# Independence and Large Cardinals

*First published Tue Apr 20, 2010*

The independence results in arithmetic and set theory led to a proliferation of mathematical systems. One very general way to investigate the space of possible mathematical systems is under the relation of interpretability. Under this relation the space of possible mathematical systems forms an intricate hierarchy of increasingly strong systems. Large cardinal axioms provide a canonical means of climbing this hierarchy and they play a central role in comparing systems from conceptually distinct domains.

This article is an introduction to independence, interpretability, large cardinals and their interrelations. Section 1 surveys the classic independence results in arithmetic and set theory. Section 2 introduces the interpretability hierarchy and describes some of its basic features. Section 3 introduces the notion of a large cardinal axiom and discusses some of the central examples. Section 4 brings together the previous themes by discussing the manner in which large cardinal axioms provide a canonical means for climbing the hierarchy of interpretability and serve as an intermediary in the comparison of systems from conceptually distinct domains. Section 5 briefly touches on some philosophical considerations.

- 1. Independence
- 2. The Interpretability Hierarchy
- 3. Large Cardinal Axioms
- 4. Large Cardinal Axioms and the Interpretability Hierarchy
- 5. Some Philosophical Considerations
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Independence

Let us begin with the notion of an *axiom system*. To motivate
this notion consider the manner in which justification traditionally
proceeds in mathematics. In reasoning about a given domain of
mathematics (or, in fact, any domain) the question of justification is
successively pushed back further and further until ultimately one
reaches principles that do not admit more fundamental justification.
The statements at this terminal stage are elected as *axioms*
and the subject is then organized in terms of derivability from the
base of axioms. In the case of arithmetic this led to the axiom
system PA (Peano arithmetic) and in the case of set theory it led
to the axiom system ZFC (Zermelo-Frankel set theory with the Axiom
of Choice).

Two natural questions arise: (1) If the axioms do not admit of more fundamental justification then how does one justify them? (2) Is the base of axioms sufficiently rich that one can settle every sentence on this basis?

There are two traditional views concerning the epistemological status
of axioms. On the first view the axioms do not admit further
justification since they are *self-evident*. On the second
view the axioms do not admit further justification since they
are *definitive of the subject matter*. Each of these views
concerning our first question leads to an associated optimistic view
concerning our second question—according to the first optimistic
view, all mathematical truths are derivable (in first-order logic)
from self-evident truths, while according to the second optimistic
view, all mathematical truths are derivable (in first-order logic)
from statements that are definitive of the subject matter. Should
either of these optimistic views turn out to be correct, then the
question of justification in mathematics would take on a particularly
simple form: Either a statement would be an axiom (in which case it
would be self-evident or definitive of the subject matter (depending
on the view under consideration)) or it would be derivable in
first-order logic from some such statements.

Unfortunately, these optimistic views came to be challenged in 1931 by Gödel's incompleteness theorems. Here is one version of the second incompleteness theorem:

Theorem 1.1(Gödel, 1931).Assume thatPAis consistent. ThenPAdoes not proveCon(PA).

Here Con(PA) is a statement of arithmetic that expresses the informal
statement that PA is consistent.^{[1]}
Under slightly stronger assumptions (for
example, that PA is Σ01-sound^{[2]}) one can
strengthen the conclusion by adding that PA does not prove
¬Con(PA); in other words, under this stronger assumption,
Con(PA) is *independent* of PA. Thus, we have here a
case of a statement of arithmetic (and, in fact, a very simple one)
that cannot be settled on the basis of the standard axioms. Moreover,
the theorem is completely general—it holds not just for PA but
for any sufficiently strong formal system *T*.

This raises a challenge for the two aforementioned optimistic views
concerning the nature of mathematical truth. To begin with it shows
that we cannot work with a *fixed* axiom system *T*. We will
always need to introduce new axioms. More importantly, it raises the
question of how one is to justify these new axioms, for as one
continues to add stronger and stronger axioms the claim that they are
either self-evident or definitive of the subject matter will grow
increasingly more difficult to defend.

