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17th and 18th Century Theories of Emotions

First published Thu May 25, 2006; substantive revision Fri Oct 15, 2010

Early modern philosophy in Europe and Great Britain is awash with discussions of the emotions: they figure not only in philosophical psychology and related fields, but also in theories of epistemic method, metaphysics, ethics, political theory and practical reasoning in general. Moreover, interest in the emotions links philosophy with work in other, sometimes unexpected areas, such as medicine, art, literature, and practical guides on everything from child-rearing to the treatment of subordinates. Because of the breadth of the topic, this article can offer only an overview, but perhaps it will be enough to give some idea how philosophically rich and challenging the conception of the emotions was in this period. Most attention will be devoted to the familiar figures of early modern philosophy and how they conceived of the emotions as valuable, even indispensable aspects of embodied human life, which were largely constitutive of the self and identity that matter to us practically.

A word of caution is in order: there is a plethora of source material, and this entry is offered as a survey for organizing that material. Alas, much worthy material must be excluded here. This article and its supplements are designed for readers browsing for specific information, as well as those hardy souls who may wish to read it straight through. The main document offers a thematic overview of early modern discussions of the emotions. Separate links lead to documents devoted to the pre-history of the topic, as well as to some of the most important individual figures in early modern philosophy.

1. Introduction

1.1 Difficulties of Approach:

Even recognizing some early modern writings on the emotions for what they are is no easy task. In part, this is due to diverging and rapidly changing vocabularies for talking about the emotions. Seventeenth century philosophers favored talk of ‘passion’ and ‘affect,’ while their eighteenth century counterparts made increasing use of ‘sentiment.’ None of these terms (or their French and Latin cognates) carried the meaning they now do or that ‘emotion’ has come to bear (which did not have a primarily psychological sense until the nineteenth century). It is also easy to overlook the role early modern philosophy gives to ‘calm’ emotions, if we concentrate on the current notion of passions as violent, turbulent and overwhelming. In general, early modern philosophers tended to prefer their emotions calm, but took turbulence to mark only certain kinds of passions. Another difficulty arises from the seemingly ambivalent nature early modern philosophers granted to the emotions. ‘Passion,’ in particular, is connected with a kind of receptivity, but how the passions are receptive and what they are receptive to tend to cross over various comfortable divisions taken to mark early modern philosophy: mind and body; perception and will; reason, judgment and desire; occurrent consciousness and confused dispositions; representations and presentations; private and social; nature and convention; and even what is internal and what external to subjectivity.

1.2 Philosophical Background

Early modern discussions of the emotions are deeply indebted to earlier sources. Aristotle was particularly important (much more so than Plato), influencing early modern theories both directly and through Stoic, medical, Ciceronian, and Scholastic approaches (especially that of Aquinas). Stoicism, likewise, was transmitted both from Latin authors and from the neo-Stoic revival of the 16th century (represented, e.g., by Justus Lipsius, and in some moods, Montaigne). As in other areas of philosophy, however, those sources met a mixed reception. Aristotle's classification of the faculties of the soul and his location of the emotions among the appetites of the sensitive part remained commonplaces, as did Aquinas's further distinction between the irascible and concupiscible passions. But they were also soundly rejected by some of the most famous philosophers, starting with Descartes. Similarly, even those thinkers who seem to owe the most to Stoicism (i.e., Descartes and Spinoza) explicitly criticized certain of its doctrines, including the view that the passions are erroneous judgments. Different sorts of criticism proceeded from thinkers such as Pascal and Malebranche who borrowed from Augustine a sense of human insufficiency for virtue and happiness that put them at odds with Stoic, Skeptical and Epicurean ideals of the autonomous life of the sage. And many aspects of the systematic treatments of Aquinas and later Scholastic authors were both continued and attacked, often by the same authors.

Other ancient sources were also important, even when they were subject to less discussion or criticism. The theory of the humors and animal spirits of the Hippocratic and Galenist medical traditions offered much of the basic vocabulary for early modern discussions of the physiology of the emotions. Rhetorical works, such as those by Aristotle and Cicero, provided a great deal of material for taxonomizing and manipulating the emotions. (Indeed, some of the distinctive early modern practice of generating long lists of emotions, as well as many of the forms of classification, can be traced to these sources.) Popular treatises, such as those by Juan Luis Vives, were sometimes discussed openly. And there were important discussions of particular emotions in Renaissance works, such as the treatment of love and melancholy by the Florentine humanists, or that of “glory” [gloria] by Machiavelli and Montaigne. These sources overlap in ways that are not always consistent and can be difficult to trace: for instance, we find Spinoza probably paraphrasing a passage from Montaigne (III Def of the Affects XLIV), where Montaigne criticizes Cicero's ambitions for “glory” by directly quoting the Latin author (Montaigne, 1958, 187) – all without anything like citation of sources.

