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Hermann Cohen

First published Thu Jul 15, 2010

Hermann Cohen, more than any other single figure, is responsible for founding the Neo-Kantianism that dominated academic philosophy in Germany from the 1870s until the end of the First World War. Earlier German philosophers finding inspiration in Kant tended either towards speculative, metaphysical idealism, or sought to address philosophical questions with the resources of the empirical sciences, especially psychology. In contrast, Cohen's seminal interpretation of Kant offered a vision of philosophy that sought to avoid uncritical metaphysics without at the same time simply absorbing philosophy into psychology. Cohen brought these attitudes to bear on a wide range of topics, writing systematically about epistemology, philosophy of science, ethics, law, political theory, and aesthetics. His anti-psychologism and suspicion of speculative idealism became defining commitments not only of the Marburg School of Neo-Kantianism, founded by Cohen himself, but of orthodox Neo-Kantianism more generally. Indeed, these commitments ultimately defined the philosophical context from which, in the early twentieth century, both phenomenology and logical positivism emerged.

No less significant than his influence on academic philosophy, Cohen was his generation's preeminent German-Jewish public intellectual and religious philosopher. His philosophical ethics and political theory provided the foundation for a non-Marxist, Kantian democratic socialism that informed his more popular and topical writings. He argued publicly for universal suffrage and for the rights of workers to organize democratically-constituted collectives. He also saw deep points of connection between ethics and religion, and developed a view of Judaism as a profoundly ethical system of belief and practice. He argued that monotheism was the historical source of the idea of universal ethical laws, and thus that Judaism offered the world its first model of a universalist morality. This view of Judaism's ethical significance ultimately informed Cohen's public defense of the Jews' place in Germany not only against anti-Semitic attacks, but also against the arguments of early twentieth-century Zionists. However, Cohen's influence on Jewish thought extends far beyond debates within Imperial Germany: his late religious writings inspired a broad renewal in twentieth-century Jewish ethics and philosophy of religion.

1. Life and Works

Born in 1848 in Coswig, Germany, Cohen was raised in a devout family. His father was a synagogue cantor, and Cohen left Gymnasium in order to attend a rabbinical seminary in Breslau, Poland. But he decided against becoming a rabbi, and enrolled in university first in Breslau and then in Berlin, where he attended classes taught by a leading light in the history of philosophy, the Aristotelian Adolf Trendelenburg. He received his doctorate from the University of Halle, after which, encouraged by H. Steinthal, he studied Völkerpsychologie, an anthropological investigation of the origins of cultural products such as art and literature. It was in a journal of Völkerpsychologie and linguistics that he published his first major work of Kant interpretation, an intervention in Trendelenburg's and Kuno Fischer's debate about Kant's Transcendental Aesthetic (see §2 below). That essay also marked a decisive turn in Cohen's philosophical orientation, and after two years in which he wrote on both Kant's pre-critical philosophy and the Critique of Pure Reason, he was appointed lecturer at the University of Marburg. Three years later, he was promoted to full Professor, a rank that was at that time in Germany almost never granted to unconverted Jews in philosophy departments. It was no coincidence that Cohen's appointment and subsequent promotion took place during Bismark's anti-Catholic Kulturkampf, a brief period of relatively liberal attitudes toward Jews. But following Heinrich von Treitschke's notorious 1879 anti-Semitic attack on German-Jewish writers and intellectuals, Cohen was compelled to enter the public debate about the Jews' place in Imperial Germany. His “Declaration on the Jewish Question” appeared in 1880, and questions of German-Jewish identity would occupy him throughout his career (Schwarzschild 1979; Wiedebach 1997, Pts. 4–5). He remained at Marburg for almost four decades. After retiring in 1912, Cohen returned to Berlin to teach at a rabbinical seminary, the Academy of Jewish Sciences. He spent four years there, writing principally about religious problems, until his death in 1918.

