fate to which we belong as corporeal beings. Yet, our actions are integrated into the providential order, as we willingly obey the divine principles.

The third treatise (On the existence of evils) asks why and how evil can exist if the world is governed by divine providence. Proclus argues that evil does not have an existence of its own, but only a derivative or parasitic existence (par-hypostasis, sc. on the good) (De mal. § 50).

In order to exist in a proper sense, an effect must result from a cause which proceeds according to its nature towards a goal that is intended. […] Whenever an effect is produced that was not intended or is not related by nature or per se to the agent, it is said to exist besides (para) the intended effect, parasitically upon it, as it were. (Opsomer-Steel 2003, 25)

This is precisely the case with evils, which are shortcomings and mistakes. As a failure is never intended qua failure by an agent, but is an unfortunate by-effect of its action, so is evil qua evil never caused by a cause. Therefore, Proclus continues, it is better to call its mode of existence a parhupostasis, rather than a hupostasis, a term that belongs to those beings “that proceed from causes towards a goal.” Parhupostasis or “parasitic existence,” on the contrary, is the mode of existence of “beings that neither appear through causes in accordance with nature nor result in a definite end.”

Evils are not the outcome of goal-directed processes, but happen per accidens, as incidental by-products which fall outside the intention of the agents. […] Therefore it is appropriate to call such generation a parasitic existence (parhupostasis), in that it is without end and unintended, uncaused in a way (anaition pôs) and indefinite. (De mal. § 50.3–9, 29–31, transl. by Opsomer-Steel 2003)

Dionysius the Areopagite adopted Proclus' views on evil in his work On the Divine Names. Thanks to this adaptation Proclus' doctrine of evil had an enormous influence on the later medieval discussions on evil both in Byzantium and in the Latin West and dominated the philosophical debates on evil up to the 19th century.

3.5 Physics, Astronomy, and Mathematics

A theological physics

Although Proclus composed a short (presumably early) treatise where he summarises Aristotle's theory of movement (Elements of Physics), he does not understand Physics primarily as the study of movement and change of natural phenomena, but rather seeks to connect these phenomena to their intelligible and divine causes (Physics as a kind of Theology, In Tim. I 217.25). In the preface to his commentary on Plato's Timaeus Proclus sets out to prove why Plato's physics, as developed in the Timaeus, is superior to natural science in the Aristotelian sense (see Steel 2003). In Proclus' view Plato's Timaeus not only offers a physiologia, a science of nature in its many aspects, but also presents an explanation of the whole of nature by paying due attention to its incorporeal, divine causes: the natural world proceeds from the demiurge as the expression of an ideal paradigm and aims at the ultimate Good. Therefore, Plato's physio-logy is also a sort of theo-logy:

The purpose of Timaeus will be to consider the universe, insofar as it is produced by the gods. In fact, one may consider the world from different perspectives: insofar as it is corporeal or insofar as it participates in souls, both particular and universal, or insofar as it is endowed with intellect. But Timaeus will examine the nature of the universe not only along all those aspects, but in particular insofar as it proceeds from the demiurge. In that respect the physiology seems also to be a sort of theology, since also natural things have somehow a divine existence insofar as they are produced by the gods. (In Tim. I 217.18–27)

Before offering an explanation of the generation of the world, Timaeus sets out the fundamental principles that will govern his whole explanation of the physical world (Tim. 27d5–28b5). As Proclus observes, it is the task of a scientist to formulate at the start of his project the principles proper to the science in question, and not just to assume some general axioms. The science of nature too is based on specific axioms and assumptions, which must be clarified before we can move to the demonstration. In order to make phusiologia a real science, the philosopher must deduce his explanation, as does the geometer, from a set of fundamental propositions or axioms.

If I may say what I think, it seems to me that Plato proceeds here in the manner of the geometers, assuming before the demonstrations the definitions and hypotheses through which he will make his demonstrations, thus laying the foundations of the whole science of nature. (In Tim. I.217.18–27)

Starting from these fundamental propositions, Proclus argues, Plato deduces the different types of causality that are required for a truly scientific understanding of nature (efficient, exemplary, and final cause; see Steel 2003 and above 3.2).