The very vocabulary available to early modern theorists is marked by their historical legacy. The terms ‘passion,’ ‘perturbation,’ and ‘affect’ are all rooted in choices made by Latin authors such as Augustine, Cicero and Seneca for translating the Greek pathos used by Aristotle. In contrast, ‘sentiment,’ which came to be used with increasing frequency by eighteenth century British and French authors, seems distinctively modern. Debates about whether to classify emotions among appetites, judgments, or volitions originated in the models of Aristotle, the Stoics and Augustine, although counting them among perceptions may constitute a somewhat novel approach. Early modern associations between the emotions and the body also owed an enormous amount to ancient and medieval sources, as did the connection between emotions and motives for action. Such connections often underlay the long-running debate inherited by the early moderns about the epistemic, eudaimonistic and ethical value of the emotions, a central issue of which is the degree to which we can govern our emotions. Although the evaluations of pre-modern theorists diverged enormously, there was a generally positive view of pleasurable emotions (although they were often classified separately from other passions). This is a view shared by many seventeenth and eighteenth-century philosophers, who often played up the holistic functionality of emotions. Even so, the early moderns seem to have inherited a strong sense of the value of various forms of emotional tranquility – something worth bearing in mind for understanding the changing uses of ‘passion.’

1.3 Ancient, Medieval and Renaissance Theories of the Emotions [Supplementary document]

For a more detailed discussion on the philosophical background, see the supplement on

Ancient, Medieval and Renaissance Theories of the Emotions

2. The Context of Early Modern Theories of the Passions

2.1 Changing Vocabulary

Every philosopher of the early modern period developed distinctive terms of art for discussing the emotions. Still, some vocabulary was general currency. The most common term for describing the emotions in the seventeenth century was undoubtedly ‘passion,’ perhaps because of the influence of Descartes's Passions of the Soul (1649), perhaps because of a general tendency to see the emotions as receptive, passive states. It was not the only term used: ‘affect’ and ‘sentiment’ also appeared, as did ‘perturbation,’ or ‘emotion,’ although these are not usually terms of art, and ‘emotion’ usually meant little more than ‘motion.’ The choice of terminology often marked intellectual allegiances: Descartes saw himself as introducing a new theory, in which “passions” are a species of perception, while Spinoza's “affects” signaled his debt to Stoic ethics, as well as distinctive features of his metaphysics. In his Pensées (1670), Pascal introduced “feelings” or “sentiments” [sentiment], sometimes contrasting them with the corrupted passions and marking his neo-Augustinian understanding of love (see Pensées 680, 531).

‘Sentiment’ was a particularly popular term in British philosophy of the eighteenth century, as was ‘affection.’ These terms were sometimes used interchangeably with and sometimes in contrast to ‘passions.’ In the latter case, ‘sentiments’ or ‘affections’ specified calm emotions, perhaps tempered by reflection or refined in some other way; whereas, ‘passion’ indicated a raw, uncorrected emotion, which may be ‘violent’ in the sense of either agitating us, or being unresponsive to reason. Bernard Mandeville, for instance, spoke of humans as “a compound of passions” in his Fable of the Bees (1714), emphasizing that our emotions are disorganized, fleeting and not subject to correction. Hume, in contrast, often used “sentiment” for the class of refined and reflective emotions that are the basis for our moral and aesthetic judgments. The contrast between these terms is not confined to philosophy. Sarah Fielding's novel The Adventures of David Simple, first published in 1744 and wildly popular in its day, frequently used “passions” to describe forceful, idiosyncratic emotions and desires, particularly those that mark the personality of a character, while reserving “sentiment” for calmer, shared affects and judgments. By 1762, Henry Home, Lord Kames, termed “every thought prompted by a passion” a “sentiment” (Elements of Criticism, chap. xvi).

The developments in vocabulary took place against a background of shared associations and assumptions about the emotions. Emotions were commonly connected with passivity, and what lay outside of our direct control. They were also associated with various forms of perception, even as they were sometimes granted an intentional and judgment-like structure. Emotions were typically assumed to have directions and to provide motives for action. Given this cluster, philosophers often emphasized one or another of the features associated with the emotions. Although no philosophical questions were settled by word choice alone, the preferred vocabulary can reveal much about the choice of emphasis.

