Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Nov 15, 2004; substantive revision Thu Nov 4, 2010

There are various ways of defining ‘idiolect’, but for the purposes of this entry an idiolect is a language (or some part or aspect of a language) that can be characterized exhaustively in terms of intrinsic properties of some single person, the person whose idiolect it is. The main force of ‘intrinsic’ is to exclude essential reference to features of the person's wider linguistic community, and perhaps too of their physical environment.

Some hold that idiolects in this sense do not exist, or even that the notion is incoherent, but are happy to use the word ‘idiolect’ to mean something else, such as a person's partial grasp of, or pattern of deviance from, language that is inherently communal. The substantial debate, here, is not over how to define a word, but over whether a broadly idiolectal perspective is to be preferred to a non-idiolectal one. Someone taking an idiolectal perspective on language regards idiolects (in something like the first sense above) as having ontological and/or investigative priority over social languages, which are conceived of as more or less overlapping idiolects. A non-idiolectal perspective reverses this priority.

The terms of the debate over priority are not so black and white as this suggests. For one thing, there is scope, in theory, for a spectrum of views. Perhaps we should be idiolectal when thinking about language acquisition but not when thinking about truth and reference in a mature speaker's speech; perhaps most expressions are to be understood idiolectally but proper names, for example, or natural kind and technical terms, are an exception; and perhaps we should recognise two kinds of linguistic content, only one of which is best thought of in idiolectal terms. Moreover, even someone taking a strongly idiolectal stance will want to qualify the definition of ‘idiolect’ given above—by tying its properties to the person at a specified time, in a specified social setting, or on a specified occasion, for example, or by treating the idiolect as belonging not to a real individual but to a person who is in some respects an idealization.

Several important debates feature talk of languages that are more idiolectal than social. Some are considered in detail in other entries (see the entries on language of thought hypothesis, private language, and externalism about mental content). This entry will concentrate instead on two influential and broadly idiolectal positions in the philosophy of language and linguistics: Noam Chomsky's preference for I-languages over E-languages (Section 2), and Donald Davidson's rejection of languages conceived as shared conventional structures that make communication possible (Section 3). David Lewis's claim that languages are a convention is a common target for both, and is outlined in an Appendix. The entry begins (Section 1) with some general remarks about the ontology of languages.

1. Language Ontology

1.1. Idiolects versus Social Languages

Key to the notion of an idiolect is the fact that the same natural language, L, can be individuated in either of two ways:

L = the language with specific (semantic, syntactic, phonological, etc.) properties.

L = the language possessed by a specific individual or population.

French, for example, is the language in which the colour red is expressed by the word rouge, which starts with a voiced uvular fricative, and so forth. But French is also the commonest first language of residents of France, Belgium, Côte d'Ivoire, Quebec, various Swiss cantons, etc. There is no limit to the number of languages we could conjure up in the abstract using the first mode of description. But only a certain number of them will be realized, in the sense of being describable in the second mode as possessed, known, spoken, understood, or used by some individual or population.

Understanding how best to take the assertion that a natural language, as individuated in the clauses of a linguistic theory, is realized in (possessed by, etc.) a particular individual or population is a tricky matter. It is also fundamental to any philosophy of language. But however we interpret the notion of realization, a social language is a language (or some part or aspect of a language) individuated by reference to a plurality whereas an idiolect is a language (or some part, etc.) individuated by reference to an individual (perhaps an individual at a time or on an occasion, and perhaps an individual who is in some sense an idealization).

Although the properties of x's idiolect are tied stipulatively to intrinsic properties of x, this does not mean that two distinct individuals could not share an idiolect in principle, or have significantly overlapping idiolects in practice. Nor does it mean that one person's idiolect cannot shape someone else's. What makes a perspective on language idiolectal is commitment to an ontology of languages that may more or less overlap and may influence each other, but that above all have realization conditions that turn, somehow, only on the intrinsic properties of a single person. In contrast, non-idiolectal perspectives require an ontology of languages that can be grasped more or less adequately by its possessors, with the properties of the language itself depending on characteristics of the community and not any specific member of that community.

Chomsky and Davidson have different understandings of what it is for a single person to realize an idiolect, though how far these different emphases reflect distinct but compatible agendas rather than fundamentally competing visions is not immediately clear.

For Chomsky, a language is realized in an individual if it is ‘represented’ in that individual's ‘language faculty’, a component of their brain. The goal of linguists working in the Chomskian tradition is to make what is represented explicit in the form of a theory. For all that, the brain properties that interest Chomsky are species-wide rather than unique to an individual. This seems paradoxical given the individualism that seems to follow from taking idiolects rather than social languages as one's focus. But as will become clear (Section 2), Chomsky's ambition has been to understand what it is about humans in general that enables them to develop adult linguistic competence given their environment. Thinking of languages as shared or communal objects does not, in his view, help in the development of an empirically plausible theory of this process. Rather, it is a distraction.