Already in 1931 Gödel pointed out a natural way to justify new
axioms. He pointed out that if one moves beyond the natural numbers
and climbs the hierarchy of types (the sets of natural numbers, the
sets of sets of natural numbers, etc.) one arrives at axioms (the
axioms of second-order arithmetic PA_{2}, the axioms of third-order
arithmetic PA_{3}, etc.) that settle the undecided statements that he
discovered. The axiom system for the second level, PA_{2}, settles
the statement left undecided at the first level, namely Con(PA);
in fact, PA_{2} proves Con(PA), which is the desired result. But
now we have a problem at the second level. For the second
incompleteness theorem shows that (under similar background
assumptions to those above) PA_{2} does not settle Con(PA_{2}).
Fortunately, the axiom system for the third level, PA_{3}, settles
the statement left undecided at the second level, namely
Con(PA_{2}). This pattern continues. For every problem there is a
solution and for every solution there is a new problem. In this way,
by climbing the hierarchy of types one arrives at systems that
successively settle the consistency statements that arise along the
way.

The above hierarchy of types can be recast in the uniform setting of set theory. The set-theoretic hierarchy is defined inductively by starting with the emptyset, taking the powerset at successor stages α+1, and taking the union at limit levels λ:

V_{0}= ∅ V_{α+1}= P(V_{α})V_{λ}= ∪ _{α < λ}V_{α}

The *universe of sets* *V* is the union of all such stages:
*V*=∪_{α∈On} *V*_{α},
where On is the class of ordinals. The first infinite level
*V*_{ω} consists of all of the hereditarily finite sets^{[3]}
and this level satisfies ZFC-Infinity.
The sets at this level can be coded by natural numbers and in this way
one can show that PA and ZFC-Infinity are mutually
interpretable.^{[4]}
The second infinite level *V*_{ω+1} is
essentially *P*(ℕ) (or, equivalently, ℝ) and this
level satisfies (a theory that is mutually interpretable with)
PA_{2}. The third infinite level
*V*_{ω+2} is essentially *P*(*P*(ℕ)) (or, equivalently,
as the set of functions of real numbers) and this level satisfies (a
theory that is mutually interpretable with) PA_{3}. The first three
infinite levels thus encompass arithmetic, analysis and functional
analysis and therewith most of standard mathematics. In this fashion,
the hierarchy of sets and associated set-theoretic systems encompasses
the objects and systems of standard mathematics.

Now, should it turn out to be the case that the consistency sentences
(and the other, related sentences discovered by Gödel in 1931) were
the *only* instances of undecidable statements, then the
sequence of systems in the above hierarchy would catch every problem
that arises. And although we would never have a *single* system
that gave us a complete axiomatization of mathematical truth, we would
have a *series* of systems that collectively covered the
totality of mathematical truths.

Unfortunately, matters were not to be so simple. The trouble is that
when one climbs the hierarchy of sets in this fashion the greater
expressive resources that become available lead to more intractable
instances of undecidable sentences and this is true already of the
second and third infinite levels. For example, at the second infinite
level one can formulate the statement PM (that all projective sets
are Lebesgue measurable) and at the third infinite level one can
formulate CH (Cantor's continuum hypothesis).^{[5]}
These statements were intensively investigated during the early era
of set theory but little progress was made. The explanation was
ultimately provided by the subsequent independence techniques of
Gödel and Cohen.

Gödel invented (in 1938) the method of *inner models* by
defining the minimal inner model *L*. This model is defined just as
*V* is defined except that at successor stages instead of taking the
*full powerset* of the previous stage one takes the *definable powerset* of the previous stage, where for a given set
*X* the definable powerset Def(*X*) of *X* is the set of all
subsets of *X* that are definable over *X* with parameters from *X*:

L_{0}= ∅ L_{α+1}= Def( L_{α})L_{λ}= ∪ _{α < λ}L_{α}

The inner model *L* is the union of all such stages:
*L*
= ∪_{α∈On} *L*_{α}. Gödel
showed that *L* satisfies (arbitrarily large fragments of) ZFC
along with CH. It follows that ZFC cannot refute CH. Cohen
complemented this result by inventing (in 1963) the method
of *forcing* (or *outer models*). Given a complete
Boolean algebra **B** he defined a model
*V*^{B} and showed that ¬CH holds in *V*^{B}.^{[6]}
This had the consequence that
ZFC could not prove CH. Thus, these results together showed
that CH is independent of ZFC. Similar results hold for PM
and a host of other questions in set theory.