Time and eternity

Proclus discusses eternity and time in his commentary on the Timaeus and in propositions 53–55 of the Elements of Theology (see Steel 2001). Aristotle had defined time as a “measure of movement according to the before and after.” Therefore, anything measured by time must have a form of existence or activity in which a past and a future state can be distinguished. In fact, an entity in time is never wholly and simultaneously what it is, but has an existence extended in a process of before and after. Opposed to it stands the eternal, which exists as a simultaneous whole and admits of no composition or change. “There is no part of it,” writes Proclus, “which has already subsisted and another that will subsist later, but as yet is not. All that it is capable of being, already possesses it in entirety without losing it or without accumulating” (Elem. Theol. § 52). One must distinguish the temporality of things in process from the time by which they are measured. Temporal things participate in time, without being time. “Time exists prior to all things in time” (Elem. Theol. § 53).

With Iamblichus, Proclus distinguishes absolute time, which is not participated in and exists ‘prior’ to all temporal things, from participated time, or rather the many participated times. The same distinctions must also be made regarding eternity. For Eternity precedes as cause and measures the multiple eternal beings that participate in it. “Every Eternity is a measure of things eternal, every Time of things in time; and these two are the only measures of life and movement in things” (Elem. Theol. § 54). To conclude, there are two measures of the duration of things. First there is eternity, which measures at once the whole duration of a being. Second, there is time, which measures piecemeal the extension of a being that continually passes from one state to another. Eternity can be seen as the prefiguration of time; time as the image of eternity. Each of them governs a separate sphere of reality, eternity the intelligible being, time the temporal (corporeal and psychic) world of change.

Notwithstanding the sharp distinction between the temporal and the eternal realm, there are beings that share in both eternity and time. As Proclus notes in the corollary to Elem. Theol. § 55, “of the things which exist in time, some have a perpetual duration.” Thus the universe as a whole and the celestial spheres in it are both eternal and temporal. They are eternal because they never come to existence in time and never will cease to exist. But they are temporal because they possess their being only through a process of change in a sequence of moments. The same holds true for the psychic realm: all souls are immortal and indestructible; nevertheless, they are continually undergoing change. Therefore, as Proclus says, “‘perpetuity’ (aidiotês) is of two kinds, the one eternal (aiônion), the other in time; […] the one having its being concentrated in a simultaneous whole, the other diffused and unfolded in temporal extension (paratasis); the one entire in itself, the other composed of parts, each of which exists separately in a sequence of prior and posterior.” (Elem. Theol. § 55, trans. Dodds, modified).

The eternity of the world

Against Aristotle's critique in De Caelo I 10, Proclus defends the view that the cosmos is “both eternal and generated (genêtos).” As a corporeal being, the universe cannot produce itself and maintain itself in being. It depends for its existence upon a superior cause, and it is for that reason “generated.” This does not prevent it, however, from existing for ever, in an infinite time. As we just saw, Proclus distinguishes between what is eternal in an absolute sense (the intelligible realm) and what is eternal because it continues to exist for the whole of time, what Boethius later called “aevum” in distinction from “aeternum.” As Proclus notices, at the end of the Physics (8.10, 266a27–28), Aristotle himself establishes that no body can possess from itself an unlimited power to exist. If the world exists eternally, it must have this power from an incorporeal principle. Therefore, Aristotle too is forced to admit that the world is somehow generated, though it continues to exist for eternity. For it always receives from its cause its infinite power and never possesses it at once as a whole, because it is limited. The world is eternal, because it has an infinite power of coming to be, not because it exists of infinite power (In Tim. I 252.11–254.18).

This disagreement between Plato and Aristotle is ultimately due to a different view about the first principles of all things. Aristotle denies the existence of Platonic Forms and therefore cannot admit an efficient or creative cause of the universe in the true sense of the word. Efficient causality only concerns the sublunary world. The celestial bodies and the world as a whole have no efficient cause of their being, but only a final cause. From this misunderstanding about the first principles follow all the other views that distinguish Aristotle from Plato. One gets the impression, Proclus says, that Aristotle, because he could not grasp the first principle of all things - the One – has always to find an explanation of things on a lower level:

Whatever Plato attributes to the One, Aristotle attributes to the intellect: that it is without multiplicity, that it is object of desire, that it does not think of secondary things. Whatever Plato attributes to the demiurgic intellect, Aristotle attributes to the heaven and the celestial gods. For, in his view, creation and providence come from them. Whatever Plato attributes to the substance of heavens [sc. time], Aristotle attributes to their circular motion. In all these issues he departs from the theological principles and dwells upon the physical explanations beyond what is needed. (In Tim. I 295.20–27)

The celestial bodies and the place of the universe

Related to the eternity of the world is the question of the nature of the celestial bodies. Aristotle argues in De Caelo I 2 that the celestial bodies, which move with a natural circular motion, must be made of a simple substance different from the four sublunary simple bodies (whose natural movements are in a straight line: up or down). This ‘fifth element,’ which is by nature imperishable, is the ether. With this explanation Aristotle seems to oppose the view Plato defends in Timaeus where it is said that the Demiurge made the divine celestial bodies “mostly out of fire” (40a2–4). Proclus admits that the heaven is composed out of the four elements with a preponderance of fire, but he insists that the elements are not present in the celestial bodies in the same mode as they exist in the sublunary bodies. Therefore Aristotle is right when he considers the heavens to constitute a fifth nature besides the four elements. “For in the heavens the elements are not the same as they are here, but are rather the summits of them” (In Tim. II 49.27–29). If one counts the whole heaven composed out of the best of the elements as one nature and adds to it the four sublunary elements, we may speak of five natures altogether.

Contrary to Aristotle, Proclus argues that the whole universe (to pan) is in a place (topos). He can do this because his conception of place differs in many respects from Aristotle's own. The latter defined place as “the unmoved limit of the surrounding body” (Physics IV 4, 212a21–22). From this it follows as a necessary corollary that the universe as a whole cannot be in a place, because there is simply nothing outside it. Aristotle's definition, as we learn from Simplicius' and Philoponus' Corollary on Place, had been criticized by all later Neoplatonists (Syrianus, Proclus, Damascius, Simplicius, and Philoponus). It is notable that Proclus' own theory of place, as reported by Simplicius, differs considerably from other Neoplatonic theories in that he considered place an immaterial ‘body’, namely a special kind of immobile light. As emerges from Proclus' Commentary on Plato's Republic, his theory took inspiration from the column of light mentioned at Republic X, 616b.


Since the heavenly bodies were considered divine, because they are eternal and living beings, the study of the heavens was of special importance to Neoplatonists. In the preface to his treatise On Astronomical Hypotheses (a summary and evaluation of astronomical views of his time), Proclus makes it clear that his approach is based on Plato's remarks on astronomy (especially in the Republic and in the Laws). He feels the need to go through the different theories, because one can observe a great disagreement among ancient astronomers on how to explain the different phenomena (Hyp. I § 33). Fundamental to Proclus' approach is the distinction between two kinds of astronomy (Hyp. I § 1–3). The first kind contents itself with observing the heavenly phenomena and formulating mathematical hypotheses to explain them and make calculations and prognostics possible. This is the astronomy as practiced by the most famous astronomers before Proclus' time (Aristarchus, Hipparchus, and Ptolemy). The second, which is developed by Plato in the Timaeus, and is confirmed by the tradition of the “Chaldaeans and Egyptians,” investigates into the intelligible causes of heavenly movements. An example for this approach can be found in his Commentary on Plato's Republic (In Remp. II 227.23–235.3). There, Proclus explains that the seemingly irregular movements of the planets ought not to be explained by means of Ptolemy's complicated theory of excentric spheres and epicycles, but are rather due to the fact that the planets are moved by intelligent souls which express in the movements of their bodies “the invisible powers of the Forms” (232.1–4). Yet Proclus appreciates Ptolemy's astronomy as long as it is seen only as a mathematical-mechanical construction making it possible to calculate and predict the positions of planets, and as long as it does not claim to have any real explanatory value. For the history of astronomy Proclus' Astronomical Hypotheses remains a most valuable document, since it represents one of the best introductions to Ptolemy's Almagest extant from antiquity and since it explains the most important ancient astronomical theories, in order finally (in chapter seven of the work) to evaluate them critically. Proclus' arguments also played an important role in the scientific discussion of the Ptolemaic hypotheses in the 16th and 17th century.