Central to Davidson's philosophy of language is his claim that the meaning of a language can and should take the form of a Tarski-like truth theory for that language (see the entry on Davidson, Donald for more on that idea). This raises the question of what it would be for a language for which we have a truth theory to be realized in a person or population. Neo-Davidsonians (e.g. Larson and Segal 1995) adopt the straightforward view that realization consists in someone's knowing the truth theory, albeit tacitly; this tacit knowledge is, by hypothesis, partly what enables them to produce and interpret speech appropriately when in the company of others with the same tacit knowledge. Davidson himself, under the influence of Quine's behaviourism (Quine 1960; see Davidson 1976, 1986, 1990), is reluctant to attribute knowledge, tacit or otherwise, to speakers or their interpreters. But this disagreement is less interesting in the present context than Davidson's 1986 claim that there are in fact no such things as languages, or at least, not in the sense that philosophers have tended to suppose. In particular there is no structured entity, shared in advance by speakers and hearers, that accounts for their ability to determine the truth-conditional meaning of one another's utterances. What there is instead is the topic of Section 3 below.

1.2. The Case against English and Other Folk Languages

The folk tend to operate with an ontology of social languages that most linguists reject. The folk ontology includes English, Hungarian, Tagalog, Old Norse, etc., and their belief in this ontology has real effects, which politicians are sensitive to and which sociologists can study. But the objects themselves, as opposed to the folk's beliefs in and about them, are generally regarded as fictional. Although a label like ‘Hungarian’ will inevitably be used in practice by linguists, it is normally supposed to be taken as a convenient shorthand for ‘the idiolect of some typical inhabitant of Hungary’.

Grounds for rejecting folk ontologies of language vary. Some argue that determining a folk language's properties is, unavoidably, a prescriptive (and so unscientific) exercise. An example often used to illustrate this charge is the meaning of English word ‘livid’. Some dictionaries give its meaning as ‘pale or bluish’, in deference to etymology and standard usage of ‘livide’ among French speakers. Most English speakers lean towards thinking it means red. Similarly, and to the consternation of many who claim to know what English really is, English speakers regularly split infinitives, and see the use of ‘hopefully’ in (1) as no less acceptable than its use in (2), despite being a ‘Germanism’.

(1) Hopefully, all the passengers will escape by helicopter.

(2) The passengers looked hopefully at the helicopter.

The problem with these and similar judgements (see Crystal 2007 for an entertaining account of their history) is not that they are obnoxiously conservative. Often they aren't (e.g. some dictionaries now include red as a possible meaning of ‘livid’). It is normativity per se, not prim prescriptivism in particular, that is incompatible with the scientific outlook (save as an object of investigation in the social sciences). Even liberal views on acceptability are essentially normative: ‘If a significant minority of the population want to split their infinitives, then splitting infinitives is okay’, or ‘If the use of a word is found to have occurred in print with a novel meaning five times, that meaning belongs in our dictionary’. In so far as such normativity is unavoidable in the determination of the properties of English and other languages in the folk ontology, that ontology looks ill-suited for use in science.

Notice that opposition to normativity and prescriptivism is not built into the very notion of an idiolect. Someone could, without self-contradiction, judge that some idiolects are better than others, perhaps even because they are in keeping with a communal norm. The thrust of the argument just described is merely that to rid oneself of this kind of prescriptivism, an idiolectal view is required, presumably one from which any normativity has been filtered out. But what if it cannot be filtered out? That is, what if normativity is ineliminable even from an idiolectal conception of language? Someone could hold, for example, that meaning, even idiolectal meaning, is essentially normative in the following respect: for the word apple in S's (idiosyncratic) idiolect to mean the set of things that are either apples or pears is for S to somehow endorse using it to pick out anything inside this set and prescribe against using it any other way. Anyone invoking the anti-prescriptivist argument described above needs to be on the lookout, then, for other potential species of linguistic normativity, such as this alleged normativity even of idiolectal meaning, in case these undermine their case. (See the entry on the normativity of meaning and content for more on this topic.)

A distinct but related case against the folk ontology is that the delineation of a population as speakers of a single language is invariably driven by geo-political considerations. Serbo-Croatian ceased to exist as a language along with the old Yugoslavia in the 1990s. Some dialects of the Netherlands are closer in linguistic properties to dialects of neighbouring Germany than they are to dialects spoken on the Dutch coast, despite being grouped with the latter but not the former as variants of the same language, Dutch. The concern here is not well captured in the observation that languages in the folk sense are fuzzy. The special sciences are replete with fuzziness. Rather, the individuation conditions seem arbitrary from a linguistic perspective. The same arguments against languages in the folk sense apply at the level of dialects in the folk sense. Cockneys, and hence speakers of the cockney dialect, are traditionally required to have been born within earshot of the bells of Bow Church in east London, but noise pollution and expansion of the financial district have rendered that definition absurd. No matter how fine-grained a version of the folk ontology one seeks out, similar problems will recur. For these reasons, if linguists countenance countable languages at all, they usually think in terms of idiolects.

Not everyone is won over to the idiolectal view by these arguments:

2. Chomsky on I-languages and E-languages

2.1 The Origins of Chomsky's Distinction: Competence vs. Performance

Chomsky's distinction between I- and E-languages is a more recent incarnation of his earlier distinction between linguistic competence and linguistic performance. Linguistic competence is the underlying knowledge that gives rise to linguistic performance, i.e. observable behaviour. Chomsky put this contrast to work in criticizing scientific behaviourism (Skinner 1957; Chomsky 1959, 1965: 4–5; see the entry on Behaviorism).