Still, it is worth bearing in mind that the available vocabulary may not fully capture what we now think of as emotion, affect, or mood. Sometimes it didn't even capture the range of affective states recognized by early modern philosophers. Descartes, for instance, wrote of “internal” or “intellectual” emotions, which are not passions proper, but certainly have affective components, as well as being causally intertwined with the true passions. Spinoza distinguished “affects” from various emotions and moods that for him indicated “strength of mind,” while reserving a special status for “beatitude.” On the other hand, ‘passion’ didn't even begin to get its contemporary flavor of violent, often sexually-charged emotions until the middle of the eighteenth century (at the earliest), and so what counted as a passion can sometimes come as a surprise. Hobbes included “competition” and “glory” among his passions, and many favorite early modern passions are quite placid, such as ‘wonder,’ or ‘the love of truth.’ There was also a whole special vocabulary for affective states that were recognized by various medical traditions, ranging from ‘splenetic humour’ to general ‘melancholy.’

2.2 Taxonomies

Seventeenth-century accounts are rife with long inventories of emotions, although the list-making urge may have dampened a bit by the eighteenth century, or at least the pretensions to exhaustive cataloguing. Compared to his contemporaries, Descartes seems temperate with a docket of a mere six simple passions, although he also constructed a host of complex ones out of these six. Hobbes offered a list of about thirty in the Leviathan (1651), and more than twenty-five in The Elements of Law (ms. 1640). The head count for Spinoza is a bit trickier to determine, but the third book of his Ethics (ms. 1675) defines at least forty affects. Locke's short discussion in Book II, chap. XX of the Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690) treats eleven; whereas Hume's Treatise and “Dissertation on the Passions” (1757) described about ten broad passions, as well as numerous sub-species and adjuncts, even before turning to the moral or aesthetic sentiments. This tendency is not simply found among the great early modern systems-builders. In the seventeenth century in particular, just about everybody (and their maiden aunt and bachelor uncle) seems to have joined in the hunt for new and distinctive lists of emotions. For instance, large portions of Thomas Wright's The Passions of the Mind In General (1604) and Nicholas Coeffeteau's Tableau des passions humaines, de leurs causes et leurs effets (ms. 1621) are devoted to such lists. A short play of 1630, Pathomachia; or the Battel of Affections, even makes proper taxonomy the motor of what little drama it possesses.

The proliferation of lists can be at least partly explained by the proliferation of schemes of classification. Again, the attention to principles of classification is most marked in the seventeenth-century theorists, in part because of the taxonomic connections they saw between the treatment of the passions and their scientific ambitions in other areas, and in part because of the attacks launched against the systems of previous, e.g., scholastic, thinkers. Descartes, for instance, singled out Aquinas's division of the passions into the concupiscible and irascible for express and explicit criticism. But making his case required constructing an alternative classification more in accord with his reformist account of the soul and its faculties. Despite the efforts of those on the cutting edge of passion theory, however, the Aquinian distinction remained a commonplace bit of early modern folk psychology (see Wright, Burton, even Henry More). Then too, many early modern authors borrowed, and borrowed heavily, from Stoic and Thomist classifications. Hobbes and Locke, for instance, both drew from Aquinas's enumeration of eleven passions, as did Jacques Bossuet in Traité de la connaissance de Dieu et de soi-même (ms. after 1670; see Gardiner 1970, 205).

Many time-honored principles of classification clearly decreased in importance during the early modern period. In particular, the possibility of psychic conflict, especially that which could generate competing motives for action, had been a common device in ancient and medieval theories for distinguishing among passions, kinds of passions, and faculties of the soul in general. This principle played some role for Descartes in distinguishing between movements coming from the body and those originating in the soul, and it was deployed sporadically by other theorists. But the practice died out over the course of the two centuries, as theorists came to recognize the possibility that a single, or similar, emotional source might produce conflicting motions or tendencies, both in the individual and across societies. Indeed, some emotions were characterized exactly by such conflict or turbulence. Descartes's description of regret is one such example. A somewhat happier case is the emotions generated by tragedy, as explained by philosophers from Malebranche to Hume.

Perhaps the most basic division in play is evaluative, i.e., whether the emotion is good or bad. This was hardly an innovation. But early modern philosophers came to understand that division in two different ways – either an emotion is directed at good or evil as an object, or the emotion itself is affectively good or bad, pleasurable or painful. Many distinctively modern theories subsumed the former under the latter: both the naturalistic theories of Hobbes and Spinoza, on the one hand, and the moral sense theories of Hutcheson and Hume, on the other, held that we project the value of the object from the affective quality of the emotion, although Hume allows for complications in how we experience the valences of a passion as belonging to self or other, using such mechanisms as sympathy and comparison. Some authors also identified neutral emotions: ‘wonder’ is a common example, deriving largely from Descartes, although anticipated in Sir Kenelme Digby's Two Treatises (1644).