Proclus' distinctively non-empirical approach towards physics and astronomy also influences his philosophy of mathematics, which is set out in the two prologues to his commentary on the first book of Euclid's Elements. The first prologue deals with the mathematical sciences in general, while the second prologue focuses on geometry proper. Proclus argues in great detail that the objects of mathematical sciences cannot be derived from sensible particulars by means of abstraction. Because of the imperfect and deficient character of the sensible objects one cannot derive from them objects that are as perfect and as precise as mathematical objects are. Therefore, mathematical objects reside primarily in intellect and secondarily in souls (as logoi). As universal concepts (cf. 3.2) we can grasp mathematical objects by means of recollection (anamnêsis). Since geometrical objects are not universal, but particulars, and since by definition they possess extension, Proclus argues that their place is human imagination (phantasia). Imagination acts as a mirror and provides the mathematical objects which are projected into it by the soul with intelligible matter. By means of the latter geometrical objects gain extension and particularity. As with physics and astronomy, the ultimate aim of geometry is not the study of these extended, material objects. Rather, geometry serves an anagogical task (just as in Plato's Republic), leading the soul upwards to a study of the true and unextended causes of geometrical objects in the divine mind (In Eucl. 54.14–56.22).

3.6 Theurgy

Relying on Plato, Theaetetus 176a-b late Platonists saw the assimilation to god (homoiôsis theôi) as the goal (telos) of philosophy. Proclus was faithful to this ideal, as is attested by his biographer Marinus (Life of Proclus § 25). There was a fundamental discussion in late Neoplatonism on how this assimilation to the divine was possible for humans. Damascius (In Phaed. I § 172 Westerink) distinguishes two tendencies: Plotinus and Porphyry preferred philosophy, which makes us understand the divine principles of reality through rational explication, while others like Iamblichus and his followers, Syrianus, and Proclus, gave priority to hieratic practice or theurgy (theourgia, hieratikê [sc. technê]). Their different evaluation of respectively theory and theurgy as means of salvation may be explained by their different views on the human soul and its possibilities of ascent to the divine realm. While Plotinus and Porphyry claimed that the superior part of the human soul always remains within the intelligible realm, in touch with the divine principles, and never completely descends into the body, Iamblichus, followed by Proclus, criticised such a view. The soul does indeed wholly descend into the body (Steel 1976, 34–51). Hence the importance of theurgic rites established by the gods themselves, to make it possible for the human soul to overcome the distance between the mortal and the divine, which cannot be done through increasing philosophical understanding. In Theol. Plat. I 25, Proclus expresses his great admiration for the power of theurgy, which surpasses all human knowledge.

Allegedly, Neoplatonic theurgy originated with Julian the theurgist, who lived in the time of emperor Marcus Aurelius. At first sight, theurgy seems to share many characteristics with magic (theory of cosmic sympathy, invocations, animation of statues of gods and demons), but it is, as far as we can judge from the extant sources, clearly different from it. In his De Mysteriis Iamblichus developed a theology of the hieratic rituals from Platonic principles, which clearly sets them apart from the vulgar magical practices. While magic assumes that the gods can be rendered subservient to the magicians, Platonic philosophers consider this impossible. According to Plato's principles of theology (Republic II and Laws X), the gods are immutable, unchangeable, and cannot be bribed by means of sacrifices. Proclus' views on theurgy (of which only some fragments belonging to his treatise On Hieratic Art [i.e., theurgy] survived) are fully in line with these fundamental Platonic axioms. But how, then, does theurgy work? The theurgists take up an old belief, shared also by many philosophers, namely the natural and cosmic ‘sympathy’ (sumpatheia) pervading all reality. As with an organism, all parts of reality are somehow linked together as one. Another way of expressing this idea is in the Neoplatonic principle, going back at least to Iamblichus, that everything is in everything (panta en pasin). According to Proclus, all reality, including its most inferior level, matter, is directed upwards towards the origin from which it proceeds. To say it in the words of Theodorus of Asine, whom Proclus quotes in his Commentary on the Timaeus (I 213.2–3): “All things pray except the First.”

As stated before (cf. 3.3), the human soul contains the principles (logoi) of all reality within itself. The soul carries, however, also sumbola or sunthêmata which correspond to the divine principles of reality. The same symbols also establish the secret correspondences between sensible things (stones, plants, and animals) and celestial and divine realities. Thanks to these symbols, things on different levels (stones, plants, animals, souls) are linked in a ‘chain’ (seira) to the divine principle on which they depend, as the chain of the sun and the many solar beings, or the chain of the moon. Of great importance in the rituals was also the evocation of the secret divine names. In his Commentary on the Cratylus, Proclus compares divine names to statues of the gods used in theurgy (In Crat. § 46), pointing to the fact that also language is an important means in the ascent to the divine.