The word ‘competence’ in this context was often misinterpreted. Chomsky did not have in mind the competence we talk of when we say that someone ‘has only weak competence in Spanish’. Competence in that sense is a normative notion. Someone with poor Spanish, or a child who is on their way to adult competence, nevertheless has a competence in Chomsky's sense. Equally, competence in Chomsky's sense is indirectly related to but not constituted by the behavioural ability a person may have to speak or write as they do. To suppose otherwise would be to erase the very distinction Chomsky is insisting on between underlying knowledge and the performance made possible by this underlying knowledge. ‘Competence’, then, is to be interpreted as picking out a hypothetical body of unconscious knowledge that plays a role in but is not exhausted by its possessor's linguistic performance. This knowledge is embodied in a discrete language faculty, a component of the human brain.

One simple empirical reason for suspecting that the distinction between competence and performance corresponds to a difference in reality is that people occasionally lose the overt ability to speak or understand a language, only to re-acquire the ability later on, more or less instantaneously, with no re-learning required. The most plausible explanation of this recovery is that something—by hypothesis the patient's linguistic competence—never really went away. Only the temporary loss of a performance mechanism prevented it manifesting itself.

Behaviourist theories and methodology were intended to yield generalizations over performance per se, rather than discoveries about the competence that is manifest in but not constituted by this performance. A theme of Chomsky's criticisms of this ambition was that linguistic performance is an interaction effect, with contributing factors additional to core linguistic competence including:

On the production side: Decisions over what to say, which words to use, how loud to speak, whether to speak in English, whether to use an idiom and if so which, whether to speak on the phone or send an email, as well as the presence or absence of verbal tics, hiccups, and whether one has a functioning larynx, whether those components of one's brain that enable vocalization are in good working order, etc.

On the understanding side: Whether a passing jet plane is drowning out all sound, whether one's capacity to distinguish phonemes is affected by, say, a stroke, whether one has functioning short-term memory, etc.

Trying to explain and predict performance is bound to fail. This failure can be hidden in practice only by smuggling in unacknowledged idealizations, as with Skinner's reliance on laboratory conditions to suppress the effects of humans' capacity to make free and rational decisions. Better, then, to idealize in the very conception of what one is trying to do, and aim to understand competence, not performance.

This is what drives Chomsky's alternative agenda: to investigate linguistic competence rather than the phenomena that linguistic competence gives rise to in combination with a myriad of other factors—including the relatively distal ones listed above, but more immediately the cognitive systems that interface directly with the language faculty: the conceptual-intentional, perceptual, and speech-production systems. Performance phenomena are vital sources of evidence for any theory of competence but a complete understanding of them, he suggests, is beyond the scope of scientific investigation.

Chomsky's preferred terminology has shifted over the years but his underlying concern with what speakers unconsciously know (or ‘believe’, or ‘cognize’ or ‘represent’) rather than with how they put that knowledge to use has remained. The distinction he draws between I-languages and E-languages is another incarnation of something like the same contrast. The former are suitable as objects for scientific investigation, while the latter are not (save perhaps for the scientific investigation of what are acknowledged to be mere folk beliefs).

2.2 Chomsky's Distinction Elaborated

The canonical statement of the distinction is in Chomsky 1986, Ch. 2 (see also his 1988; 1995; 2000). The ‘I’ in ‘I-language’ stands for ‘internal’. An I-language is an abstract state the ‘mind/brain’ can be in, an informational state or state of knowledge. In other words, it is a state of competence in the sense elaborated above. The ‘E’ in ‘E-language’ stands for ‘external’. The properties of an E-language are ‘independent of the properties of the mind/brain’ (1986: 20) and in particular of the language module of the E-language's possessor, being determined at least partially by external characteristics such as overt behaviour or the social or physical environment. Folk languages could be regarded as E-languages, but Chomsky does not have the folk in mind so much as philosophers who are explicitly or implicitly behaviourist in their assumptions.

‘I’ and ‘E’ are occasionally said by Chomsky to stand for terms other than ‘internalist’ and ‘externalist’. ‘I’ is sometimes said to stand for ‘individualistic’ and ‘intensionalist’, with ‘E’ sometimes standing for ‘extensionalist’ (e.g., Chomsky 1995: 26). A simple way through the potential confusion of this is to take the ‘internal/external’ contrast outlined above as basic, and see him as suggesting that the other viewpoints tend to group together under the I-language and E-language rubrics. Whether they really do line up as neat packages in this way may or may not be important to the utility of the distinct contrasts or to Chomsky's preference for the I-language side over the E-language side.

The equation of ‘I-language’ with ‘individualistic’ is not clear at first, since some approaches that it would be proper to classify on the E-language side of Chomsky's contrast—Quine's, for example—are concerned with an individual's overt behaviour. But when one considers why Quine and others regard overt behaviour as the arbiter of what language a person speaks, their non-individualism becomes apparent. For Quine, what a person means when they speak is a matter of what it would be reasonable for others to interpret them as meaning. Observable behaviour is all the others would have to go on, Quine supposes. Anything entirely internal would be hidden and hence otiose so far as communication is concerned. It is this concern with what is observable by others that makes Quine's view both non-individualistic and non-internalistic.