Some philosophers singled out a particular passion, or group of passions, to head off their taxonomies. In rather different ways, that was the role of wonder for Descartes, and of glory for Hobbes. Malebranche took there to be an irreducible element of love in every passion. An even more common organizing device was to divide the passions into simple and complex. Not only did this impose a manageable order on the many recognized passions, it allowed explanation to be focused on the simplest cases, with the expectation that other emotions would fall into line, either as compounds, offspring, or species of the simples. The simple passions themselves were organized into contrasting groups, based on their evaluative character. Schemes of this kind can be found in Descartes, Malebranche, Spinoza, Thomas Wright, and to a lesser extent, Hume.

Many other forms of classification were tied closely to the particular interests of individual authors. This is particularly the case with those eighteenth-century British authors who argued against Hobbes and Mandeville that the very possibility of morality requires that we be capable of genuinely benevolent emotions. For this reason, distinctions between self-directed and other-directed emotions and between anti-social and sociable emotions were a common point of organization and contention. Similar concerns also generated a distinction between idiosyncratic affects and emotions that could be cultivated to be broadly shared; in particular, emotions were often divided into the raw and immediate and those that involve an element of reflection. This distinction lent itself also to those philosophers concerned with the historical and social development of humans, as evident in many works of Rousseau. For instance, the Discourse on the Origin of Inequality (1755) presents a kind of natural history tracing the genesis of many emotions through changes in social structure; works such as Emile (1762), La Nouvelle Heloise (1761), and the Confessions (1782) treat the affective maturation and socialization of individuals, as well as the management and effects of the emotions. But for all his genealogical concerns, Rousseau, and indeed many other eighteenth-century authors, showed a good deal less interest in taxonomizing the emotions according to principled systems than did their predecessors.

2.3 Philosophical Issues in Theories of the Emotions

Few areas of early modern philosophy remained untouched by at least some theory of the emotions. What follows is simply a cursory overview of some issues of general interest. But since early modern understandings of the emotions often made unexpected connections between diverse areas of philosophy, we may find that investigation reshapes our map of seventeenth- and eighteenth-century philosophy. Certainly, the understanding of the emotions produced in one area of philosophy was not isolated from their treatment in other areas.

That is true of how the emotions figured in much of seventeenth-century metaphysics. Locating the emotions within their distinctive ontologies was an important, but sometimes challenging task for philosophers such as Descartes, Malebranche, and Spinoza. In doing so, they often tapped a broad metaphysical distinction between the active and the passive, which sometimes supported, and sometimes undermined those ontologies (see James 1997). The emotions also inform various approaches to the relation between mind and body, whether Descartes's dualism, Hobbes's materialism, Spinoza's parallelism, or those of philosophers who refused to take a stand on the issue. Indeed, attempts to accommodate the emotions sometimes led to novel and intricate pictures of the relations between soul and body: Walter Charleton's Natural History of the Passions (1674, 2nd ed., 1701), for instance, posits two souls, one that is rational and immaterial and one that is sensitive and extended, mediating between the rational soul and the body. The emotions were also important in accounts of personal identity, whether that is understood ontologically in the cases of Descartes and Spinoza, or psychologically in the case of Hume.

Theories of the emotions played a role – often a pivotal one – in the important early modern debates about causation and the proper forms of explanation. As part of their embrace of the new science, many seventeenth century philosophers considered the emotions to be susceptible, at least in part, to mechanical explanation. Although Descartes offered a teleological defense of our propensities to experience emotions, his account of their physiological underpinnings is mechanistic. Malebranche too considered the functions of the emotions and the way in which that functioning has been corrupted, but emphasized that the emotions are communicated through strictly mechanical operations. Hobbes and Spinoza went yet further, rejecting any talk of final causation in order to treat the behavior of the emotions as completely continuous with bodily movements, and indeed reducing the appearance of goal-driven behavior to the motions of the passions. In contrast, Shaftesbury criticized Locke and Descartes for failing to appreciate the natural teleology of our emotional constitution, and dismissed all physiological accounts as beside the point. Many other British philosophers showed less interest in the metaphysics of explanation and more in defending an empiricist account of the origins of our ideas. But the rejection of innate ideas often drove them to focus explanations of the emotions on the hydraulics by which pains and pleasures push our ideas. This naturalistic approach was particularly marked in eighteenth-century associationist psychology, often hand in hand with ‘Newtonian’ ambitions to produce a “science of man:” examples include Hume's Treatise of Human Nature (1739-40), and such lesser-known works as David Hartley's Observations on Man, his Frame, his Duty, and his Expectations (1749) and an anonymous tract of 1741, An Enquiry into the Origin of Human Appetites and Affections, Showing How Each Arises from Association: for the use of young gentlemen at the universities (cited in Gardiner 1970, 221), as well as in the works of Condillac.

