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Political Legitimacy

First published Thu Apr 29, 2010

Political legitimacy is a virtue of political institutions and of the decisions—about laws, policies, and candidates for political office—made within them. This entry will survey the main answers that have been given to the following questions. First, how should legitimacy be defined? Is it primarily a descriptive or a normative concept? If legitimacy is understood normatively, what does it entail? Some associate legitimacy with the justification of coercive power and with the creation of political authority. Others associate it with the justification, or at least the sanctioning, of existing political authority. Authority stands for a right to rule—a right to issue commands and, possibly, to enforce these commands using coercive power. An additional question is whether legitimate political authority is understood to entail political obligations or not. Most people probably think it does. But some think that the moral obligation to obey political authority can be separated from an account of legitimate authority, or at least that such obligations arise only if further conditions hold.

Next there are questions about the requirements of legitimacy. When are political institutions and the decisions made within them appropriately called legitimate? Some have argued that this question has to be answered primarily on the basis of procedural features that shape these institutions and underlie the decisions made. Others argue that legitimacy depends—exclusively or at least in part—on the substantive values that are realized. A related question is: does political legitimacy demand democracy or not? This question is intensely debated both in the national and the global context. Insofar as democracy is seen as necessary for political legitimacy, when are democratic decisions legitimate? Can that question be answered with reference to procedural features only, or does democratic legitimacy depend both on procedural values and on the quality of the decisions made? Finally, there is the question which political institutions are subject to the legitimacy requirement. Historically, legitimacy was associated with the state and institutions and decisions within the state. The contemporary literature tends to judge this as too narrow, however. This raises the question how the concept of legitimacy may apply—beyond the nation state and decisions made within it—to the international and global context.

1. Descriptive and Normative Concepts of Legitimacy

If legitimacy is interpreted descriptively, it refers to people's beliefs about political authority and, sometimes, political obligations. In his sociology, Max Weber put forward a very influential account of legitimacy that excludes any recourse to normative criteria (Mommsen 1989: 20). According to Weber, that a political regime is legitimate means that its participants have certain beliefs or faith (“Legitimitätsglaube”) in regard to it: “the basis of every system of authority, and correspondingly of every kind of willingness to obey, is a belief, a belief by virtue of which persons exercising authority are lent prestige” (Weber 1964: 382). As is well known, Weber distinguishes among three main sources of legitimacy—understood as both the acceptance of authority and of the need to obey its commands. People may have faith in a particular political or social order because it has been there for a long time (tradition), because they have faith in the rulers (charisma), or because they trust its legality—specifically the rationality of the rule of law (Weber 1990 [1918]; 1964). Weber identifies legitimacy as an important explanatory category for social science, because faith in a particular social order produces social regularities that are more stable than those that result from the pursuit of self-interest or from habitual rule-following (Weber 1964: 124).

In contrast to Weber's descriptive concept, the normative concept of political legitimacy refers to some benchmark of acceptability or justification of political power or authority and—possibly—obligation. On the broadest view, legitimacy both explains why the use of political power by a particular body—a state, a government, or a democratic collective, for example—is permissible and why there is a pro tanto moral duty to obey its commands. On this view, if the conditions for legitimacy are not met, political institutions exercise power unjustifiably and the commands they might produce do then not entail any obligation to obey. John Rawls, in Political Liberalism (1993), presents such an interpretation of legitimacy.

On one widely held narrower view, legitimacy is linked to the moral justification—not the creation—of political authority. Political bodies such as states may be effective, or de facto, authorities, without being legitimate. They claim the right to rule and to create obligations to be obeyed, and as long as these claims are met with sufficient acquiescence, they are authoritative. Legitimate authority, on this view, differs from merely effective or de facto authority in that it actually holds the right to rule and creates political obligations (e.g. Raz 1986). According to an opposing view (e.g. Simmons 2001), political authority may be morally justified without being legitimate, but only legitimate authority generates political obligations.

On another often held narrow view, even legitimate authority is not sufficient to create political obligations. The thought is that a political authority (such as a state) may be permitted to issue commands that citizens are not obligated to obey (Dworkin 1986: 191). Based on a view of this sort, some have argued that legitimate authority only gives rise to political obligations if additional normative conditions are satisfied (e.g. Wellman 1996; Edmundson 1998; Buchanan 2002).

There is sometimes a tendency in the literature to equate the normative concept of legitimacy with justice. Some explicitly define legitimacy as a criterion of minimal justice (e.g. Hampton 1998; Buchanan 2002). Unfortunately, there is sometimes also a tendency to blur the distinction between the two concepts, and a lot of confusion arises from that. Someone might claim, for example, that while political authorities such as states are often unjust, only a just state is morally acceptable and legitimate in this sense. Rawls (1993, 1995) offers an account of how the two concepts come apart. In his view, while justice and legitimacy are related—draw on the same set of political values—legitimacy makes weaker demands than justice. That is to say, political institutions may be unjust but legitimate. One way to understand this is the following. Because legitimacy relates primarily to political institutions, it is satisfied more easily than justice, which relates to the full set of social and economic institutions.

Having distinguished between descriptive and normative concepts of legitimacy, we should note that some authors have argued for a concept of legitimacy that combines descriptive and normative elements (Habermas 1979, Beetham 1991). They criticize the usefulness of the descriptive concept as defined by Weber for neglecting people's second order beliefs about legitimacy—their beliefs, not just about the actual legitimacy of a particular political institution, but about the justifiability of this institution, i.e. about what is necessary for legitimacy. According to Beetham, a “power relationship is not legitimate because people believe in its legitimacy, but because it can be justified in terms of their beliefs” (Beetham 1991: 11). They also criticize the strictly normative concept for being of only limited use in understanding actual processes of legitimation. The charge is that philosophers tend to focus on the general conditions necessary for the justification of political institutions, but neglect the historical actualization of the justificatory process. In Jürgen Habermas' words (Habermas 1979: 205): “Every general theory of justification remains peculiarly abstract in relation to the historical forms of legitimate domination. … Is there an alternative to this historical injustice of general theories, on the one hand, and the standardlessness of mere historical understanding, on the other?”

The sharp distinction between descriptive and normative concepts of legitimacy is also undermined by the fact that we find normative uses of the concept in social science and descriptive uses in moral, political and legal philosophy. There are many normative theorists who work—explicitly or implicitly—with a descriptive concept of legitimacy. This tendency is mostly found in authors who take political authority to be a fundamental normative concept. In the resulting hybrid view, the difference between effective or de facto authority and legitimate authority depends on whether or not authority is accepted—not on whether it ought to be accepted (e.g. Simmons 2001).

2. The Function of Political Legitimacy

This section lays out the different ways in which legitimacy, understood normatively, can be seen as relating to political authority and political obligations.

2.1. Legitimacy and the Justification of Political Authority

The normative concept of political legitimacy is often seen as related to the justification of authority. To make sense of this interpretation of legitimacy, authority must be understood as a distinct concept. This view implies that effective or de facto authority can exist without being legitimate.

John Locke put forward such an interpretation of legitimacy. Locke's starting-point is a state of nature in which all individuals are equally free in the sense that they possess equal political authority. As Rawls (2007: 129) characterizes Locke's understanding of the state of nature, it is “a state of equal right, all being kings.” Natural law, while manifest in the state of nature, is not sufficiently specific to rule a society and cannot enforce itself when violated. The solution to this problem is a social contract that transfers political authority to a civil state that can realize and secure the natural law. According to Locke, and contrary to his predecessor Thomas Hobbes, the social contract thus does not create authority. Political authority is embodied in individuals and pre-exists in the state of nature. The social contract transfers the authority they each enjoy in the state of nature to a particular political body.