The contrast between ‘intensionalist’ and ‘extensionalist’ conceptions of languages is more precise, and maps more readily onto the internalist/externalist contrast just outlined. The terminology here derives from ways of specifying sets. To specify a set extensionally is just to list its members, for example as:

{2, 3, 5, 6, 7}

To specify a set intensionally is to give a rule for its generation. For example, the set above could be specified using either of two extensionally equivalent intensions:

{x: x is less than ten and is either a prime positive integer or is the product of two distinct prime positive integers}

{x: x is a positive integer greater than one and less than ten, and there are no positive integers among its square or cube roots}

Likewise, abstract properties of a language could, in principle, be generated using alternative intensions or rule systems. For example, suppose a mapping of vocabulary strings onto ‘Grammatical/Ungrammatical’ could be effected using a rule system that derives passive constructions from active ones. Suppose further that this same mapping could be effected using a rule system that derives active constructions from passive ones. These two rules systems would be extensionally equivalent but intensionally distinct (Quine 1970). Similarly, two extensionally equivalent semantic theories could assign identical truth conditions to sentences in a language despite pairing the same proper name with distinct objects (Wallace 1977).

In its extentionalist/intensionalist guise, the E/I contrast comes to this. Let L be the language that is possessed by (realized in) a given user of language or speech community, under some conception of the realization relation. That conception is an extensionalist one if, were some theory θ to characterise L correctly, so too would any theory θ* that is extensionally equivalent to θ (Figure 1).

Figure 1: If an E-language is correctly described by a theory, it is correctly described by extentional equivalents of that theory

For example, if what determines whether you possess English is that you make a suitable division of strings of vocabulary into the grammatical and the ungrammatical, there is no fact of the matter as to whether English is a passive-from-active or an active-from-passive language. By contrast, the conception will be intensionalist if discrimination can and ought to be made between extensionally equivalent theories that differ in their internal derivational structure (Figure 2).

Figure 2: I-languages can be described correctly by one theory but not by extensional equivalents of that theory

So why is this intensionalist/extensionalist contrast supposed to track the internalist/externalist contrast?

To illustrate how externalism can give rise to extensionalism, take the Quinean thought that a language is realized in a person if, and only if, it captures their dispositions to assent to particular sentences in particular circumstances (or ‘stimulus conditions’). This is an externalist position for reasons explained already. But it is also extensionalist since any theory of this language—for Quine, any two translation manuals for the language—will be equally adequate if they pair the same sentences with the same stimulus conditions, no matter how radically they differ in their clauses or derivational structures (Quine 1960). Another example: according to Lewis, a population realizes a language if it is governed by a convention that allows them to co-ordinate effectively with one another by uttering sentences of the language. This is an externalist view. A language, for him, is just a pairing of sentences with the meanings they are assigned under this convention, and a theory of the language is correct just in case it entails this pairing. In principle, two theories could differ in their internal structure but agree over which sentences are paired with which meanings (Lewis 1975: 175–178; see the Appendix for details). So it is an extensional view too. At a very general level, what drives both Quine and Lewis is the assumption that to possess a language is to have an ability. So long as the output of a theory of this language, its theorems, matches this ability, the theory's internal structure is irrelevant. The theorems can be thought of as describing a function in extension. How the function is described in intension, i.e. what the theory's internal clauses are, adds nothing to the description of the ability. Internal theoretical structure may be relevant to how the ability is possessed, but how the ability is possessed is distinct from the ability itself.

Conversely, an internalist approach is supposed to require discrimination between extensionally equivalent but intensionally distinct theories. Suppose θ is proffered as a theory of an individual speaker's competence, i.e., as an explicit statement of what they know, where this is internal in the sense that having such knowledge consists in facts about a speaker's brain rather than in overt performance. A different theory, θ*, might agree with θ in its output yet fail to capture the knowledge as it is represented, somehow, in the speaker's mind.

Even internalists would allow that some linguistic theories are merely notational variants of one another. At what point does notational variation become empirically important divergence? With mixed success, some philosophers have tried to spell out a criterion for empirical significance in terms of whether the structure of a theory of L is isomorphic to the structure of the realization of L in the brain of a given speaker.[1] For Chomsky, a difference between two extensionally equivalent theories is significant if, even though both are descriptively adequate, only one is explanatorily adequate. To see what he means by this we need to turn to his motives for adopting an I-language perspective. These are grounded in his nativism about language.

2.3 Why I-languages? Why not E-languages?

The main reason Chomsky offers for adopting the I-language perspective is that to study I-languages is to study something ‘more real’ than E-languages.[2] Claims of relative reality are difficult to quantify, and this assertion has more bite when interpreted, as is apparently intended, as the assertion that I-languages have their place in a scientific study when there is no corresponding scientific study within which E-languages can be embedded.