As we might expect, emotions loomed large in the philosophical psychology of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. One question addressed by almost every philosopher was where to locate the emotions in our psychological equipment. Following Descartes, seventeenth century philosophers tended to subsume the emotions under perception. ‘Perception’ must be broadly understood, however; what is crucial is that the emotions involve the exercise of a receptive faculty, especially insofar as their causes lie in the body, or more generally, outside of the receptive animal. Spinoza, admittedly, allowed that we may be adequate causes of some of our affects, and took all our emotions to involve judgments. But on his view, judgments are not different in kind from perceptions, although their epistemic status is determined by whether we are active and adequate or merely passive, inadequate causes of our perceptions. Descartes, too, attributed an at least proto-propositional, representative structure to emotions. This structure, however, is independent of and prior to the volitions of assent or denial that generate real judgment. The emotions thus remain among the perceptions belonging to the intellect, although they provide material for judgment. Nonetheless, since perceptions were typically granted a complex representational and intentional structure, most seventeenth century authors connected them closely with judgments.

Eighteenth century theorists, on the other hand, often identified emotions specifically with sense-perceptions. Indeed, Hutcheson multiplied the number of our sense-faculties to accommodate the wide variety of affects he recognizes. Many philosophers also supposed a haptic aspect to emotions, approaching them as a variety of feeling. Most notably, Hume maintained that a distinctive feature of the passions and sentiments is that they touch, or strike upon the mind more forcibly than other perceptions.

More generally, eighteenth-century theories shift gradually from characterizing emotions primarily by how they represent their intentional contents to considering their qualitative phenomenology, the special ‘feel’ of the emotions. Hume, for one, stressed that our passions are “simple and uniform impressions” with characteristic affective qualities Still, this is at most a change in emphasis, since many did allow that emotions typically have some kind of object. Hume, in particular, attributed a rather complicated content to the indirect passions that show a “double relation of impressions and ideas.” But the atomistic tendencies of British psychology following Locke spelled difficulty for accounts of intentional content, and many philosophers emphasized features of our emotions that are non-intentional. Emotions still retained important connections to judgment, however, since judgments themselves, especially moral and political ones, were often considered simply expressions of sentiment.

For all their disagreements about the nature of judgment, early modern philosophers reached near-consensus in taking emotion to motivate our practical and theoretical endeavors. Because they provide at least some of the motives for action, the emotions were central to investigations of our practical reasoning and to moral philosophy. In particular, eighteenth-century spectator- and judgment-centered moral theories gave the emotions a double role for our moral judgments: insofar as they represent the enduring dispositions of character expressed in actions, they are the objects of moral evaluations; but they also generate the judgments themselves. In a somewhat different vein, many philosophers took our emotions to be the engine driving our theoretical reasoning: both wonder (for Descartes) and curiosity (for Hume) perform this function. Indeed, almost any philosopher investigating efficient causation in our psychology found an important place for our emotions, whether Hobbes considering our internal motions, or the associationist psychologists of the eighteenth century.

As crucial bits of our psychology, the emotions are also important to epistemology. Here, though, the position of many early modern philosophers has often been misunderstood, especially when it is assumed that they oppose reason to the emotions, to the detriment of the latter. (We might call this the ‘Mr. Spock’ gloss on early modern philosophy.) It is true that many philosophers held that the emotions can sometimes lead our reasoning astray, and they offer various epistemic techniques to minimize this cognitive interference. Malebranche, for instance, imbedded his account of the passions in the reforming project of The Search After Truth (1674-5), and many accounts of method, e.g., Arnauld's and Nicole's Logic, or the Art of Thinking (1662), included an account of the emotions as an indispensable part of their epistemic techniques. But none of these accounts assumed that the emotions are inevitably disruptive to our reason, however important it may be to temper them. Descartes particularly emphasized the functionality of our passions, first for practical, but also for theoretical reasoning, and suggested that proper discipline should allow us to maximize the epistemic value of the emotions. Malebranche and Spinoza were less sanguine about our chances of doing so, but even Malebranche maintained that the passions are functional in several respects. Hobbes, on the other hand, mounted a number of contrasts between passions and the “common measure” of reason. But these seem somewhat at odds with his claims about the operation of the passions in driving mental activity. Here it is worth considering Spinoza's account of the relation between reason and the affects, for it offers a kind of gloss on Hobbes. It is, Spinoza maintained, only our passive emotions that can produce conflict with the dictates of our reason; our active affects accord well with reason. Hume, of course, denied that it makes any sense to speak of a conflict between reason and passion, when he declared that reason not only is “but ought only to be” the slave to the passions – a dictum that seems to apply to theoretical as well as practical reason. Later eighteenth-century philosophers developed the view that our reasoning faculties, and particularly our language, are a historical development from our emotions; this seems to have been the view of Condillac and Rousseau.