While political authority thus pre-exists in the state of nature, legitimacy is a concept that is specific to the civil state. Because the criterion of legitimacy that Locke proposes is historical, however, what counts as legitimate authority remains connected to the state of nature. The legitimacy of political authority in the civil state depends, according to Locke, on whether the transfer of authority has happened in the right way. Specifically, it depends on individuals' consent: “no one can be put out of this estate and subjected to the political power of another without his own consent” (Locke 1980: 52). Anyone who has given their express or tacit consent to the social contract is bound to obey a state's laws (Locke 1980: 63). Locke understands the consent criterion to apply not just to the original institutionalization of a political authority—what Rawls (2007: 124) calls “originating consent”. It also applies to the ongoing evaluation of the performance of a political regime—Rawls (2007: 124) calls this “joining consent”. Note that while originating consent is necessarily express, joining consent may be tacit or express.

This criterion of legitimacy is negative: it offers an account of when effective authority ceases to be legitimate. According to this account, whether an actual political regime is legitimate turns on whether it respects the constraints of the natural law. When a political authority oversteps the boundaries of the natural law, it ceases to be legitimate and, therefore, there is no longer an obligation to obey its commands. For Locke—unlike for Hobbes—political authority is thus not absolute. In fact, absolute political authority is necessarily illegitimate because it suspends the natural law.

The contemporary literature has developed Locke's ideas in several ways. John Simmons (2001) draws a distinction between the moral justification of the state—its political authority—and the political legitimacy of a particular, historically realized, state and its commands. According to Simmons, the state's authority depends on its moral defensibility. It has to be shown successfully that having a state is morally better than not having a state (Simmons 2001: 125). A political authority thus justified is, according to Simmons, necessary but not sufficient for political legitimacy, and hence for generating obligations. Whether or not one has an obligation to obey the state's specific commands depends on one's actual consent (Simmons 2001: 137).

Simmons explicitly defends this Lockean view against Kantian and Rawlsian alternatives. He argues that the latter mistakenly blur the distinction between establishing the legitimacy of the authority of a particular state and establishing that its political authority is morally justified. I shall discuss a possible response to this objection below (in section 2.2.). The response is based on an interpretation of political legitimacy as the justification of coercive power and as what creates political authority. It shows that there is only one justificatory step: there is no justified authority without some form of consent of those governed.

Joseph Raz links legitimacy to the justification of political authority. According to Raz, political authority is just a special case of the more general concept of authority (1986, 1995, 2006). He defines authority in relation to a claim—of a person or an agency—to generate what he calls pre-emptive reasons. Such reasons replace other reasons for action that people might have. A teacher, for example, may order students to do some homework and expect this order to generate a reason for them to do their homework that replaces other reasons they might have for how to spend their afternoons.

Authority is effective, on this view, if it gets people to act on the reasons it generates. The difference between effective and legitimate authority, on Raz' view, is that the former merely purports to change the reasons that apply to others, while legitimate authority actually has the capacity to change these reasons. Legitimate authority satisfies what Raz calls the pre-emption thesis: “The fact that an authority requires performance of an action is a reason for its performance which is not to be added to all other relevant reasons when assessing what to do, but should exclude and take the place of some of them” (Raz 1988: 46). (There are limits to what even a legitimate authority can rightfully order others to do, which is why it does not necessarily replace all relevant reasons).

When is effective or de facto authority legitimate? According to Raz, it must be justified in the following way (“the normal justification thesis”): “The normal way to establish that a person has authority over another involves showing that the alleged subject is likely to better comply with the reasons which apply to him (other than the alleged authoritative directive) if he accepts the directives of the alleged authority as authoritatively binding and tries to follow them, rather than by trying to follow the reasons which apply to him directly” (Raz 1988: 53). It follows as a corollary of the normal justification thesis that a legitimate authority generates a duty to be obeyed. The normal justification thesis explains why those governed by that authority ought to treat its directives as binding. Because (legitimate) authority is conceived as what serves those governed, Raz calls it the “service conception” of authority (1988: 56). Note that even though legitimate authority is defined as a special case of effective authority, only the former is appropriately described as a service conception. Illegitimate—but effective—authority does not serve those governed; it only claims to do so.

William Edmundson formulates this way of linking authority and legitimacy via a condition he calls the warranty thesis: “If being an X entails claiming to F, then being a legitimate X entails truly claiming to F.” (Edmundson 1998: 39). Being an X here stands for “a state”, or “an authority”. And “to F” stands for “to create a duty to be obeyed”, for example. The idea expressed by the warranty thesis is that legitimacy morally justifies an independently existing authority such that the claims of the authority become moral obligations.

Those who take the justification of authority to be the fundamental normative problem reject a coercion-based definition of legitimacy. Leslie Green (1988), for example, follows Raz and argues that the use of coercion does not constitute the authority of the state. Coercion, on this view, is only a means that states use to secure their authority: “Coercion threats provide secondary, reinforcing motivation when the political order fails in its primary normative technique of authoritative guidance” (Green 1988: 75).

2.2. Justifying Power and Creating Political Authority

According to a second important interpretation, the main function of legitimacy is precisely to justify coercive power (for a recent discussion of the two alternative approaches to legitimacy and a defense of the coercion-based interpretation, see Ripstein 2004). Legitimacy, in this interpretation, is linked to the creation of political authority qua defining the permissible use of coercive power. Again, there are different ways in which this idea might be understood.

In Hobbes' influential account, political authority does not exist in the state of nature. It can be created by the social contract and serves to ensure self-preservation which is threatened in a state of nature. Legitimate authority depends on the ability of a state to protect its citizens. Hobbes argues that it is rational for all to consent to a covenant that authorizes a sovereign who can guarantee their protection and to transfer their rights to a sovereign—an individual or a group of individuals. When there is no such sovereign, one may be created by a covenant—Hobbes calls this “sovereignty by institution”. But it may also be created by the promise of all to obey a threatening power (“sovereignty by acquisition”; see Leviathan, chapter 17). According to Hobbes, once a sovereign is in place—both manners of creating a sovereign are equally legitimate—everyone is obligated to obey him. This holds at least for as long as the sovereign ensures their protection, as Hobbes believes that the natural right to self-preservation cannot be relinquished (Leviathan, chapter 21). Beyond that, however, there can be no further questions about the legitimacy of the sovereign. In particular, there is no distinction between effective authority and legitimate authority in Hobbes' thought. It might even be argued that Hobbes fails to distinguish between legitimate authority and the mere exercise of power (Korsgaard 1997: 29; see chapter 30 of Leviathan, however, for an account of the quality of the sovereign's rule).

Another way in which the relation between legitimacy and the creation of authority may be understood is that the attempt to rule without legitimacy is an attempt to exercise power—not authority. Such a view can be found in Jean-Jacques Rousseau's work. Legitimacy, for Rousseau, justifies the state's exercise of coercive power and creates an obligation to obey. Rousseau contrasts a legitimate social order with a system of rules that is merely the expression of power. Power is primarily a feature of the civil state. While there are some forms of power even in the state of nature—for example the power of parents over their children—Rousseau assumes that harmful power arises primarily in the civil state and that this creates the problem of legitimacy. In the first chapter of the first book of On the Social Contract he remarks that while “[m]an is born free”, the civil state he observes makes everyone a slave. Rousseau's main question is under what conditions a civil state, which uses coercive power to back up its laws, can be thought of as freeing citizens from this serfdom. Such a state would be legitimate. As he puts it in the opening sentence of the Social Contract, “I want to inquire whether there can be some legitimate and sure rule of administration in the civil order, taking men as they are and laws as they might be.”

Rousseau's account of legitimacy is importantly different from Locke's in that Rousseau does not attach normativity to the process through which a civil state emerges from the state of nature. Legitimate political authority is created by convention, reached within the civil state. Specifically, Rousseau suggests that legitimacy arises from the democratic justification of the laws of the civil state (Social Contract I:6; cf. section 3.3. below).