The scientific study to which the notion of an I-language belongs is, unsurprisingly, the Chomskian one. This seeks among other things to understand how we acquire language. Language acquisition can be thought of as a development through states of the brain from S0 through intermediate states into a relatively stable mature state, SM. S0 is the initial state common to all humans, idealizing away from differences that have nothing to do with language and away from specifically linguistic impairments. Subsequent states arise through exposure to a particular linguistic environment. Nothing so far requires that these states be thought of as representational states of knowing a language. But thinking of them this way makes it easier to state and evaluate the difference between empiricist and nativist theories of language acquisition. Suppose that to be in state SL is to know a language L, knowledge that a linguist might in principle make explicit in a theory of L. This is to conceive of language acquisition as a process in which children move through a sequence of states of knowledge of different languages—or I-languages, to prevent confusion with uses of ‘language’ in anything other than this sense. The empiricist/nativist debate can now be couched as a debate over what linguistic information must already be represented in the initial state S0 if information supplied by the linguistic environment is to culminate in knowledge of the mature language M. Empiricists claim that none is.[3] Nativists claim that some is provided, in the form of innate knowledge of a language, dubbed Universal Grammar (UG) by Chomsky (figure 3).

Figure 3: Competing empiricist and nativist accounts of language acquisition contrasted

The entry on innateness and language goes into this debate in greater detail. My concern here is with how the notion of an I-language sits within it. According to the nativist argument from the poverty of the stimulus, for example, the information in a child's environment is radically insufficient to account for developments in her competence, so anterior knowledge must be providing her with mental stirrups (see Laurence and Margolis 2001). If this and similar arguments are sound, then all natural human languages must be thought of as modifications of UG, and learning is a journey to SM that starts at SUG rather than at SBLANK-SLATE. All children assume unquestioningly (so to speak) that their linguistic environment conforms to the principles of UG. Their language faculties develop accordingly, with the happy result that all linguistic environments do in fact conform to the principles of UG, rendering their initial assumption correct.

It is now possible to see why Chomsky thinks it possible that just one of two extensionally equivalent theories of an I-language could turn out to be acceptable. Suppose the theorems of θ and θ* are identical in describing some aspect of mature linguistic ability. If only θ is a modification of UG, then it must be θ and not θ* that is internally represented. Chomsky sometimes puts this in terms of the requirement that a linguistic theory be explanatorily adequate (like θ) and not merely descriptively adequate (like θ*). Explanatorily adequate theories, as well as entailing theorems that adequately describe the relevant ability, are consistent with UG, meaning that only the languages they describe could be acquired by a human child.

To sum up, then, statements about I-languages are ‘statements about the structures of the brain formulated at a certain level of abstraction from mechanisms’. The notion of an I-language earns its keep through its role in projects such as the nativist one described above. By treating states on the path to normal mature linguistic competence in humans as states of knowledge, where what is known is an object (an I-language), an important empirical generalization can be stated and confirmed: that the linguistic environment provides enough information for development from starting state to mature state only when it is complemented with innate knowledge of UG.

What about E-languages? Chomsky's complaint is that there is no legitimate project, or at least no legitimate scientific project, to which the notion of an E-language belongs as an essential ingredient. The case for this negative claim is similar to the case against performance theories outlined earlier. The properties of an E-language are determined by how an I-language is used, and as such their systematic characterization in a theory will be practically impossible. They are, simply, unsuitable as objects of scientific investigation.

One particularly controversial feature of Chomsky's case against E-languages is that it applies, he thinks, to theories of reference. If he is right, semantics as it is often pursued is a discipline in trouble. Notions like reference and truth could only belong to a theory of language use, since referring is something people do with words, not a standing relation between words and objects in the world. Our intuitions about the conditions under which a particular sentence is true are susceptible to seemingly intractable contextual influences, and the same goes for the reference of words like water. Even if the extensional properties of language are tractable, it is unclear why we would want a systematic theory of them when they are so deeply mottled.[4]

2.4 Criticism of Chomsky's Preference for I-languages Over E-Languages

Resistance to I-languages and Chomsky's philosophy of language more generally has often centred on the nature of the realization relation at its heart. Chomsky has called this relation one of ‘knowledge’ of the grammar. This knowledge is not like knowledge as it has traditionally been conceived by philosophers, and his position has been criticized from the premise that genuine knowledge must be conscious, inferentially promiscuous, objective, and even that it must be verbalizable.[5] Chomsky has replied that his choice of the word ‘knowledge’ should be seen as inessential to his core claims. Its use is merely provocative, a challenge to philosophers who place a priori constraints on what is to count as knowledge. He often backs away from this controversy by using ‘to cognize’ or ‘to represent’, specially introduced terms of art, to stand for the cognitive relation speakers bear to their I-language. These are less philosophically loaded than ‘to know’ (though still controversial—see Rey 2003 and 2004, for example). Moreover, when he writes that ‘one task of the brain sciences…is to discover the mechanisms that are the physical realization of the state SL’(1986: 22), he is allowing that the nature of the realization relation is still relatively unknown.

Other critics have argued that even if it is possible to talk about a speaker's knowledge of a linguistic theory, what a language is, and what linguists do or ought to investigate, is independent of any particular speaker's knowledge of it. Sometimes this is expressed in terms of the need to keep in mind a distinction between linguistics and psycholinguistics, where only the latter is concerned with the nuances of our knowledge of the objective features of language.[6]

The internalist conception of language has also been criticized for failing to allow for the deferential aspect of language use described by Hilary Putnam (Putnam 1975; Dummett 1991, Ch 4). Indeed, every argument for externalism about linguistic content would seem to be an argument against the I-language stance Chomsky adopts, and as noted in Section 1.2 above, this debate is still a live one. Chomsky's response to Putnam's scenarios has sometimes been conciliatory, insisting on compatibility between linguistic deference and the I-language perspective (Chomsky 1986: 18; see also Larson and Segal 1995). At other times he has rejected Putnam's intuitions about reference as highly idiosyncratic folk intuitions with no role to play in a natural science of language (Chomsky 1995).