One of the most important contexts for understanding the epistemic strengths and weaknesses attributed to the emotions lies in their relation to the imagination. Accounts of what exactly this faculty is changed dramatically from the seventeenth to the eighteenth centuries, but in one way or another, the emotions were commonly understood to interact closely with the imagination. On some views, the imagination provides a conduit between the emotions and the body. Both pre-modern and modern folk medicine held that experiencing strong emotions could affect the imagination of a pregnant woman in such a way as to leave marks on her fetus. Indeed, so close was the connection supposed to be that simply imagining emotionally-fraught situations could mark the development of the fetus, and there was a substantial literature of eighteenth-century manuals instructing mothers-to-be on the proper control of their affective states. (See Smith 2006 and Kukla 2005.) Descartes made mention of such views, and more generally saw the imagination as an important tool for managing the emotions: picturing things in the imagination could have affective results, so manipulating the imagination is an effective way of controlling our emotions and their effects. The view taken of the interaction between emotions and imagination changed with shifts in how the faculty of the imagination – and the relation between mind and body in general –were understood. Hume, for instance, considered the imagination to be the faculty of composing, decomposing, and associating ideas, in contrast to the impressions among which passions were numbered. Nonetheless, there is still some role for the imagination in producing and manipulating affects, and vice-versa. The imagination is also a crucial mechanism in the social communication of the passions, a topic considered by both Malebranche and Hume.

The physiology of the emotions and their implications for medicine was another important theme in early modern philosophy. (Here too the imagination has a role to play.) Descartes considered the emotions central to the treatment of both mental and bodily illness. In doing so, he joined a long and popular medical tradition treating the emotions, including Robert Burton's Anatomy of Melancholy (1621) and William Falconer's A Dissertation on the Influence of the Passions upon the Disorders of the Body (1788). Burton's work was conservative, if eclectic, in its approach to understanding the soul and using the machinery of humours and spirits to explain emotion and temperament. But many other writers borrowed piecemeal from the language of humours and spirits, sometimes embedding it in new physiological accounts, sometimes simply using it to describe various affects. Descartes and Malebranche, for instance, spoke of the animal spirits, but also used such new tools as Harvey's discovery of the circulation of the blood to explain the bodily effects of emotions.

The affective aspects of mental disorders are matters of particular interest. Some of that interest may have been personal, since ‘melancholy’ was widely taken to be a special affliction of the learned, a point that puts some of Hume's discussion of the emotional effects of skepticism in context. ‘Enthusiasm,’ particularly religious enthusiasm, also garnered a great deal of attention, considered as a matter of excessive and contagious emotion that could be based in bodily disorders. But since many philosophers of the eighteenth century followed Shaftesbury in refusing to consider the physiology of the emotions, they relegated the bodily causes, components and effects to the attention of ‘anatomists,’ rather than of philosophers. More generally, the sort of humour-driven approach to medicine and pathology that informed many seventeenth-century accounts of the emotions declined among eighteenth century philosophers.

Some of the most important issues raised by the emotions in early modern philosophy are practical, especially those concerning practical reason, the pursuit of happiness and moral philosophy. As we have seen, the emotions were generally seen as motivating. They are not necessarily the only sources of motivation: Descartes and Malebranche considered reason to offer motivations of its own, as did Pascal, who also admitted other sources of motivation. But many other philosophers, such as Hobbes, Hutcheson and Hume took the emotions to be the driving source of our practical reason. None of them, however, maintained that the emotions were immune to training and refinement, and indeed all early modern philosophers took it as important for both morality and happiness that we do train our emotions. The practical philosophies offered by Descartes, Malebranche and Spinoza are particularly concerned with the pursuit of happiness, which they assume involves both managing and cultivating the emotions. This is what Descartes called “pursuing virtue” and Spinoza “freedom from bondage,” but they shared the view that the emotions are crucial to the good life, conceived both eudaimonistically and morally.