For Kant, as for Hobbes, political authority is created by the establishment of political institutions in the civil state. It does not pre-exist in individuals in the state of nature. Yet some form of individual authority exists in the pre-civil social state, according to Kant. It is the moral authority of each individual qua rational being. Unlike Hobbes, Kant does not view political authority as created by a voluntary act. The social contract which establishes the civil state is not the result of a voluntary association, in which individuals come together to pursue ends that they share. Instead, in the pre-civil state individuals have a moral obligation—an imperfect duty—to form a civil state, and as rational and moral beings, they can recognize this duty. Establishing a civil state is “in itself an end (that each ought to have)” (Kant, Theory and Practice 8:289; see also Perpetual Peace, Appendix I). Kant regards the civil state—and the coercive political power it exercises—as a necessary first step toward a moral order (the “ethical commonwealth”). It helps people conform to certain rules by eliminating what today would be called the free-riding problem or the problem of partial compliance. By creating a coercive order of public legal justice, “a great step is taken toward morality (though it is not yet a moral step), toward being attached to this concept of duty even for its own sake” (Kant, Perpetual Peace 8:376, notes to Appendix I; see also Riley 1982: 129f).

The civil state, according to Kant, establishes the rights necessary to secure equal freedom. Unlike for Locke and his contemporary followers, however, coercive power is not a secondary feature of the civil state, necessary to back up laws. According to Kant, coercion is part of the idea of rights. The thought can be explained as follows. Coercion is defined as a restriction of the freedom to pursue one's own ends. Any right of a person—independently of whether it is respected or has been violated—implies a restriction for others. (cf. Kant, Theory and Practice, Part 2; Ripstein 2004: 8; Flikschuh 2008: 389f). Coercion, in this view, is thus not merely a means for the civil state to enforce rights as defenders of an authority-based concept of legitimacy claim. Instead, according to Kant, it is constitutive of the civil state. This understanding of rights links Kant's conception of legitimate political authority to the justification of coercion.

Legitimacy, for Kant, depends on a particular interpretation of the social contract. For Kant, the social contract which establishes the civil state is not an actual event. He accepts David Hume's objection to Locke that the civil state is often established in an act of violence (Hume “Of the Original Contract”). Kant invokes the social contract, instead, as the test “of any public law's conformity with right” (Kant Theory and Practice 8:294). The criterion is the following: each law should be such that all individuals could have consented to it. The social contract, according to Kant, is thus a hypothetical thought experiment, meant to capture an idea of public reason. As such, it sets the standard for what counts as legitimate political authority. Because of his particular interpretation of the social contract, Kant is not a social contract theorist in the strict sense. The idea of a contract is nevertheless relevant for his understanding of legitimacy. (On the difference between voluntaristic and rationalistic strands in liberalism, see Waldron 1987).

Kant, unlike Hobbes, recognizes the difference between legitimate and effective authority. For the head of the civil state is under an obligation to obey public reason and to enact only laws to which all individuals could consent. If he violates this obligation, however, he still holds authority, even if his authority ceases to be legitimate. This view is best explained in relation to Kant's often criticized position on the right to revolution. Kant famously denied that there is a right to revolution (Kant Perpetual Peace, Appendix II; for a recent discussion, see Flikschuh 2008). Kant stresses that while “a people”—as united in the civil state—is sovereign, its individual members are under the obligation to obey the head of the state thus established. This obligation is such that it is incompatible with a right to revolution. Kant offers a transcendental argument for his position (Kant Perpetual Peace, Appendix II; Arendt 1992). A right to revolution would be in contradiction with the idea that individuals are bound by public law, but without the idea of citizens being bound by public law, there cannot be a civil state—only anarchy. As mentioned earlier, however, there is a duty to establish a civil state. Kant's position implies that the obligation of individuals to obey a head of state is not conditioned upon the ruler's performance. In particular, the obligation to obey does not cease when the laws are unjust.

Kant's position on the right to revolution may suggest that he regards political authority as similarly absolute as Hobbes. But Kant stresses that the head of state is bound by the commands of public reason. This is manifest in his insistence on freedom of the pen: “a citizen must have, with the approval of the ruler himself, the authorization to make known publicly his opinions about what it is in the ruler's arrangements that seems to him to be a wrong against the commonwealth” (Kant Theory and Practice 8:304). While there is no right to revolution, political authority is only legitimate if the head of state respects the social contract. But political obligations arise even from illegitimate authority. If the head of state acts in violation of the social contract and hence of public reason, for example by restricting citizens' freedom of political criticism, citizens are still obligated to obey.

The contemporary literature has been dominated by a focus on the justification of authority, rather than coercive political power (Ripstein 2004). Nevertheless, there are exceptions—not least the works of contemporary Kantians such as Rawls and Habermas (to be discussed in sections 3.3. and 5.2. respectively).

Jean Hampton (1998; drawing on Anscombe 1981) offers an elegant contemporary explication of Hobbes' view that political authority does not pre-exist in individuals. According to her, political authority “is invented by a group of people who perceive that this kind of special authority is necessary for the collective solution of certain problems of interaction in their territory and whose process of state creation essentially involves designing the content and structure of that authority so that it meets what they take to be their needs” (Hampton 1998: 77). Her theory links the authority of the state to its ability to enforce a solution to coordination and cooperation problems. Coercion is the necessary feature that enables the state to provide an effective solution to these problems, and the entitlement to use coercion is what constitutes the authority of the state. The entitlement to use coercion distinguishes such minimally legitimate political authority from a mere use of power. Hampton draws a further distinction between minimal legitimacy and what she calls full moral legitimacy, which obtains when political authority is just.

Buchanan (2002) also argues that legitimacy is concerned with the justification of coercive power. Buchanan points out that this makes legitimacy a more fundamental normative concept than authority. Like Hampton, he advocates a moralized interpretation of legitimacy. According to him, “an entity has political legitimacy if and only if it is morally justified in wielding political power” (2002: 689). Political authority, in his approach, obtains if an entity is legitimate in this sense and if some further conditions, relating to political obligation, are met (2002: 691).

2.3. Political Legitimacy and Political Obligations

Historically speaking, the dominant view has been that legitimate political authority creates political obligations. Locke, for example, writes: “every man, by consenting with others to make one body politic under one government, puts himself under an obligation to every one of that society to submit to the determination of the majority, and to be concluded by it; or else this original compact, whereby he with others incorporates into one society, would signify nothing, and be no compact if he be left free and under no other ties than he was in before in the state of nature” (Locke 1990 [1690]: 52f).

While this is still the view many hold, not all do. Some insist that the question of what constitutes legitimate authority is distinct from the question of what political obligations people have. Ronald Dworkin (1986: 191) defends a view of this sort. He maintains that if an authority is legitimate, there is a general obligation to obey its commands but this does not show that there is, in each case, an obligation to obey particular decisions of that authority. Dworkin's (1986) argument rests on treating political obligations as a fundamental normative concept in its own right. What he calls “associative obligations” arise, not from legitimate political authority, but directly from membership in a political community. (For a critical discussion of this account, see Simmons 2001; Wellman 1996).

Views that dissociate legitimate authority from political obligation have some appeal to those who aim to counter Robert Paul Wolff's influential anarchist argument. The argument highlights what today is sometimes called the subjection problem (Perry 2007): how can autonomous individuals be under a general—content-independent—obligation to subject their will to the will of someone else? Wolff (1970) argues that because there cannot be such a general obligation to obey the state, states are necessarily illegitimate.