These instances of independence are more intractable in that no simple iteration of the hierarchy of types leads to their resolution. They led to a more profound search for new axioms.

Once again Gödel provided the first steps in the search for new
axioms. In 1946 he proposed as new axioms *large cardinal
axioms*—axioms of infinity that assert that there are very large
levels of the hierarchy of types—as new axioms and he went so far as
to entertain a generalized completeness theorem for such axioms,
according to which all statements of set theory could be settled by
such axioms (Gödel 1946, 151).

The purpose of the remainder of this entry is to describe the nature of independence (along with the hierarchy of interpretability) and the connection between independence and large cardinal axioms.

*Further Reading*: For more on the incompleteness
theorems see Smoryński (1977), Buss (1998a), and
Lindström (2003). For more on the independence techniques in
set theory see Jech (2003) and Kunen (1980).

## 2. The Interpretability Hierarchy

Our aim is to investigate the space of mathematical theories
(construed as recursively enumerable axiom systems). The ordering on
the space of such theories that we will consider is that
of *interpretability*. The informal notion of interpretability
is ubiquitous in mathematics; for example, Poincaré provided an
interpretation of two dimensional hyperbolic geometry in the Euclidean
geometry of the unit circle; Dedekind provided an interpretation of
analysis in set theory; and Gödel provided an interpretation of
the theory of formal syntax in arithmetic.

We shall use a precise formal regimentation of this informal notion.
Let *T*_{1} and *T*_{2} be recursively enumerable axiom systems. We say
that *T*_{1} is *interpretable* in *T*_{2} (*T*_{1} ≤ *T*_{2}) when,
roughly speaking, there is a translation τ from the language of
*T*_{1} to the language of *T*_{2} such that, for each sentence φ of
the language of *T*_{1}, if *T*_{1}⊢φ then
*T*_{2}⊢τ(φ).^{[7]}
We shall write *T*_{1} < *T*_{2} when *T*_{1}≤
*T*_{2} and *T*_{2}≰ *T*_{1} and we shall write *T*_{1}≡ *T*_{2} when both
*T*_{1}≤ *T*_{2} and *T*_{2}≤ *T*_{1}. In the latter case, *T*_{1} and *T*_{2}
are said to be *mutually interpretable.* The equivalence class of
all theories mutually interpretable with *T* is called the *interpretability degree of* *T*.

For ease of exposition we shall make three simplifying assumptions concerning the theories under consideration. First, we shall assume that all of our theories are couched in the language of set theory. There is no loss of generality in this assumption since every theory is mutually interpretable with a theory in this language. For example, as noted earlier, PA and ZFC-Infinity are mutually interpretable. Second, we shall assume that all of our theories contain ZFC-Infinity. Third, we shall assume that all of our theories are Σ01-sound.

The *interpretability hierarchy* is the collection of all
theories (satisfying our three simplifying assumptions) ordered under
the relation ≤. We now turn to a discussion of the structure of
this hierarchy.

To begin with, there is a useful characterization of the relation
≤. Let us write *T*_{1} ⊆ _{Π01} *T*_{2} to indicate that every
Π01-statement provable in *T*_{1} is also provable in *T*_{2}. A
central result in the theory of interpretability is that (granting our
simplifying assumptions) *T*_{1}≤ *T*_{2} iff *T*_{1} ⊆ _{Π01} *T*_{2}.
It follows from this characterization and the second incompleteness
theorem that for any theory *T* the theory *T* + Con(T) is strictly
stronger than *T*, that is,
*T* < T + Con(T). Moreover, it follows
from the arithmetized completeness theorem that the theory
*T* + ¬Con(T) is interpretable in *T*, hence,
*T* ≡ *T* + ¬Con(*T*).