The pursuit of happiness was also an issue for British philosophers such as Shaftesbury and Hutcheson, although it sometimes paled next to their interests in moral evaluation. Shaftesbury argued vehemently that “virtue and interest coincide,” because he maintained that happiness depends on a preponderance of pleasant affects, and the emotions carrying moral worth are themselves pleasant. Yet he had to argue the point, since he did not understand virtue primarily in terms of individual flourishing. Hutcheson also considered how the passions contribute or detract from our happiness. But Shaftesbury, Hutcheson and Hume expended even more effort to explain how we make judgments of moral worth, starting with the emotions issuing from our moral senses. For it is only through our emotions that we can be responsive to the moral qualities we evaluate. For this reason, they may all seem committed to a ‘sentimentalist’ moral philosophy. Hutcheson and Hume did indeed oppose the moral ‘rationalists,’ arguing that there is no independent quality in actions or persons to which emotions are sensitive. But their position presupposes a very particular understanding of the nature of our senses and of the ontological status of the secondary qualities to which they are receptive. In contrast, Shaftesbury, often suggests both that there are moral and aesthetic qualities intrinsic to the external world, and that we access those qualities through our emotions. On this view, our emotions, at least when functioning as they should, are simply our natural equipment for picking up salient features of the world.

Early modern philosophy held a special place for the emotions in its political and social theory (see Kahn, Saccamano & Coli, 2006). Indeed, there was a popular early modern genre of ‘how-to’ books about techniques for governing others by managing their emotions. Likewise, a great deal of political philosophy concerned the management of the emotions by social institutions and authorities, with Hobbes and Mandeville being just two of the most obvious examples. But there are also deeper issues about what role the emotions might play in making social order possible. Many philosophers held that the emotions facilitated social interaction: Descartes suggested something of the sort in his analyses of such passions as love and generosity. Malebranche was even more clearly committed to the view, holding that the communication of the emotions is crucial to social organization, ranking and cohesion. Hobbes and Spinoza, in contrast, found the grounds of much interpersonal conflict in the emotions, and even diagnosed specific emotions as inherently disruptive to social order, e.g., glory for Hobbes. But by the same token, there are many passions that Hobbes stated “incline us to peace,” and Spinoza allowed that insofar as people agree in affects, they agree in nature. Eighteenth-century philosophers tended to evaluate the social effects of the emotions in terms of whether they were self- or other-directed, with Shaftesbury and Hutcheson arguing against Mandeville that our most natural emotions were other-directed. In his Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of Our Ideas of the Sublime and Beautiful (1759), Edmund Burke distinguished between the passions directed at self-preservation and those belonging to society, but spends the lion's share of his time on the latter. The issue is somewhat more complicated in Hume, but he does seem to take the development of our emotions and their susceptibility to a standard of appropriateness to be indispensable to many of the “artifices” that make social life possible. A different twist is provided by Rousseau's contrast between two kinds of self-directed affection, amour de soi and amour propre, of which the former, but not the latter seems consistent with compassion for others.

The place of the emotions in early modern aesthetic theories deserves a separate treatment. The representation of the emotions was considered a proper object, sometimes the object, of aesthetic criticism. It was also the subject of many practical manuals in the arts; there is, for instance, an extensive seventeenth-century literature stemming from discussions in the French Royal Academy of Painting and Sculpture about how to depict facial expressions and bodily gestures in ways that would allow the deciphering of emotional states. Here the representation of the emotions serves both narrative and didactic purposes.

Another commonplace of early modern aesthetics was the importance of exciting emotions in the audience for a work of art. This is a common theme in musical aesthetics, which borrowed heavily from rhetorical treatises. Baroque composers developed an entire theory of affects, and of musical figures to express those affects, for just this end. (See the Grove Dictionary of Music.) Another version of this theme appears in philosophical discussions of tragedy; since it is assumed that the dramatic depiction of emotions excites the same emotions in the audience, tragic drama presents a bit of a puzzle. It seems odd that we should enjoy the experience, and even enjoy it in proportion to the distress it invokes. Malebranche, Hutcheson and Hume are just a few to address this puzzle by developing accounts of the meta-pleasures afforded to us by the exercise of our emotions.

Eighteenth-century aesthetics moved away somewhat from the view that the arts should carefully control our emotions, although the notion that artworks both express and excite emotions remained. Particularly interesting in this regard is the development of the concept of the sublime. As Burke explains it, the experience of the sublime transgresses categories of pain and pleasure and explains much of our response to dramatic tragedy. Here it seems that aesthetic, and other distinctive experiences can produce emotions that are sui generis, a view that gives aesthetics a particular importance for any understanding of the emotions.

Several of the most important discussions of the emotions in the early modern period involved women, who sometimes raised specific concerns relevant to their status as women. That is the case with Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia, whose correspondence pushed Descartes to write on the passions, while pursuing a lengthy discussion of the impact of the emotions on health and reasoning and our ability to control them. Elisabeth also seems to have inspired other writers on the emotions, serving as the dedicatee for the Treatise of the Passions and Faculties of the Soul of Man (1640) of Edward Reynolds, the Bishop of Norwich. Both Mary Astell in Letters Concerning the Love of God (1695) and Damaris Cudworth, Lady Masham, in Discourse Concerning the Love of God (1696) took issue with the Malebranchean account of love offered by John Norris, albeit to very different degrees and from different approaches. Later in the eighteenth century, Mary Wollstonecraft's criticisms of Rousseau specifically addressed some of his views about emotional development and the sexual division of labor in the sentimental education of children. However, since some recent authors have turned to early modern discussions to understand how the emotions can be conceptually gendered, we should note that many women philosophers of this period showed no particular interest in the emotions. It does not seem to have been considered a special area of expertise for women.