3. Davidson's Claim That There Are No Such Things as Languages

Davidson's best known contributions to the philosophy of language revolve around his ‘bold conjecture’ that a meaning theory for a natural language should take the form of a truth theory for that language (see the entry on Davidson, Donald). But in Davidson 1986 he casts doubt on the usefulness of the received notion of a language, including his former self among those who worked with that notion. Davidson goes so far as to question whether any ‘philosophically important’ notion of a language, idiolectal or otherwise, is left once his arguments are taken on board.

The nature and ramifications of Davidson's skepticism are not easy to extract from his 1986 paper, and nor is the argument for it. This is partly because of the rebarbative terminology he introduces to make his case. A second complicating factor is his reluctance to treat meaning theories as objects of knowledge or of any other cognitive state (noted already in Section 1.1). He thinks of meaning theories as statements of what it ‘would suffice’ to know in order to be in a position to interpret a speaker's utterance. It will simplify the exegesis here to set aside Davidson's latent behaviourism and take the neo-Davidsonian step of treating the clauses of truth theories as statements of what is known, albeit implicitly, by the speakers and interpreters involved.

3.1 What Davidson Aims to Show

Davidson's argument is intended to show that languages, if they are ‘anything like what many philosophers and linguists have supposed’, do not exist (1986: 446). He does not say which philosophers and linguists he has in mind, but somewhere near the centre of the cloud of positions he is criticizing is David Lewis's theory of expression meaning. Lewis treats a language as an association between expressions and meanings, realized in a particular community through a convention, understood as a specific kind of regularity in the use of the expressions with these meanings. (The specifics of Lewis's view, set out in the Appendix, are not essential to what follows.) These conventions enable linguistic communities to overcome the arbitrariness of the association between an expression and a particular meaning. Without such an association, communication would be miraculous.

Lewis's account of expression meaning is commonly regarded as a plausible and necessary supplement to an intention-based account of speaker's meaning. Speaker's meaning in the Gricean tradition is identified with the effect that, in performing a given utterance, the speaker intends, by means of the audience's recognition of this very intention, to produce in that audience (see Grice, Paul). The exact form the meaning-bestowing intention must take is a matter of controversy, but that is not of pressing relevance here. A theory of speaker meaning requires, in addition to an accurate statement of the meaning-bestowing intentions, a complementary theory of expression meaning. Only with the latter can we account for, first, for the expectation on the part of the speaker that she or he will be interpreted as intended (a precondition for the formation of the intention), and second, the high rate of successful audience uptake.

Grice originally related expression meaning to speaker's meaning by suggesting that:

[expression] x means (timeless[ly]) that ‘so-and-so’ might as a first shot be equated with some statement or disjunction of statements about what ‘people’ (vague) intend…to effect by x. (Grice 1957: 385).

Lewis's convention-based account of expression meaning is generally thought to be a vast improvement on this crude early effort. Lewis claims that a sentence means what it does because there is a convention of speakers using the sentence with that meaning, and another of hearers attributing that meaning to uses of it. The language of a community is the sum of these conventionally determined associations between sentences and meanings.

Davidson denies that communication, i.e. intention formation on the part of speakers plus uptake by audiences, is made possible by languages in anything like this sense. In outline, his case against Lewisian languages is quite simple. He claims that expression meaning cannot both play the role it in fact plays in communication and be a matter of convention. He prepares the ground by (a) clarifying that role, and (b) clarifying what would need to hold for conventional meaning to fill it.

(a) The role expression meaning plays in communication is to determine speaker's meaning up to but not beyond the point where conversational implicature takes over. Davidson puts this as the demand that expression meaning should deliver ‘first meaning’. To illustrate this, consider Grice's famous example of implicature:

A is writing a testimonial about a pupil who is a candidate for a philosophy job, and his letter reads as follows: “Dear Sir, Mr X's command of English is excellent, and his attendance at tutorials has been regular. Yours, etc.” (Grice 1975, p. 33)

A's utterance involves a sequence of intentions.[7] These culminate in the intention that members of the appointment committee spot that, in writing these words, A means that Mr X is a poor candidate who should not be appointed. But they are expected to do so only after interpreting him as meaning that Mr. X's command of English is excellent. The sequence of intentions is thus:

(i) to utter (write) the sentence ‘Mr. X's command of English is excellent’

in order that:

(ii) the committee interpret his utterance as meaning that Mr. X's command of English is excellent,

in order that:

(iii) the committee interpret his utterance as meaning that Mr. X is a poor candidate

in order that:

(iv) Mr. X not be offered the position.