In terms of interpretability there are three possible ways in which a
statement φ can be independent of a theory *T*.

- Single Jump. Only one of φ or ¬φ leads
to a jump in strength, that is,
*T*+ φ >*T*and*T*+ ¬φ ≡*T* - No Jump. Neither φ nor ¬φ lead to a
jump in strength, that is,
*T*+ φ ≡*T*and*T*+ ¬φ ≡*T*. - Double Jump. Both φ and ¬φ lead to a
jump in strength, that is,
*T*+ φ >*T*and*T*+ ¬φ >*T*.

It turns out that each of these possibilities is realized. For the
first it suffices to take the Π01-sentence Con(T). For the
second it is easy to see that there is no example that is Π01;
the simplest possible complexity of such a sentence is Δ02
and it turns out that there are such examples; examples of this type
of independence are called *Orey sentences*. For the third kind
of independence there are Π01 instances. (This is a corollary
of Lemma 14 on pages 128–129 of Lindström (2003).)

These are all metamathematical examples, the kind of example that only a logician would construct. It is natural to ask whether there are “natural” examples, roughly the sort of example occurring in the normal course of mathematics. In the set theoretic case, such examples are abundant for the first two cases. For example, PM is an example of the first kind of independence and CH is an example of the second kind of independence. There are no known “natural” examples of the third kind of independence. In the arithmetical case, such examples are rare. There are examples of the first kind of independence (the most famous of which is a classic example due to Paris and Harrington) but none of the second or third kind of independence.

Notice that in the case of the third example the two theories above
*T* are incomparable in the interpretability order. To construct a
pair of such Π01-statements one uses a reciprocal form of the
diagonal lemma to construct two Π01-statements that refer to one
another. Using such techniques can show that the interpretability
order is quite complex. For example, for any two theories *T*_{1} and
*T*_{2} such that *T*_{1} < *T*_{2} there is a third theory *T* such that
*T*_{1} < *T* < *T*_{2}. Thus, the order on the degrees of interpretability is
neither linearly ordered nor well-founded. (See Feferman (1960).)

Remarkably, it turns out that when one restricts to those theories that “arise in nature” the interpretability ordering is quite simple: There are no descending chains and there are no incomparable elements—the interpretability ordering on theories that “arise in nature” is a wellordering. In particular, although there are natural examples of the first and second kind of independence (e.g. PM and CH, respectively, something to which we will return to below), there are no known natural examples of the third kind of independence.

So, for theories that “arise in nature”, we have a wellordered hierarchy under the interpretability ordering. At the base of the ordering one has the degree that is represented by our minimal theory ZFC-Infinity and there is only one way to proceed, namely, upward in terms of strength.

We have already seen one way of climbing the hierarchy of the degrees of interpretability, namely, by adding consistency statements. There are two drawbacks to this approach. First, if one starts with a theory that “arises in nature” and adds the consistency statement one lands in a degree that has no known representative that “arises in nature”. Second, the consistency statement does not take one very far up the hierarchy. Both of these drawbacks are remedied by a very natural class of axioms—the large cardinal axioms.

*Further Reading*: For more on the structure of the
interpretability hierarchy see chapters 6–8 of Lindström
(2003).

## 3. Large Cardinal Axioms

Let Z_{0} be the theory ZFC-Infinity-Replacement. (This theory
is logically equivalent to our base theory ZFC-Infinity.) We
shall successively strengthen Z_{0} by reflectively adding axioms that
assert certain levels of the universe of sets exist.