Proclus evokes the Platonic background of his theurgical beliefs, namely his theory of love (erôs) as expressed in the Symposium and the Phaedrus, in his treatise On Hieratic Art:

Just as lovers move on from the beauty perceived by the senses until they reach the sole cause of all beautiful and intelligible beings, so too, the theurgists (hieratikoi), starting with the sympathy connecting visible things both to one another and to the invisible powers, and having understood that all things are to be found in all things, established the hieratic science. (trans. Ronan, modified)

In the wake of an article of Anne Sheppard (1982), scholars usually distinguish between three kinds of theurgy in Proclus. The first kind, as described in the above quoted treatise On Hieratic Art, was mainly concerned with animating statues (in order to obtain oracles or to evoke divine apparitions) or, in general, with activities related to physical phenomena or human affairs (influencing the weather, healing illnesses etc.) (see Life of Proclus § 28–29). As emerges from our sources, it is this kind of theurgy that involved much ritualistic practice, including hymns and prayers. The second kind of theurgy makes the soul capable of ascending up to the level of the hypercosmic gods and the divine intellect. This second kind too operates by means of prayers and invocations and it seems especially characteristic of Proclus' Hymns. And finally, the third kind of theurgy establishes unity with the first principles, that is the One itself. This third kind corresponds to the level of the highest virtues (i.e., ‘theurgic virtues’) in the scale of virtues. It is not clear whether some form of ritual is involved here at all. For this last stage of the Platonic homoiôsis theôi the following elements are of major importance: negative theology (culminating in the negation of the negation), mystic silence and the intriguing notion of faith (pistis), which thus enters with a non-Platonic meaning - though even for the latter notion Proclus will search for confirmation in the Platonic dialogues.

Those who hasten to be conjoined with the Good, do no longer need knowledge and activity, but need to be established and a stable state and quietness. What then is it which unites us to the Good? What is it which causes in us a cessation of activity and motion? What is it which establishes all divine natures in the first and ineffable unity of goodness? […] It is, in short, the faith (pistis) of the Gods, which ineffably unites all the classes of Gods, of daemons, and of blessed souls to the Good. For we should investigate the Good not through knowledge (gnôstikôs) and in an imperfect manner, but giving ourselves up to the divine light, and closing the eyes, to become thus established in the unknown and occult unity of beings. For such a kind of faith is more venerable than cognitive activity, not in us only, but with the Gods themselves. (Proclus, Platonic Theology, I 25, trans. Th. Taylor, modified).

4. Influence

In his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, in the chapter on Alexandrian Philosophy, Hegel said that “in Proclus we have the culminating point of the Neo-Platonic philosophy; this method in philosophy is carried into later times, continuing even through the whole of the Middle Ages. […] Although the Neo-Platonic school ceased to exist outwardly, ideas of the Neo-Platonists, and specially the philosophy of Proclus, were long maintained and preserved in the Church.”

That Proclus, who set up his elaborate Platonic Theology in an attempt to rationally justify a pagan religious tradition whose existence was threatened by the upcoming Christian civilization, would have had such an influence in Christian medieval thought might seem surprising. His influence, however, is mainly indirect, as his ideas circulated under the names of other philosophers. There was, of course, a direct confrontation with the works of Proclus in the later Neoplatonic school (via Damascius and Ammonius, 5th-6th cc) and in Byzantium. In the 11th century, Michael Psellus studied Proclus intensively and even preserved fragments of his lost works. One of his disciples was the Georgian Ioanne Petritsi, who translated Proclus' Elements into Georgian and composed a commentary on it (Gigineishvili 2007). In the 12th century, bishop Nicolaus of Methone wrote a Christian reply to Proclus' Elements, thus showing indirectly that the work was still attracting interest. Moreover, Isaac Sebastocrator (11–12th century) produced a Christian adaption of the Tria opuscula. Around 1300 Proclus attracted the interest of the philosopher George Pachymeres, who prepared an edition of Proclus' Commentary on the Parmenides, which was only preserved in a very corrupt tradition, and even composed a commentary to the last part of the dialogue where Proclus' commentary was lacking. Cardinal Bessarion was an attentive reader of Proclus' works and possessed several manuscripts. We owe to the interest of scholars such as Psellus, Pachymeres, and Bessarion, the preservation of the work of the pagan Proclus, who had not such a good reputation in theological circles in Byzantium. And yet, the number of direct readers of Proclus before the Renaissance was very limited.