Edmundson (1998) has a first response to the anarchist challenge. He argues that while legitimacy establishes the right to rule of political institutions, it does not create even a prima facie duty to obey their commands. He claims that the moral duty to obey the commands of legitimate authority arises only if additional conditions are met.

Simmons (2001) has a different response. As discussed above, in his two-step approach, justified authority does not entail legitimate authority, and while the latter does create political obligations the former does not. Because legitimate authority depends on people's actual consent to the commands of a particular state (where Simmons is not entirely clear about what this means), there is no content-independent duty to obey the state.

3. Sources of Political Legitimacy

Insofar as legitimacy, understood normatively, defines which political institutions and which decisions made within them are acceptable, and, in some cases, what kind of obligations people who are governed by these institutions incur, there is the question what grounds this normativity. This section briefly reviews different accounts that have been given of the sources of legitimacy.

3.1. Consent

While there is a strong voluntarist line of thought in Christian political philosophy, it was in the 17th century that consent came to be seen as the main source of political legitimacy. The works of Hugo Grotius, Hobbes, and Samuel Pufendorf tend to be seen as the main turning point that eventually led to the replacement of natural law and divine authority theories of legitimacy (see Schneewind 1998; Hampton 1998). The following passage from Grotius' On the Law of War and Peace expresses the modern perspective: “But as there are several Ways of Living, some better than others, and every one may chuse which he pleases of all those Sorts; so a People may chuse what Form of Government they please: Neither is the Right which the Sovereign has over his Subjects to be measured by this or that Form, of which divers Men have different Opinions, but by the Extent of the Will of those who conferred it upon him” (cited by Tuck 1993: 193). It was Locke's version of social contract theory that elevated consent to the main source of the legitimacy of political authority.

Raz helpfully distinguishes among three ways in which the relation between consent and legitimate political authority may be understood (1995: 356): (i) consent of those governed is a necessary condition for the legitimacy of political authority; (ii) consent is not directly a condition for legitimacy, but the conditions for the legitimacy of authority are such that only political authority that enjoys the consent of those governed can meet them; (iii) the conditions of legitimate political authority are such that those governed by that authority are under an obligation to consent.

Locke and his contemporary followers such as Nozick (1974) or Simmons (2001), but also Rousseau and his followers defend a version of (i)—the most typical form that consent theories take. Versions of (ii) appeal to those who reject actual consent as a basis for legitimacy, as they only regard consent given under ideal conditions as binding. Theories of hypothetical consent, such as those articulated by Kant or Rawls, fall into this category. Such theories view political authority as legitimate only if those governed could consent under certain ideal conditions (cf. section 3.2.).

David Estlund (2008: 177ff) defends a version of hypothetical consent theory that matches category (iii). What he calls “normative consent” is a theory that regards non-consent to authority, under certain conditions as invalid. Authority, in this view, may thus be justified without actual consent. Estlund defines authority, following Raz, as the moral power to require action. Estlund uses normative consent theory as the basis for an account of democratic legitimacy, understood as the permissibility of using coercion to enforce authority. The work that normative consent theory does in Estlund's account is that it contributes to the justification of the authority of the democratic collective over those who disagree with certain democratically approved laws.

Although consent theory has been dominating for a long time, there are many well-known objections to it, especially to Locke's version. Some of them are about as old as consent theory itself. David Hume, in his essay “Of the Original Contract”, and many after him object to Locke that consent is not feasible, and that actual states have almost always arisen from acts of violence. The attempt to legitimize political authority via consent is thus, at best, wishful thinking (Wellman 1996). What is worse, it may obscure problematic structures of subordination (Pateman 1988). Hume's own solution was, like Bentham later, to propose to justify political authority with reference to its beneficial consequences.

3.2. Beneficial Consequences

In the utilitarian view, legitimate political authority should be grounded on the principle of utility. This conception of legitimacy is necessarily a moralized one: the legitimacy of political authority depends on what morality requires. Christian Thomasius, a student of Pufendorf and contemporary of Locke, may be seen as a precursor of the utilitarian approach to political legitimacy, as he rejected voluntarism and endorsed the idea that political legitimacy depends on principles of rational prudence instead (Schneewind 1998: 160; Barnard 2001: 66). Where Thomasius differs from the utilitarians, however, is in his attempt to identify a distinctively political—not moral or legal—source of legitimacy. He developed the idea of “decorum” into a theory of how people should relate to one another in the political context. Decorum is best described as a principle of “civic mutuality” (Barnard 2001: 65): “You treat others as you would expect them to treat you” (Thomasius, Foundations of the Law of Nature and of Nations, quoted by Barnard 2001: 65). By thus distinguishing legitimacy from legality and justice, Thomasius adopted an approach that was considerably ahead of his time.

Jeremy Bentham rejects the Hobbesian idea that political authority is created by a social contract. According to Bentham, it is the state that creates the possibility of binding contracts. The problem of legitimacy that the state faces is which of its laws are justified. Bentham proposes that legitimacy depends on whether a law contributes to the happiness of the citizens. (For a contemporary take on this utilitarian principle of legitimacy, see Binmore 2000).

A well-known problem with the view that Bentham articulates is that it justifies restrictions of rights that liberals find unacceptable. John Stuart Mill's answer to this objection consists, on the one hand, in an argument for the compatibility between utilitarianism and the protection of liberty rights and, on the other, in an instrumentalist defense of democratic political authority based on the principle of utility. According to Mill, both individual freedom and the right to participate in politics are necessary for the self-development of individuals (Mill On Liberty and Considerations on Representative Government, see Brink 1992; Ten 1998).

With regard to the defense of liberty rights, Mill argues that the restriction of liberty is illegitimate unless it is permitted by the harm principle, that is, unless the actions suppressed by the restriction harm others (On Liberty, chapter 1; for a critical discussion of the harm principle as the basis of legitimacy, see Wellman 1996). Mill's view of the instrumental value of (deliberative) democracy is expressed in the following passage of the first chapter of On Liberty: “Despotism is a legitimate mode of government in dealing with barbarians, provided that the end be their improvement and the means justified by actually effecting that end. Liberty, as a principle, has no application to any state of things anterior to the time when mankind have become capable of being improved by free and equal discussion.” Deliberation is important, according to Mill, because of his belief in the power of ideas—in what Habermas would later call the force of the better argument (Habermas 1990: 158f). Deliberation should keep partisan interests, which could threaten legitimacy by undermining the general happiness, in check: “The representative system ought … not to allow any of the various sectional interests to be so powerful as to be capable of prevailing against truth and justice and the other sectional interests combined. There ought always to be such a balance preserved among personal interests as may render any one of them dependent for its successes, on carrying with it as least a large proportion of those who act on higher motives, and more comprehensive and distant views” (Mill, Collected Works XIX: 447, cited by Ten 1998: 379).

Many are not convinced that such instrumentalist reasoning provides a satisfactory account of political legitimacy. Rawls (1971:175f) and Jeremy Waldron (1987: 143f) object that the utilitarian approach will ultimately only convince those who stand to benefit from the felicific calculus, and that it lacks an argument to convince those who stand to lose.

Some attempts to meet this objection have a paternalist ring. An example is Raz' service conception of legitimate authority (section 2.1.). It tries to show how an account of legitimacy based on beneficial consequences is compatible with everyone having reasons to obey the directives of a legitimate authority. According to Raz (1995: 359), “[g]overnments decide what is best for their subjects and present them with the results as binding conclusions that they are bound to follow.” The justification for this view that Raz gives (“the normal justification thesis”) is, as explained above, that if the authority is legitimate, its directives are such that they help those governed to better comply with reasons that apply to them. (For a critique of this approach, see Hershovitz 2003).