Although early modern philosophy did not seem to associate concepts of the emotions with gender just as we now do, there is still a great deal of gender-baggage to investigate. Many authors took the position that there were important sexual differences in the disposition to feel specific emotions. Malebranche allowed that there are many such differences, not just between the sexes, but for different ages, fortunes and stations in life; indeed, it is differences between individuals' “stations in life” that do the most work for him in explaining variations in affective susceptibilities. Other authors laid such variations at the doorstep of bodily composition, especially the constitution of the brain, and took the relevant differences to be especially and intrinsically marked between the sexes (although they could also typify class and rank). In Les Characteres des Passions (1648-62), Marin Cureau de la Chambre discussed the effects that the liquid humours in the brain could have on emotional temperament, taking it as an explanation of why some people (women, as well as children and drunkards) cry more readily than others.

Some more distinctively gendered and more evaluatively loaded claims about the emotions appeared in the eighteenth century, particularly in aesthetic theory. Shaftesbury is a bit of a villain here, contrasting true taste with the trivial sentiments of merely feminine taste. Some authors even distinguished aesthetic qualities and emotions through gendered contrasts, as when feminine beauty is opposed to the masculine sublime (with, of course, the preference going to the sublime). But despite such gendered accounts of particular emotions, there seems little to suggest that early modern philosophy associated emotion as such with the feminine.

3. Individual Philosophers

Supplementary documents are available for the philosophers:


Primary Works Cited

Ancient, Medieval and Renaissance

Seventeenth Century

[See sections below for Descartes, Hobbes, Malebranche, and Spinoza]


[See remarks on citations.]


[All citations to works of Hobbes are given by chapter and paragraph.]


[All citations are to The Search after Truth (ST) followed by the number of Book, chapter and page.]


[References to the Ethics are by part (I-V), definition, (D), proposition (P), or other subsection, and if applicable, to scholium (s), demonstration, or corollary (c).]

Eighteenth Century

[See below for sections on Hume, Hutcheson, and Shaftesbury.]


[See remarks on citations]


[See remarks on citations]


[All citations to Shaftesbury are from the Cambridge edition, cited by specific work and page number. Works cited are “Inquiry Concerning Virtue and Merit” (cited as “Inquiry” — selections of which are also available in Raphael, 1991, Vol. I), “Letter Concerning Enthusiasm,” (cited as “Enthusiasm”), “Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author” (cited as “Soliloquy”), and “Sensus Communis” (cited as “Sensus”).]


Secondary Works Consulted

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

aesthetics: British, in the 18th century | aesthetics: French, in the 18th century | aesthetics: German, in the 18th century | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotle, General Topics: ethics | Aristotle, General Topics: psychology | Aristotle, General Topics: rhetoric | Augustine, Saint | Burke, Edmund | Condillac, Étienne Bonnot de | Descartes, René: and the pineal gland | Descartes, René: ethics | emotion | emotion: in the Christian tradition | emotion: medieval theories of | Epicurus | feminist (interventions): history of philosophy | Hartley, David | Hobbes, Thomas | Hobbes, Thomas: moral and political philosophy | Hume, David | Hume, David: aesthetics | Hume, David: moral philosophy | Lipsius, Justus | Machiavelli, Niccolò | Malebranche, Nicolas | Montaigne, Michel de | Reid, Thomas | Scottish Philosophy: in the 18th Century | Shaftesbury, Lord [Anthony Ashley Cooper, 3rd Earl of] | Smith, Adam: moral philosophy | Spinoza, Baruch | Spinoza, Baruch: psychological theory | Stoicism | Suárez, Francisco


Initial work on these entries was supported by a fellowship from Stanford Humanities Center during the academic year 2002-03, helped by an able Undergraduate Research Fellow, Jason Rosensweig, who prepared some bibliographic materials. I have also benefited from the research assistance of Edwin Etieyibo in the summer of 2005, who cheerfully took on many onerous tasks. Thanks also go to the editorial staff at the Stanford Encyclopedia and to Doug Jesseph, who was a particularly patient and hard-working subject editor. Much of the work for the updated version of 2010 was done by John Kardosh, who combed through the entire entry, catching mistakes and offering insightful comments; I thank him and the Social Sciences and Humanities Research Council of Canada, which provided support.