The second and third of these intended outcomes, but not the first or fourth, involve self-referring intentions that are characteristic of speaker's meaning: success in what is intended requires recognition of that intention by an intended audience. Davidson introduces a technical term, ‘first meaning’, in place of ‘literal’ or ‘expression’ meaning, since the latter are often laden with theoretical assumptions he wishes to avoid. The first meaning of an utterance is to be read off from the first intended outcome that is self-referring. So the first meaning of A's utterance is that Mr. X's command of English is excellent, since A intends his utterance to be interpreted by members of the committee as meaning that Mr. X's command of English is excellent, and he will be successful in this only if they recognize the intention itself. The role of expression meaning in the determination of speaker's meaning is to deliver the utterance's first meaning, thus defined. Davidson's claim that convention-based accounts fail to capture expression meaning's role in communication can thus be refined into the more specific claim that first meaning does not turn on linguistic conventions.

(b) This particular example poses no threat to the equation of first meaning with conventional meaning, since there is apparently a match in this case. That is, there is nothing to undermine the simple thought that what gives rise to recognition of the first meaning of the utterance, from which the implicated meaning can be extrapolated, is shared antecedent knowledge of all or part of a conventional language (perhaps as expressed in a theory of truth for those expressions if we follow Davidson's attempt to apply Tarski to natural language, but in any case as expressed in a system of rules, a compositional theory, that yields an association between sentences and meanings). But if this simple conventionalist picture is to generalize, says Davidson, three theses must be true:

First meaning is shared: interpretative success (at the level of first meaning) consists in an interpreter and an utterer assigning the same first meaning to the utterance.

First meaning is systematic: first meaning can be derived from the semantic properties of the parts of the uttered sentence, together with its structure.

First meaning is prepared: the resources needed to derive first meaning are available to both interpreter and utterer prior to the utterance.

The conventionalist position is thus further refined into the claim that first meaning is systematic, shared, and prepared. And this, finally, is what Davidson sets out to disprove.

3.2 The Argument From Malapropisms and Related Phenomena

His case turns on what to make of various conversational phenomena that are, or once were, marginalized by philosophers. The factor common to these phenomena is that ‘the speaker expects to be, and is, interpreted as the speaker intended, although the interpreter did not have a correct theory in advance’ (1986: 440). Malapropisms are a particularly transparent example. Here is Mrs. Malaprop addressing Captain Absolute in the exchange that gives Davidson's paper its title:

There, sir! An attack upon my language! What do you think of that?—an aspersion upon my parts of speech! Was ever such a brute! Sure if I reprehend anything in this world, it is the use of my oracular tongue, and a nice derangement of epitaphs! (Sheridan, The Rivals, Act III, Scene 3)

Captain Absolute manages to figure out the first meaning of Mrs Malaprop's utterance, which is that if she apprehends (understands) anything it is the use of her own vernacular tongue and a nice arrangement of epithets. Davidson offers a terminology-heavy but intuitive description of what is going on in this case, a description that applies equally to regular communicative exchange. He then argues that this description of communicative exchange is incompatible with the claim that first meaning is systematic, shared, and prepared.

The intuitive description is couched in terms of prior theories and passing theories of first meaning, defined thus:

H's prior theory: How H is prepared in advance of S's utterance to interpret the expressions in it

S's prior theory: What S believes H's prior theory to be

S's passing theory: The theory S intends H to use to interpret the expressions in S's utterance

H's passing theory: How H in fact interprets the expressions in S's utterance

To illustrate, let S be Mrs. Malaprop and H be Captain Absolute. Their prior and passing theories assign meanings to ‘epitaph’ as follows:

The meaning of ‘epitaph’ in… S H
…their prior theory epithet epitaph
…their passing theory epithet epithet

Successful communication at the level of first meaning happens when S's and H's passing theories coincide for the expressions used—as it does in this example despite disagreement in prior theories. Other permutations of agreement and disagreement are possible involving malapropisms and other phenomena that, like malapropisms, seem to call for a prior/passing theory treatment. These include the use of metaphor, ambiguous expressions, incomplete sentences, and unfamiliar names, as well as performance errors like slips of the tongue or temporary confusion over whether to use ‘underestimated’ or ‘overestimated’ after ‘cannot be’. None of these sabotage the generalization that communicative success is agreement in passing theory, which often occurs despite lack of agreement between prior theories.

How is this supposed to undermine the claim that first meaning is systematic, shared, and prepared, and hence the claim that expression meaning is conventional? Davidson's answer is that neither meaning according to prior theories nor meaning according to passing theories has all three of these properties. Specifically:

Prior theories are systematic and prepared, but not shared.

Passing theories are systematic and shared, but not prepared

He anticipates the tempting thought that two conversants ‘share the same language’ if their prior theories more or less overlap and in addition they each have a capacity to exploit ad hoc strategies for interpretation, such as that used by Captain Absolute and the theatre audience, i.e. searching for a similar sounding word that makes sense of the utterance in context. But these ‘principles of … inventive accommodation are not themselves reducible to theory, involving as they do nothing less than all our skills at theory construction’. In other words:

Such a capacity, though shared and prepared, is not systematic.

This last point resonates with Chomsky's claim that communication involves the interaction of many factors, including the general intelligence of the participants, ruling it out as an object for systematic investigation (see Sections 2.1. and 2.3).

Davidson's argument can be summarized by tracing it back to his headline claim that there are no such things as languages as philosophers standardly conceive them. If there were such things, they would be structures that could be described by systematic theories. And while prior and passing theories are somewhat systematizable, neither has both the other features philosophers usually attribute to languages: being antecedently grasped (‘prepared’), and common to both utterer and audience (‘shared’). He recommends, in effect, that philosophers of language drop their usual ontology of languages when trying to understand how communication occurs and switch instead to his ontology of passing and prior theories applicable to individuals at a time and in a context.