The standard model of Z_{0} is *V*_{ω}. The Axiom of Infinity (in
one formulation) simply asserts that this set exists. So, when we add
the Axiom of Infinity, the resulting theory Z_{1} (known as Zermelo
set theory with Choice) not only proves the consistency of Z_{0}; it
proves that there is a standard model of Z_{0}. Now the standard
model of Z_{1} is *V*_{ω+ω}. The Axiom of Replacement
implies that this set exists. So, when we add the Axiom of
Replacement, the resulting theory Z_{2} (known as ZFC), not only
proves the consistency of Z_{1}; it proves that there is a standard
model of Z_{1}.

A standard model of Z_{2} has the
form *V*_{κ} where κ is a regular cardinal
such that for all α < κ, 2^{α} <
κ. Such a cardinal is called a
(*strongly*) *inaccessible* cardinal. The next axiom in
the hierarchy under consideration is the statement asserting that such
a cardinal exists. The resulting theory
ZFC + “There is a
strongly inaccessible cardinal” proves that there is a level of
the universe that satisfies ZFC. Continuing in this fashion one
arrives at stronger and stronger axioms that assert the existence of
larger and larger levels of the universe of sets. Before continuing
with an outline of such axioms let us first draw the connection with
the hierarchy of interpretability.

Recall our classification of the three types of independence. We noted that there are no known natural examples of the third kind of independence but that there are natural examples of the first and second kind of independence.

Natural examples of the second kind of independence are provided by the dual method of inner and outer models. For example, these methods show that the theories ZFC+CH and ZFC+ ¬CH are mutually interpretable with ZFC, that is, all three theories lie in the same degree. In other words, CH is an Orey sentence with respect to ZFC. What about that other sentence we introduced: PM?

Using the method of inner models Gödel showed that ¬PM holds
in *L*. It follows that ZFC+ ¬PM is mutually interpretable with
ZFC. But what about PM? To show that ZFC+PM is mutually
interpretable with ZFC a natural approach would be to follow the
approach used for CH and build an outer model of ZFC that
satisfies PM. However, it is known that this cannot be done
starting with ZFC alone. For it turns out (by a result of
Shelah (1984)) that ZFC+PM implies the consistency of
ZFC and this implies, by the second incompleteness theorem, that
ZFC+PM is not interpretable in ZFC. In a sense we have here a
case of the independence of independence. More precisely, even if we
assume that ZFC is consistent we cannot (in contrast to the case of
CH) prove that PM is independent of ZFC. To establish the
independence of PM from ZFC we need to assume the consistency of
a *stronger* theory, namely, that of
ZFC + “There is a strongly inaccessible
cardinal”. For it turns out that ZFC+PM lies not in the
interpretability degree of ZFC but rather in that
of ZFC + “There is a strongly
inaccessible cardinal”. To summarize: While CH is a case of the
first type independence, PM is a case of the second type independence;
it is similar to Con(ZFC) in that it is a sentence φ such that
only one of φ or ¬φ leads to a jump in strength, only now
there are two differences; the jump lands in a degree that is much
stronger and it is represented by a natural theory.

In general, the (known) sentences of set theory are either like CH or PM. Some are like CH in that both ZFC+φ and ZFC+ ¬φ lie in the degree of ZFC. Others are like PM in that one of ZFC+φ and ZFC+ ¬φ lies in the degree of ZFC while the other lies in the degree of an extension of ZFC via a large cardinal axiom.

Let us now return to our overview of large cardinal axioms. After strongly inaccessible cardinals there are Mahlo cardinals, indescribable cardinals, and ineffable cardinals. All of these large cardinal axioms can be derived in a uniform way using the traditional variety of reflection principles (see Tait 2005) but there are limitations on how far this variety of reflection principles can take one. For under a very general characterization of such principles it is known that they cannot yield the Erdős cardinal κ(ω). See Koellner (2009).

The large cardinals considered thus far (including κ(ω))
are known as *small* large cardinals. A large cardinal is *small* if the associated large cardinal axiom can hold in
Gödel's constructible universe *L*, that is, if
“*V* ⊨ κ is a
φ-cardinal” is consistent, then
“*L* ⊨ κ is a
φ-cardinal” is consistent. Otherwise the large cardinal is *large*.