Wellman's (1996) samaritan account of political legitimacy is an also an attempt to overcome the problem that showing that political institutions and the decisions made within them have beneficial consequences is not sufficient to justify coercion. He claims that “what ultimately legitimizes a state's imposition upon your liberty is not merely the services it provides you, but the benefits it provides others” (Wellman 1996: 213; his emphasis). In his account, a state's legitimacy depends on it being justified to use coercion to enforce its laws. His account focuses primarily on the question of what justifies a state's use of coercion to enforce its laws, rather than on the question what grounds people may have to accept particular decisions made within the state as legitimate (for the distinction, see Simmons 2001). His suggestion is that the justification of the state can be grounded in the samaritan duty to help others in need. The thought is that because “political society is the only vehicle with which people can escape the perils of the state of nature” (Wellman 1996: 216), people have a samaritan duty to provide to one another the benefits of a state. Associated restrictions of their liberty by the state, Wellman claims, are legitimate.

3.3. Public Reason and Democratic Approval

An important legacy of consent theory in contemporary thought is manifest in accounts that attribute the source of legitimacy either to an idea of public reason—taking the lead from Kant—or to a theory of democratic approval—taking the lead from Rousseau—or a combination of the two.

In Political Liberalism, Rawls presents a book-long treatment of political legitimacy that draws on Kant. It combines an idea of public reason with an account of substantive democratic values. His starting-point is the following problem of legitimacy (Rawls 2001: 41): “in the light of what reasons and values … can citizens legitimately exercise … coercive power over one another?” The solution to this problem that Rawls proposes is the following: “political power is legitimate only when it is exercised in accordance with a constitution (written or unwritten) the essentials of which all citizens, as reasonable and rational, can endorse in the light of their common human reason” (Rawls 2001: 41).

This conception of legitimacy is connected to his conception of justice. According to Rawls (1993: 225), “[i]n justice as fairness, and I think in many other liberal views, the guidelines of inquiry of public reason, as well as its principle of legitimacy, have the same basis as the substantive principles of justice.” The common basis between justice and legitimacy is formed by the fundamental ideas that underlie Rawls' theory of justice as fairness and that he sees as implicit in the political culture of democratic societies: the idea of society as a fair system of cooperation, the idea of citizens as free and equal persons, the idea of the basic structure, and the idea of political justification. But to say that justice and legitimacy have a common basis in fundamental political values does not imply that they impose the same demands, or that one reduces to the other. Instead, Rawls argues, legitimacy is a weaker idea than justice: particular political institutions and the decisions made within them may be legitimate but not just (Rawls 1995).

Simmons (2001) has criticized Rawls' approach for failing to distinguish between the justification of political authority and political legitimacy. But this objection presupposes that political authority exists independently of its legitimacy. On the Rawlsian view, however, the problem of legitimacy is cast in terms of the justification of coercion—not of authority. Legitimacy should thus be understood as what creates—rather than merely justifies—political authority. The following thought supports this claim. Rawls—in Political Liberalism—explicitly focuses on the democratic context. It is a particular feature of democracy that the right to rule is created by those who are ruled. As Samuel Hershovitz puts it in his critique of the Razian approach to the legitimacy of authority, in a democracy there is no sharp division between the “binders” and the “bound” (2003: 210f). The political authority of the democratic assembly is entailed by some account of the conditions under which citizen's may legitimately exercise coercive power over one another and vice-versa. For this reason, political authority, in a democratic context, does not exist independently of legitimacy. Instead, legitimate authority is created by appropriately constrained collective decision-making procedures (Peter 2008).

An idea of public reason is necessary to solve the problem of political legitimacy. It draws on the method of “political”—as opposed to “metaphysical”—justification that Rawls has developed in response to critics of his theory of justice as fairness (Rawls 1985). This means that public reason should be “freestanding” in the same way as his theory of justice is. The goal is to characterize the idea of public reason with reference to fundamental political values alone and make it independent of comprehensive doctrines. On Rawls' understanding, public reason is public in the following three ways: “as the reason of free and equal citizens, it is the reason of the public; its subject is the public good concerning questions of fundamental political justice, which questions are of two kinds, constitutional essentials and matters of basic justice; and its nature and content are public, being expressed in public reasoning by a family of reasonable conceptions of political justice reasonably thought to satisfy the criterion of reciprocity” (1999: 575).

What is the exact nature of the link between Rawls' idea of public reason and democratic legitimacy? This question has created quite a bit of confusion in the relevant literature. Some have tended to interpret Rawls' idea of public reason as implying that only democratic decisions that are justified or justifiable in terms of public reason can be legitimate. But this interpretation is not plausible. Public reason can only perform its role as a legitimizing force if it is freestanding—if it draws on political values alone and is independent of moral or religious doctrines of the good. The idea is that public reason is accessible to all who are reasonable, but while public reason can attract consensus, there is deep pluralism in the domain of reasonable doctrines. This restricts the content of public reason to what is given by the family of what Rawls calls political conceptions of justice (Rawls 2001: 26). It is obvious, however, that in many contexts, we will reason about political matters in terms of non-public reason—“the reason appropriate to individuals and associations within society” (2001: 92). Rawls recognizes that because the content of the idea of public reason is restricted, the domain to which it should apply must be restricted too. The question is: in what context is it important that the restriction on reason is observed? Rawls conceives of the domain of public reason as limited to matters of constitutional essentials and basic justice and as applying primarily—but not only—to judges, government officials, and candidates for public office when they decide on matters of constitutional essentials and basic justice.

The account I have just given supports a procedural interpretation of Rawls' idea of public reason (Peter 2008). In this interpretation, public reason only applies to the justification of the constitution that constrains the process of democratic decision-making, but is not required to extend to the substantive (as opposed to the procedural) reasons people might hold to justify a decision. That is to say, it is sufficient for political legitimacy that the process in which decisions are taken and people exchange reasons for and against particular decisions is appropriately constrained. This interpretation of the relationship between democratic legitimacy and public reason suggests that because people regard a properly justified process of democratic decision-making as the source of the legitimacy, they will accept a democratic decision even if they disagree substantively with it. Such a conception of legitimacy takes the form of pure proceduralism (section 4.2.).

Rousseau has a different solution to the problem of how to explain the legitimacy of democratic decisions in the absence of spontaneous consensus, and his account influences many contemporary deliberative democrats (section 4.3.). One of the important departures from Locke's version of social contract theory that Rousseau proposes is that tacit consent is not sufficient for political legitimacy. Without citizens' active participation in the justification of a state's laws, Rousseau maintains, there is no legitimacy. According to Rousseau, one's will cannot be represented, as this would distort the general will, which alone is the source of legitimacy: “The engagements that bind us to the social body are obligatory only because they are mutual… the general will, to be truly such, should be general in its object as well as in its essence; … it should come from all to apply to all; and … it loses its natural rectitude when it is directed towards any individual, determinate object” (Rousseau, Social Contract, II:4; see also ibid. I:3 and Rawls 2007: 231f).

Rousseau distinguishes among a citizens' private will, which reflects personal interests, a citizen's general will, which reflects an interpretation of the common good, and the general will, which truly reflects the common good. A democratic decision is always about the common good. In democratic decision-making, citizens thus compare their interpretations of the general will. If properly conducted, it reveals the general will. This is the legitimate decision.

Active participation by all may not generate a consensus. So why would those who oppose a particular decision be bound by that decision? Rousseau's answer to this question is the following. On Rousseau's view, citizens can—and will want to—learn from democratic decisions. Since the democratic decision, if conducted properly, correctly reveals the general will, those who voted against a particular proposal will recognize that they were wrong and will adjust their beliefs about what the general will is. In this ingenious way, individual are only bound by their own will, but everyone is bound by a democratic decision.