During the Middle Ages Proclus' influence was mainly indirect, above all through the writings of the Christian author Dionysius the Areopagite and the Arabic Liber de causis. Dionysius was a Christian author writing around 500, who was deeply fascinated by Proclus. He fully exploited Proclus' works – which he must have read intensively — to develop his own original Christian Platonic theology. He presented himself as a disciple of Saint Paul, a pretence which was generally accepted until the late 19th century, thus giving his works, and indirectly Proclus' theology, an almost apostolic authority. As Dodds ²1969, xxviii, has nicely put it: “Proclus was […] conquering Europe in the guise of an early Christian.” The well known Book of Causes is an Arabic adaption of the Elements of Theology, made in the 9th century. Translated in the 12th century, the Liber de causis circulated in the Middle Ages under the name of Aristotle, and was considered as a complement to the Metaphysics, offering a treatise on the divine causes. The text entered the corpus of Aristotelian works and was intensively studied and commented at the universities. Thomas Aquinas is the first to have discovered that this work derived in fact from Proclus' Elements of Theology, of which he had obtained a Latin translation made by his Dominican confrere William of Moerbeke in 1268 (see Thomas Aquinas, Commentary on the Liber de causis, introduction). Moerbeke also translated the Tria opuscula and the huge commentary on the Parmenides, but these works had almost no readers in the Middle Ages. Berthold of Moosburg wrote in the 14th century a comprehensive commentary on the Latin Elements of Theology . The real rediscovery of Proclus started in the Italian Renaissance, mainly thanks to Marsilio Ficino who followed Proclus' influence in his Platonic commentaries and even composed, in imitation of Proclus, a Christian Platonic Theology on the immortality of the soul. Before Ficino, Nicolaus Cusanus had already intensively studied Proclus in translations. Proclus continued to enjoy wide interest at the turn of the 18th century. Thomas Taylor (1758–1835) translated all of Proclus' works into English (reprinted by the Prometheus Trust [London]) and tried to reconstruct the lost seventh book of the Platonic Theology. Victor Cousin (1792–1867) aimed at a complete edition of his preserved work. At the beginning of the 20th century we have the great editions of commentaries in the Teubner collection. Renewed philosophical interest in Proclus in the last century started with the edition of the Elements of Theology by Eric Robertson Dodds, and carried on with the edition of the Platonic Theology by Henry Dominique Saffrey, Leendert Gerrit Westerink and, not least, in Germany with the works of Werner Beierwaltes.

Lists of Proclus' works are available in the two supplements on

Proclus' main extant works


Proclus' complete works (extant, lost, and spurious).


Proclus' Main Extant Works (editions and translations)

1. Elements of Theology

2. Platonic Theology

3.-5. Tria opuscula (Latin)

3. Ten Problems Concerning Providence

4. On Providence, Fate and What Depends on Us

5. On the Existence of Evils

6. Commentary on Plato's Alcibiades (up to 116b)

7. Commentary on Plato's Cratylus (up to 407c)

8. Commentary on Plato's Timaeus (up to 44d)

9. Commentary on Plato's Parmenides (up to 142a)

10. Commentary on Plato's Republic (in different essays)

11. Elements of Physics

12. Commentary on Euclid's Elements, Book I

13. Exposition of Astronomical Hypotheses

14. (frag.) On the Eternity of the World, against the Christians (18 arguments)

15. (frag.) Commentary on Hesiod, Works and Days

16. Hymns

17. Life of Proclus


Introductions and collected volumes (in chronological order)

Scholarly works

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Related Entries

Ammonius | Damascius | Neoplatonism | Plotinus | Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite | Syrianus


The authors would like to thank Radek Chlup (Prague), Antonio Luis Costa Vargas (Berlin), and Sabrina Lange (Berlin) for comments.