There is a simple template for formulating (large) large cardinal
axioms is in terms of elementary embeddings. In general such an axiom
asserts that there is a transitive class *M* and a non-trivial
elementary embedding

j:V→M.

To say that the embedding is non-trivial is just to say that it is not
the identity, in which case there must be a least ordinal that is
moved. This ordinal is called the *critical point of j* and
denoted crit(*j*). The critical point is (typically) the large
cardinal associated with the embedding. A cardinal κ is said to be
*measurable* iff it is the critical point of some such
embedding.^{[8]}

It is easy to see that for any such
embedding *V*_{κ+1}⊆ *M* where
κ = crit(*j*). This amount of agreement enables one to
show that κ is strongly inaccessible, Mahlo, indescribable,
ineffable, etc. To illustrate this let us assume that we have shown
that κ is strongly inaccessible and let us show that κ has
much stronger large cardinal properties. Since κ is strongly
inaccessible in *V* and since
(*V*_{κ+1})^{M}
=*V*_{κ+1}, *M* also thinks that κ
is strongly inaccessible. In particular, *M* thinks that there
is a strongly inaccessible cardinal (namely, κ)
below *j*(κ). But then by the elementarity of
*j*, *V* must think the same think of the preimage of
*j*(κ), namely, κ, that is, *V* must think that
there is a strongly inaccessible below κ. So κ cannot
be the least strongly inaccessible cardinal. Continuing in this
manner one can show that there are many strongly inaccessibles below
κ and, in fact, that κ is Mahlo, indescribable,
ineffable, etc. So measurable cardinals subsume the small large
cardinals.

In fact, Scott showed that (in contrast to the small large cardinals)
measurable cardinals cannot exist in Gödel's constructible universe.
Let us be precise about this. Let *V*=*L* be the statement that
asserts that all sets are constructible. Then for each small large
cardinal axiom φ (to be precise, those listed above) if the
theory ZFC+φ is consistent then so is the theory
ZFC+φ+*V*=*L*. In contrast, the theory ZFC + “There is a
measurable cardinal” proves ¬*V*=*L*. This may seem somewhat
counterintuitive since *L* contains all of the ordinals and so if κ
is a measurable cardinal then κ is an ordinal in *L*. The point is
that *L* cannot “recognize” that κ is a measurable cardinal since
it is too “thin” to contain the ultrafilter that witnesses the
measurability of κ.

One way to strengthen a large cardinal axiom based on the above
template is to demand greater agreement between *M* and *V*. For
example, if one demands that *V*_{κ+2}⊆ *M* then the fact that
κ is measurable (something witnessed by a subset of *P*(κ))
can be recognized by *M*. And so, by exactly the same argument that
we used above, there must be a measurable cardinal below κ.

This leads to a progression of increasingly strong large cardinal axioms. It will be useful to discuss some of the major stepping stones in this hierarchy.

If κ is a cardinal and η>κ is an ordinal then
κ is η-*strong* if there is a transitive
class *M* and a non-trivial elementary embedding
*j*: *V* → *M* such that crit(*j*)=κ,
*j*(κ)>η
and *V*_{η}⊆ *M*. A cardinal κ
is *strong* iff it is η-strong for all η>κ.
One can also demand that the embedding preserve certain classes:
If *A* is a class, κ is a cardinal, and η>κ
is an ordinal then κ is η-*A*-*strong* if
there exists a *j*: *V* → *M* which witnesses that κ
is η-strong and which has the additional feature that
*j*(*A* ∩ *V*_{κ})
∩ *V*_{η} = *A*
∩ *V*_{η}. The following large cardinal notion
plays a central role in the search for new axioms.