4. Political Legitimacy and Democracy

In contemporary political philosophy, not everyone agrees that democracy is necessary for political legitimacy. Democratic instrumentalism is the view that democratic decision-making procedures are at best a means for political legitimacy, and whether or not legitimacy requires democracy depends on the outcomes they bring about. Thomas Christiano (2004) helpfully distinguishes between monistic conceptions of political legitimacy and non-monistic ones. Democratic instrumentalism is a monistic view. It reduces the normativity of political legitimacy to a single dimension: only the quality of the outcomes a particular political regime generates is relevant for political legitimacy. The contrasting position in contemporary political philosophy is that democratic forms of political organization are necessary for political legitimacy, independently of their instrumental value (Buchanan 2002). What conceptions of democratic legitimacy, as I use the term here, have in common is that they demand that political institutions respect democratic values. Some conceptions of democratic legitimacy are also monistic. What is commonly called pure proceduralism is an example of a monistic view. According to pure proceduralism only procedural features of decision-making are relevant for democratic legitimacy. Many contributors are drawn to non-monistic conceptions of democratic legitimacy. Such mixed conceptions of democratic legitimacy—Peter (2008) calls them “rational proceduralist”—combine conditions that refer to the quality of outcomes of democratic decision-making with conditions that apply to procedural features.

4.1. Democratic Instrumentalism

Democratic instrumentalism is often used to argue against democracy. According to theories of this kind, some ideal of good outcomes, however defined, forms the standard that determines political legitimacy. If democracy does not contribute to better outcomes, it is not necessary for political legitimacy (Raz 1995; Wall 2007).

Those who defend instrumentalism take it as a premise that there is an ideal outcome that can be identified independently of the democratic process, and in terms of which the value of the democratic process, its legitimacy, can be gauged. The instrumentalist accounts of Richard Arneson (2003) and Steven Wall (2007), for example, refer to some ideal egalitarian distribution. In their view, the legitimacy of political institutions and the decisions made within them depends on how closely they approximate the ideal egalitarian distribution. If sacrificing political equality allows for a better approximation of equality overall, so their argument goes, then this does not undermine legitimacy.

One problem with this view is that to get off the ground, it needs to treat the value of political equality as less important than the value of those other equalities that inform the perfectionist standard. This is implausible to those who take political equality to be one of the most important egalitarian values (e.g. Rawls 1993). In addition, democratic instrumentalism presupposes that political legitimacy is best understood as related to the moral justification of independently existing political authority. This view is at odds with the view that many democrats hold—that legitimate procedures of democratic decision-making are necessary for the justification of political power and the creation of political authority.

Another strand of the literature, while also subscribing to democratic instrumentalism, uses it to defend democracy. The claim here is that democratic decision-making mechanisms are best able to produce legitimate outcomes. The most famous version of this claim is based on the Condorcet jury theorem (for a recent discussion, see List and Goodin 2001). In its original formulation, the Condorcet jury theorem assumes that there are two alternatives and one of them is the correct outcome, however defined. Take the latter to be the legitimate outcome. The theorem says that if each voter is more likely to be correct than wrong, then a majority of all is also more likely to be correct than wrong. In addition, the probability that a majority will vote for the correct outcome increases with the size of the body of voters. Since democracy has a greater constituency than any other regime, the theorem gives an argument for why it is best able to generate legitimate outcomes.

4.2. Pure Proceduralist Conceptions of Democratic Legitimacy

According to pure proceduralist conceptions of democratic legitimacy, democratic decisions are legitimate as long as they are the result of an appropriately constrained process of democratic decision-making. This places all the normative weight on procedural values.

There are several ways in which pure proceduralism might be understood. On an account of aggregative democracy—which takes the aggregation of individual preferences to be the key feature of democracy—pure proceduralism implies that democratic decisions are legitimate if the aggregative process is deemed fair. Kenneth O. May's defense of majority rule (May 1952) implies a view of this sort (see also Dahl 1956).

On a deliberative account of democracy, legitimacy depends, at least in part, on the process of public deliberation (Manin 1987, Bohman 1996). Thomas Christiano has a good characterization of what pure proceduralism entails in an account of deliberative democracy: “democratic discussion, deliberation, and decisionmaking under certain conditions are what make the outcomes legitimate for each person. … [W]hatever the results of discussions, deliberation, and decisionmaking …, they are legitimate. The results are made legitimate by being the results of the procedure” (Christiano 1996: 35). The idea is that while democratic deliberation helps sorting through reasons for and against particular candidates or policy proposals, and perhaps even generates new alternatives, the legitimacy of the outcomes of such a process only depends on the fairness of the decision-making process, not on the quality of the outcomes it produces. The justification for conceptions of democratic legitimacy of this kind is that there is no shared standard for assessing the quality of the outcomes—deep disagreement about reasons for and against proposals will always remain. A fair way to resolve such disagreements is thus the only source of the legitimacy of the outcomes (Gaus 1997).

It has been argued that portraying deliberative democracy as an exchange of reasons—though preferable to an account of democracy as the aggregation of preferences—is incomplete if it does not cover how individuals might learn from the exchange of reasons, or how the outcomes chosen might reflect the knowledge this processes generates. Epistemic accounts of deliberative democracy all take seriously the cognitive dimension of this process. Typically, advocates of epistemic democracy propose mixed conceptions of democratic legitimacy—conceptions that combine conditions that refer to the decision-making process with conditions that relate to the epistemic quality of the outcomes (see below). But it is possible to interpret the demands of democratic legitimacy in pure proceduralist fashion, even in a context of epistemic democracy. A pure epistemic proceduralist conception rejects the idea that a procedure-independent standard for the correctness of democratic decisions can provide a normative anchor for democratic legitimacy. In pure proceduralist fashion, it makes democratic legitimacy dependent on features of the decision-making process. What characterizes pure epistemic proceduralism is that it incorporates epistemic values in procedural fashion. The thought is that the epistemic value of deliberative democratic decision-making can be understood as depending on its procedural features—on how inclusive it is, for example, or how thoroughly the knowledge claims on which particular proposals rest have been subjected to criticism. On this interpretation, democratic legitimacy is jeopardized not just by problematic influences of privileged access to social and economic institutions on democratic decision-making process, but by the influence of privileged access to epistemic institutions as well. The resulting conception of democratic legitimacy regards democratic decisions as legitimate if they are the outcome of a deliberative decision-making process that satisfies some conditions of political and epistemic fairness (Peter 2008).

4.3. Rational Proceduralist Conceptions of Democratic Legitimacy

Rational proceduralist conceptions of democratic legitimacy add conditions that refer to the quality of outcomes to those that apply to the procedural properties of democratic decision-making. While pure proceduralists argue that the inevitable contestedness of standards that define the quality of outcomes makes it impossible to ground legitimacy in them, defenders of mixed conceptions are concerned that a fair process may lead to irrational outcomes—outcomes of unnecessarily and unacceptably low quality. The general thought underlying rational proceduralist conceptions is that the fairness of the democratic decision-making process is not sufficient to establish the legitimacy of its outcomes.

As is the case with pure proceduralist conceptions, mixed conceptions of democratic legitimacy also vary with the underlying account of democracy. A version of rational proceduralism is implicit in Kenneth Arrow's approach to aggregative democracy (Arrow 1963; see Peter 2008). The problem he poses is: are there methods of democratic decision-making that are based on equal consideration of individual interests and are conducive to rational social choice? As is well known, his impossibility theorem shows a problem with finding such decision-making mechanisms. Arrow's way of posing the problem—which contrasts with May's (1952)—suggests that the possible irrationality of majority rule undermines its legitimacy, even if it respects certain procedural values. His view implies that democratic legitimacy only obtains if the outcomes themselves satisfy certain quality conditions—specifically, he postulated that they should satisfy certain rationality axioms.