3.3 Reaction to Davidson's Argument

A common first reaction to Davidson's argument is to insist (along with Hacking 1986) that, because the phenomena he highlights are special cases calling for special treatment, they fail to show that conventionalism is fundamentally mistaken. On this view, cases where there is a discrepancy between what Davidson calls passing theories and prior theories should be regarded as curios - ones that, moreover, themselves generally require conventional meaning in order to be interpreted (see e.g. Reimer 2004). They fail to dent the standard picture according to which antecedently shared systematic structures—languages—are, in some core respect, responsible for successful communicative exchanges.

This may be to misinterpret the strategy behind Davidson's introduction of these “rogue” phenomena. He seems to offer them, not as counterexamples to the standard picture (in which case the above response would perhaps be legitimate), but as vehicles for the illustration of an alternative vision of communication that applies even in regular cases. Even when there is no discrepancy between S's and H's prior theories, H will still be in the position of having to confirm this for herself. That is, she must confirm that the meaning delivered by the prior theory makes the utterance a reasonable one. If it is, then she can carry it over into her passing theory of what has been said (the first meaning of the utterance). If not, she must develop a different passing theory. But general intelligence is implicated in the passage from prior theory to passing theory in all cases, even those where no alteration takes place. This suggests that arriving at first meaning is far less of an automated process than is often assumed. Deciding whether the deliverance of the prior theory is reasonable may require searching for implicatures that make sense of the utterance, an involved process. General intelligence, which one might think comes into play only after an interpretation for the uttered expressions, a first meaning, has been fixed, may in fact bear upon the fixing itself. Considering the rogue cases just makes this fact salient.

Davidson points to the extent and variety of cases where convergence in passing theories of first meaning (i.e. communicative success) demands work from the participants to overcome discrepancy between or underdetermination by the prior theories. Some cases other than simple malapropisms were listed in the previous subsection, and developments in the philosophy of language since he wrote his paper have led many to consider how far semantics is penetrated by pragmatic considerations. Examples of so-called ‘pragmatic determinants of what is said’ (or, in Davidson's terminology, of first meaning) do not sit happily with a sharp divide between systematically context-sensitive expressions such as pronouns, and conversational implicature that only takes over when the standard interpretation of the uttered expressions is set.

Two examples reveal the problem. ‘At least’ as it appears in a non-sarcastic utterance of:

His new wife is at least half his age.

is in many social contexts going to be most plausibly interpreted as meaning less than or equal to. This contrasts with the most plausible interpretation of most utterances of:

His newly adopted daughter is at least half his age,

in which it is more likely to mean more than or equal. Attention to pragmatic and unsystematic factors by both utterer and audience seems essential if they are to bridge the gap between their prior theories and arrive at an agreed first meaning. A second kind of case is:

Have you had breakfast?

There is ongoing controversy over whether semantics alone delivers a determinate proposition for this (once a referent is assigned to the pronoun) or whether pragmatics is needed to distinguish between the following possible interpretations:



Some have claimed that pragmatic determinants of what is said are at work in every single utterance. Though these are not examples Davidson explicitly appealed to, they fit the pattern that led to his introduction of the prior-theory/passing-theory distinction. They suggest that the meaning of a sentence depends far more radically on the context of its utterance than had been assumed before Davidson claimed, of his own examples, that they ‘erased the boundary between knowing a language and knowing our way around in the world generally’. (For more on this same theme, see the entries on pragmatics and defaults in semantics and pragmatics.)


Further Reading

A general overview of the topic of idiolects can be found in Higginbotham 2006. For a different perspective, see Millikan 2005.

McGilvray 1999 and Smith 1999 both provide clear introductions to Chomsky's philosophy of language and linguistics, including his E-/I-language distinction. A shorter account of his views on this topic in particular can be found in Bezuidenhout 2006. Critical discussion can be found in four collections: Otero 1994 (Volume II), Antony and Hornstein 2003, Barber 2003, and McGilvray 2005. Chomsky's own non-technical writing is usually accessible. A good starting place would be the second chapter of Chomsky 1986 or the essays in Chomsky 2000.

Three papers in Davidson 1984 (‘What metaphors mean’, ‘Communication and convention’, and ‘Mood and Performances’) herald the anti-conventionalism of his 1986 essay, which is discussed in detail by Hacking 1986, Dummett 1986, Pietroski 1994, and Reimer 2004. Hacking addresses the extent to which Davidson's conclusion undermines his earlier philosophy of language. Dummett attempts to show that the notion of a prior theory presupposes the notion of a linguistic community, and hence of a shared language. For more recent work on the pragmatics/semantics boundary, see Stanley 2000, Carston 2002, Borg 2004, Recanati 2004, Cappelen and Lepore 2005, and Szabo 2005.

The theory of conventions used in Lewis 1975 (see Appendix) is developed at length in Lewis 1969. The resulting theory of language is elaborated by Bennett 1976 and criticised in Burge 1975 and Laurence 1996, the latter from a Chomskian perspective.

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