Definition 3.1. A cardinal κ is aWoodin cardinalif κ is strongly inaccessible and for allA⊆V_{κ}there is a cardinal κ_{A}< κ such thatκfor each η such that κ_{A}is η-A-strong,_{A}< η < κ.^{[9]}

One can obtain stronger large cardinal axioms by forging a link
between the embedding *j* and the amount of resemblance between *M*
and *V*. For example, a cardinal κ is *superstrong* if there
is a transitive class *M* and a non-trivial elementary embedding
*j*: *V* → *M* such that crit(*j*)=κ and
*V*_{j(κ)}⊆ *M*. If κ is
superstrong then κ is a Woodin cardinal and there are arbitrarily
large Woodin cardinals below κ.

One can also obtain strong large cardinal axioms by placing closure
conditions on the target model *M*. For example, letting γ ≥ κ a
cardinal κ is *γ-supercompact* if there is a
transitive class *M* and a non-trivial elementary embedding *j*: *V* → *M*
such that crit(*j*)=κ and ^{γ}*M*⊆ *M*, that is, *M* is closed
under γ-sequences. (It is straightforward to see that if *M* is
closed under γ-sequences then *H*(γ^{+})⊆ *M*; so this approach
subsumes the previous approach.) A cardinal κ is *supercompact* if it is γ-supercompact for all γ ≥ κ. Now,
just as in the previous approach, one can strengthen these axioms by
forging a link between the embedding *j* and the closure conditions on
the target model. A cardinal κ is *n-huge* if there is
a transitive class *M* and a non-trivial elementary embedding *j*:*V* →
*M* such that ^{j n(κ)}*M* ⊆ *M*, where κ=crit(*j*) and
*j* ^{i+1}(κ) is defined to be *j*(*j* ^{i}(κ)).

One can continue in this vein, demanding greater agreement between *M*
and *V*. The ultimate axiom in this direction would, of course,
demand that *M* = *V*. This axiom was proposed by Reinhardt and shortly
thereafter shown to be inconsistent (in ZFC) by Kunen. In fact,
Kunen showed that, assuming ZFC, there can be a transitive class
*M* and a non-trivial elementary
embedding *j*: *V* → *M* such that
*j* ‘‘ λ ∈ M, where
λ=sup_{n < ω} *j* ^{n}(κ) and
κ=crit(*j*). In particular, there cannot exists such
an *M* and
*j* such that *V*_{λ+1}⊆ *M*. This placed a limit on the
amount of closure of the target model (in relation to the
embedding).^{[10]}

Nevertheless, there is a lot of room below the above upper bound. For
example, a very strong axiom is the statement that there is a
non-trivial elementary embedding *j*:*V*_{λ+1}→ *V*_{λ+1}. The
strongest large cardinal axiom in the current literature is the axiom
asserting that there is a non-trivial elementary embedding
*j*: *L*(*V*_{λ+1})→ *L*(*V*_{λ+1}) such that crit(*j*)<λ. In recent
work, Woodin has discovered axioms much stronger than this.

*Further Reading*: For more on large cardinal axioms
see Kanamori (2003).

## 4. Large Cardinal Axioms and the Interpretability Hierarchy

The large cardinal axioms discussed above are naturally well-ordered
in terms of strength.^{[11]}
This provides a natural way of climbing the hierarchy of
interpretability. At the base we start with the theory
ZFC-Infinity and then we climb to ZFC and up through
ZFC+Φ for various large cardinal axioms Φ. Notice that for
two large cardinal axioms Φ and Ψ, if Ψ is stronger
than Φ then Ψ implies that there is a standard model of
Φ and so we have a natural interpretation of ZFC+Φ in
ZFC+Ψ.

We have already noted that ZFC+¬PM is mutually interpretable
with ZFC+LC where LC is the large cardinal axiom “There is a
strongly inaccessible cardinal” and that this is shown using the dual
techniques of inner and outer model theory. It is a remarkable
empirical fact that for *any* “natural” statement in the
language of set theory φ one can generally find a large cardinal
axiom Φ such that ZFC+φ and ZFC+Φ are mutually
interpretable. Again, this is established using the dual techniques
of inner and outer model theory only now large cardinals enter the
mix. To establish that ZFC+Φ interprets ZFC+φ one
generally starts with a model of ZFC+Φ and uses forcing to
construct a model of ZFC+φ. In many cases the forcing
construction involves “collapsing” the large cardinal associated
with Φ and arranging the collapse in such a way that φ holds
in the “rubble”. In the other direction, one generally starts with
a model of ZFC+φ and then constructs an inner model (a model
resembling *L* but able to accommodate large cardinal axioms) that
contains the large cardinal asserted to exist by Φ. The branch of
set theory known as *inner model theory* is devoted to the
construction of such “*L*-like” models for stronger and stronger
large cardinal axioms.