The default conception of democratic legitimacy that many deliberative democrats favor is also a version of rational proceduralism. All these conceptions involve some procedure-independent standard for ideal outcomes. In “perfect” versions of rational proceduralism, to borrow from Rawls' terminology (Rawls 1971: 85), an appropriately constrained deliberative decision-making process is uniquely able to satisfy this standard, which explains the legitimacy of deliberative democratic decisions. Habermas' conception of democratic legitimacy is of this form. Drawing on discourse ethics, Habermas (1990, 1996) argues that people's participation in the justificatory processes of deliberative democracy is necessary for rational-legal legitimacy. According to him, “the procedures and communicative presuppositions of democratic opinion- and will-formation function as the most important sluices for the discursive rationalization of the decisions of an administration bound by law and statute” (1996: 300). The legitimacy of democratic decisions, then, depends on both procedural values and on the substantive quality of the outcomes that these deliberative decision-making procedures generate. As he puts it: “Deliberative politics acquires its legitimating force from the discursive structure of an opinion- and will-formation that can fulfill its socially integrative function only because citizens expect its results to have a reasonable quality” (Habermas 1996: 304; see also Benhabib 1994; Knight and Johnson 1994; Cohen 1997a,b; Bohman 1997). The ideal outcome is a rationally justified decision—a decision everyone has reasons to endorse, and deliberative decision-making processes, if appropriately shaped, are uniquely able to reach such decisions.

Other deliberative democrats, while still endorsing rational proceduralist conceptions of legitimacy, are more skeptical about the ability of deliberative processes to reach an ideally justified decision (e.g. Gutmann and Thompson 1996). A case in point is Philip Pettit's and Christian List's work on the discursive dilemma (e.g. Pettit 2001, 2003; List and Pettit 2002; List 2006). They show how occurrences of the discursive dilemma may undermine the rationality of the outcome of public deliberation. This problem arises when the evaluation of alternative outcomes is logically connected to a set of independent premises. It is possible that the deliberative constellation is such that a decision made based on the evaluation of the premises will produce the opposite result than a decision based on the evaluation of the outcomes directly. For example: while a majority might hold (P1) that health is the most important good and there might also a be a majority that holds (P2) that affordable health care is a good strategy to secure people's health, it is still possible that a majority will reject a health care reform (C) which would improve people's health. This can happen if participants will only endorse the reform if they endorse both premises and if only a minority does so—even though there are majorities for each premise individually.

In response to the discursive dilemma, Pettit advocates an “imperfect” version of rational proceduralism: it combines conditions that specify an ideal outcome—a rationally justified decision—with conditions that relate to the decision-making procedure, but accepts that no single decision-making procedure is infallible. According to such a conception, a democratic decision is legitimate if it has been made in a decision-making process that seeks to approximate, as far as possible, the ideal outcome. Specifically, Pettit advocates a premise-based decision-making procedure as necessary for legitimacy. Such a procedure chooses outcomes based on the collective evaluation of the premises, not based on the evaluation of the outcomes directly. Since such decisions can be backed-up by the evaluation of the premises, Pettit argues that this decision-making procedure is better able to approximate the goal of reaching rationally justified decisions than the rival conclusion-based procedure (Pettit 2001, 2003).

As mentioned above, advocates of epistemic democracy typically favor a mixed conception of legitimacy. Many accounts of epistemic democracy draw on the Condorcet jury theorem. Some have interpreted the Condorcet jury theorem as explaining Rousseau's theory of how a democratic decision reflects the general will (Grofman and Feld 1988). Such interpretations of epistemic democracy rely on what David Estlund calls “the correctness theory of democratic legitimacy” (Estlund 2008: 99). According to this conception, a version of rational proceduralism, a democratic decision is legitimate if it is correct.

Estlund's own account of epistemic democracy puts forward a different conception of legitimacy. His main objection is that accounts based on the Condorcet jury theorem fail to give a sufficient explanation for why those who disagree with the outcome of the democratic decision-making process ought to treat it as binding and hence demands too much deference from the participants of democratic decision-making. To correct for that, Estlund's alternative conception of democratic legitimacy puts more emphasis on procedures. The conception of legitimacy that he advocates “requires that the procedure can be held, in terms acceptable to all qualified points of view, to be epistemically the best (or close to it) among those that are better than random” (Estlund 2008: 98). He calls this conception “epistemic proceduralism”. He sometimes refers to it as a “purely” procedural conception of legitimacy (e.g. Estlund 2008: 108, 116). This is misleading, however, as pure proceduralist conceptions of legitimacy do not depend on procedure-independent standards. In Estlund's epistemic proceduralism, a procedure-independent standard functions as a selection device. His conception of legitimacy is thus better described as a version of imperfect proceduralism. It assumes a procedure-independent standard for correct outcomes and defends a particular democratic procedure in terms of how closely it approximates these outcomes while allowing that no procedure can guarantee that the right outcome is reached every time. It is a feature of an imperfect proceduralist conception of democratic legitimacy that a particular decision may fail to reach the ideal outcome—here, the correct outcome—yet still be legitimate. To put the point differently, whereas pure proceduralist conceptions of democratic legitimacy are monistic about legitimacy, Estlund's “epistemic proceduralism” is non-monistic, as it both insists that (deliberative) democratic procedures of decision-making are essential for political legitimacy and requires that these procedures approximate, as much as possible, an ideal outcome.

5. Legitimacy and Political Cosmopolitanism

Political cosmopolitanism is the view that national communities are not the exclusive source of political legitimacy in the global realm. This is a minimal characterization. It is compatible with a system in which nation states and their governments remain the main political agents, as long as there is some attribution of legitimate political authority to international conventions. For even if states and their governments are the main political entities, there is still the question about appropriate relations among national actors. When should nation states recognize another political entity as a legitimate? And what are appropriate sanctions against entities that do not meet the legitimacy criteria? Let us call this problem the problem of international legitimacy.

Political cosmopolitanism is also compatible with the much more demanding idea of replacing nation states and national governments—at least in certain policy areas—by global institutions. Examples of relevant policy areas are trade or the environment. The associated global institutions may include both global rules (e.g. the rules of the WTO treaty) and global political agents (e.g. the UN General Assembly). This raises the question of what conditions such global governance institutions have to satisfy in order to qualify as legitimate. Let us call this the problem of global legitimacy.

5.1. Political Nationalism

The more familiar, contrasting position is political nationalism. It is the view that only the political institutions of nation states can overcome the legitimacy problem and hence be a source of political legitimacy. Political nationalism is usually defended on the grounds that there is something unique either about the coercion deployed by states or about the political authority of states which needs justification.

There has been a tendency in political philosophy to assume political nationalism as the default position. This has often resulted in blindness toward the possibility of sources of legitimacy beyond the nation state. It has also biased the debate on global justice. Some have argued that because moral cosmopolitan commitments trump commitments to (national) legitimacy, a conception of global justice can be detached from concerns with legitimacy (Beitz 1979a,b, 1998; Pogge 2008). Others have argued—again assuming political nationalism—that legitimate authority at the level of the nation state is necessary to pursue moral cosmopolitan goals (Ypi 2008 provides an empirical argument). Yet others have argued against the idea of global justice altogether, on the grounds that political legitimacy ties obligations of justice to nation states (Nagel 2005). What these approaches to global justice have failed to address is the possibility of sound political cosmopolitan conceptions of political legitimacy.

5.2. Political Cosmopolitanism

There are two main approaches to both international and global legitimacy: the state-centered approach and the people-centered approach. The former takes appropriate relations among states as basic. As Charles Beitz characterizes this approach: “international society is understood as domestic society writ large, with states playing the roles occupied by persons in domestic society. States, not persons, are the subjects of international morality, and the rules that regulate their behavior are supposed to preserve a peaceful order of sovereign states” (1979b: 408; see also Beitz 1998). Locke, Bentham, and Mill, among others, approached the issue of international legitimacy in this way. Among contemporary thinkers, Michael Walzer (1977, 1980) defends a state-based—or as he calls it—community-based approach. The most important criterion of international legitimacy that he proposes is the criterion of non-interference. (For discussions of Walzer's proposal, see Beitz 1979a, b). Others have put forward conceptions based on state-consent. Rawls advocates a conception based on the consent of “well-ordered” (either “liberal” or “decent”) peoples (Rawls 1999; for critical discussions, see e.g. Buchanan 2000; Wenar 2002; Cavallero 2003).

The second approach takes features of individuals—their interests or their rights—as basic for legitimacy. At present, the most comprehensive contemporary philosophical treatment of international legitimacy of this kind is probably Allen Buchanan's Justice, Legitimacy, and Self-Determination (2003). As mentioned above (section 2.3.), Buchanan advocates a moralized conception of legitimacy, according to which entities are legitimate if they are morally justified to wield political power. Specifically, political legitimacy requires that a minimal standard of justice is met.

On the basis of this moralized conception of legitimacy, Buchanan argues against the state-based conception and against state consent theories of legitimacy in particular. State consent, Buchanan claims, is neither necessary nor sufficient for legitimacy. It is not sufficient because it is well-known that states tend to be the worst perpetrators in matters of human rights and there is thus need for an independent international standard of minimal justice to obtain legitimacy. It is not necessary, because international law recognizes many obligations as binding even without the consent of acting governments. As long as these obligations are compatible with the minimal standard of justice, they are legitimate even if they have arisen without state consent.

Buchanan also rejects the idea that the source of a legitimacy deficit at the international level is the inequality among states. He does not believe that states need to have equal weight in international institutions. What he regards as the main problem of legitimacy at the international level is, instead, that “a technocratic elite, lacking in democratic accountability to individuals and nonstate groups, is playing an increasingly powerful role in a system of regional and global governance” (2003: 289). The more efficient remedy for this problem, he argues, is protecting basic human rights and improving democratic accountability.

Buchanan uses his conception of legitimacy to answer the question when a political entity—as formed, for example, by secession or by union—should be recognized as legitimate. He lists three criteria (Buchanan 2003: 266ff). The first is a “minimal internal justice requirement”. It specifies how political entities should treat those upon whom it wields political power. Specifically, it requires that basic human rights are protected. This requirement includes a demand for minimal democracy. But not all political entities that satisfy this requirement deserve to be recognized as legitimate. They also need to be formed in the right way. The second criterion is thus a criterion of procedural justice and requires that a political entity has not come about through usurpation (“nonusurpation requirement”). Finally, there is a “minimal external justice requirement”. It contains conditions about how political entities should interact with one another.

Conceptions of global legitimacy broaden the scope of legitimate authority to global governance institutions. One of the precursors of global legitimacy is Kant. Kant is often read as advocating a conception of international legitimacy based on a loose “league of nations”—especially in Perpetual Peace. But Sharon Byrd and Joachim Hruschka (2008) argue that Kant, especially in The Doctrine of Right, can also be read as favoring, a “state of nation states” as the right approach to global legitimacy. This conception, while stopping short of requiring a single world state, confers more coercive political power to the global level than the league of nations, which essentially leaves untouched the sovereignty of nation states.

The philosophical literature on global legitimacy is very much in its initial stages. But it seems clear that any successful approach has to cover the following three issues. First, what are global governance institutions and in what ways can and should they be thought of as taking over roles from states or their governments? Second, what is the legitimacy problem that such governance institutions face? Is the main problem that they enjoy authority which needs justification, or that they are perceived as potentially exercising unjustified coercion? And, third, how can they solve this problem of legitimacy and what are legitimacy criteria that apply to them? How, if at all, do these criteria differ from those that apply at the level of nation states?

Buchanan and Keohane (2006) propose the following answers to these three questions. First, they claim that global governance institutions such as the WTO or the IMF “are like governments in that they issue rules and publicly attach significant consequences to compliance or failure to comply with them—and claim authority to do so” (Buchanan and Keohane 2006: 406). These institutions are set up to handle certain issues in similar fashion as national political agencies would. Just like national political institutions, they are coordination devices. Only they are created to solve problems that arise at the global level.

Joshua Cohen and Charles Sabel (2006) have a slightly broader account of global governance institutions—one that is not limited to them being coordination devices, but that emphasizes coercion instead. According to Cohen and Sabel 2006: 765), “[t]o a substantial and growing extent … rulemaking directly affecting the freedom of action of individuals, firms, and nation states (and the making of rules to regulate this rulemaking) is taking place … in global settings created by the world's nations but no longer under their effective control.”

Buchanan and Keohane endorse a view that links legitimacy to the creation of authority and treats the attempt to rule without legitimacy as an unjustified exercise of power. The attempt to rule without legitimacy raises not only a normative problem, but has direct practical consequences, as institutions that appear unjustified will not be effective. The problem of legitimacy that global governance institutions face is that even when there is widespread agreement that global institutions that can take on the role of co-ordination devices are necessary, there will be widespread disagreement about which particular institutions are necessary and what rules they should issue (Buchanan and Keohane 2006: 408ff). Cohen and Sabel (2006), similarly, relate the legitimacy problem of global governance institutions to the absence of political authority at the global level. To overcome this problem, they argue that new modes of governance must be created, with their own structures of accountability. In the terminology used here, new forms of legitimate global political authority must be created in order to properly deal with the coercive power that these institutions exercise.

In answer to the third question, Buchanan and Keohane (2006) propose a moralized conception of legitimacy: legitimacy “is the right to rule, understood to mean both that institutional agents are morally justified in making rules and attempting to secure compliance with them and that people subject to those rules have moral, content-independent reasons to follow them and/or to not interfere with others' compliance with them” (2006: 411). Substantively, they propose that an institution is morally justified in this way if it does not contribute to grave injustices (“minimal moral acceptability”), if there is no obvious alternative that would perform better (“comparative benefit”), and if it respects its own guidelines and procedures (“institutional integrity”) (Buchanan and Keohane 2006: 419ff).

An important question for political cosmopolitanism is to what extent international and global legitimacy require democracy—either at the level of national states and governments or at the level of global governance institutions. Many writers on the subject have tended to take a cautiously positive stance on this issue (e.g. Beitz, 1979, 1998; Held 1995, 2002; Buchanan 2003; Buchanan and Keohane 2006). An exception is Rawls in The Law of Peoples, however, who advocates a conception of international legitimacy that only demands that peoples and their states are well-ordered.

There are two considerations that tend to underlie the cautious attitude. One is feasibility: it is often argued that democracy at the international level, let alone at the level of global governance institutions, is utopian and cannot be realized. The second consideration is of a moral nature: that democracy should not be imposed on people and peoples who endorse a different set of values.

Cohen and Sabel (2006) seek to rescue an ideal of global democracy from more skeptical tendencies in the literature. They respond to these considerations by advocating a notion of global democracy that emphasizes the deliberative aspect. Granting to skeptics that democratic decision-making mechanisms might be problematic, they argue that deliberation is primarily what is needed to address the legitimacy deficit that global governance institutions face because of their disregard of democracy (see also Appiah 2006).


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Arendt, Hannah | authority | coercion | democracy | feminist (interventions): political philosophy | Habermas, Jürgen | Hobbes, Thomas: moral and political philosophy | justification, political: public | Kant, Immanuel: social and political philosophy | legal obligation and authority | Locke, John: political philosophy | perfectionism, in moral and political philosophy | political obligation | Rawls, John | social contract: contemporary approaches to | sovereignty


I would like to thank Thomas Pogge for his very helpful comments on earlier drafts of this entry.