In this way the theories of the form ZFC+LC, where LC is a large cardinal axiom, provide a yardstick for measuring the strength of theories. They also act as intermediaries for comparing theories from conceptually distinct domains: Given ZFC+φ and ZFC+ψ one finds large cardinal axioms Φ and Ψ such that (using the methods of inner and outer models) ZFC+φ and ZFC+Φ are mutually interpretable and ZFC+ψ and ZFC+Ψ are mutually interpretable. One then compares ZFC+φ and ZFC+ψ (in terms of interpretability) by mediating through the natural interpretability relationship between ZFC+Φ and ZFC+Ψ. So large cardinal axioms (in conjunction with the dual method of inner and outer models) lie at the heart of the remarkable empirical fact that natural theories from completely distinct domains can be compared in terms of interpretability.

## 5. Some Philosophical Considerations

The main question that arises in light of the independence results is whether one can justify new axioms that settle the statements left undecided by the standard axioms. There are two views. On the first view, the answer is taken to be negative and one embraces a radical form of pluralism in which one has a plethora of equally legitimate extensions of the standard axioms. On the second view, the answer it taken (at least in part) to be affirmative, and the results simply indicate that ZFC is too weak to capture the mathematical truths. This topic is quite involved and lies outside the scope of the present article.

But there are other philosophical questions more directly related to the themes of this article. First, what is the significance of the empirical fact that the large cardinal axioms appear to be wellordered under interpretability? Second, what is the significance of the empirical fact that large cardinal axioms play a central role in comparing many theories from conceptually distinct domains. Let us consider these two questions in turn.

One might try to argue that the fact that the large cardinal axioms
are wellordered under interpretability is a consideration in their
favour. However, this would be a weak argument. For, as we have
noted above, *all* “natural” theories appear to be wellordered
under interpretability and this includes theories that are
incompatible with one another. For example, it is straightforward to
select “natural” theories from higher and higher degrees of theories
in the wellordered sequence that are incompatible with one another.
It follows that the feature of being wellordered under
interpretability, while remarkable, can not be a point in favour of
truth.

But large cardinal axioms have additional features that singles them out from the class of natural theories in the wellordered sequence of degrees. To begin with they provide the most natural way to climb the hierarchy of interpretability—they are the simplest and most natural manifestation of pure mathematical strength. But more important is the second component mentioned above, namely, the large cardinal axioms act as intermediaries in comparing theories from conceptually distinct domains. For recall how this works: Given ZFC+φ and ZFC+ψ one finds large cardinal axioms Φ and Ψ such that (using the methods of inner and outer models) ZFC+φ and ZFC+Φ are mutually interpretable and ZFC+ψ and ZFC+Ψ are mutually interpretable. One then compares ZFC+φ and ZFC+ψ (in terms of interpretability) by mediating through the natural interpretability relationship between ZFC+Φ and ZFC+Ψ.

It turns out that in many cases this is the *only known way* to
compare ZFC+φ and ZFC+ψ, that is, in many cases there is
no direct interpretation in either direction, instead one *must
pass through the large cardinal axioms.* Can this additional
feature be used to make a case for large cardinal axioms? The answer
is unclear. However, what is clear is the absolute centrality of
large cardinal axioms in set theory.

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## Related Entries

choice, axiom of | continuum hypothesis | Gödel, Kurt | Gödel, Kurt: incompleteness theorem | set theory | set theory: alternative axiomatic theories | set theory: large cardinals and determinacy