Cohen's period of philosophical productivity spanned the duration of the German empire, from the late 1860s until 1918. We can distinguish three periods in his writing (van der Linden 1988, 205–6; Bonaunet 2004: 22ff). The first, early period is characterized by Cohen's attempts to develop his own views as commentaries on Kant. During this period, he wrote Kant's Theory of Experience, Kant's Foundations of Ethics, and Kant's Foundations of Aesthetics. In the second period, Cohen's views had matured to the point where he had explicitly abandoned central Kantian doctrines. He thus presented his views systematically, and as his own, rather than offering them as interpretations of Kant. He conceived his major works from this period as part of a multi-volume project he called his System of Philosophy. The System included The Logic of Pure Knowledge, The Ethics of Pure Will, and The Aesthetics of Pure Feeling. (He planned, but never wrote, a fourth part of the System on the psychology of “cultural consciousness.” This fourth part was to provide the systematic foundation for the other three parts of the System [Adelmann 1968].) Finally, although Cohen had been interested in religious questions throughout his career, in the the last years of his life they were his overwhelming concern. It was during this period that he wrote his Religion of Reason Out of the Sources of Judaism.

However, while Cohen's interests and views evolved over the course of his career, his philosophy from all three periods nevertheless exhibits points of deep continuity. All of Cohen's major works share a profoundly historical orientation. A concern with the history of philosophy dominates his writing, and he was convinced of history's continuing significance for philosophy in the present. But he was also concerned with the histories of those subjects he took to be philosophy's topics, including science, ethics, and religion. This concern for history permeates his thought so completely that even in his systematic works, he prefers to introduce concepts and theories not by defining them straightforwardly, but by rehearsing major episodes in the history of their development. This historically-oriented method was a model for what later philosophers called Problemgeschichte – that is, the history of the origin, development, and evolution of philosophical problems, as opposed to the historical survey of candidate solutions to problems the philosopher conceives as fixed, unchanging, and unresponsive to a broader philosophical context. (In Cohen's hands, this historical orientation contributes in no small part to other aspects of his writing that none of his readers can fail to notice: its obscurity, repetition, and sometimes unnecessary length.)

Cohen himself came to think that one commitment above all else unified his philosophy, from his earliest interpretation of Kant to his mature System of Philosophy. It was his commitment to a philosophical method he claimed was Kant's, and that Cohen called the “transcendental method.” What follows is a sketch of the transcendental method in Cohen's philosophy: how it emerged from his interpretation of Kant; how he sought to apply that method in epistemology and philosophy of science, as well as in ethics, political theory, and aesthetics; and finally, how he sought to articulate a view of religion as a necessary counterpart to philosophy done according to that method.

2. The Interpretation of Kant

Throughout his writings on epistemology and philosophy of science, Cohen was committed to two ideas: first, that a priori laws of human knowledge determine what counts as an object for us; and second, that philosophy investigates knowledge according to what Cohen called the “transcendental method.” His early interpretation of Kant reveals both of these commitments. It also reveals a problem that would occupy him throughout his later writings on epistemology and philosophy of science: the problem of explaining the origin of the a priori laws in human knowledge.

In 1871 Cohen published a long essay, “On the Controversy between Trendelenburg and Kuno Fischer,” and a book, the first edition of Kant's Theory of Experience. They were both defenses of Kant against objections that Cohen thought badly misunderstood his views on objectivity and the a priori. Cohen was responding to an interpretation of Kant in the 1860s commonly held by figures of the Back-to-Kant movement such as Hermann von Helmholtz and Cohen's own senior colleague at Marburg, F.A. Lange, as well as by non-Kantian philosophers such as Adolf Trendelenburg. Very roughly, these figures thought that Kant held (or that Kantian philosophers ought to hold) that the character of human knowledge is determined by both objective and subjective factors. On one hand, there are objects that exist independently of the subject's mind. These objects affect the subject's mind, and in so doing contribute the objective element to the subject's representations. On the other hand, there are structures in the subject's mind—say, the forms of human intuition, space and time. Because these structures are in the subject's mind and thus don't come from experience, they are a priori. Further, these a priori structures organize the subject's representations and thereby contribute a subjective, mind-dependent element to them. But since on this interpretation of Kant the a priori is subjective, an explanation of knowledge's objectivity must appeal not to it, but to the objects that exist independently of the mind.

Cohen thought this interpretation of Kant was wrong, and he thought that influential objections to Kant depended on it. Cohen was especially concerned with Trendelenburg's well-known “neglected alternative” objection to Kant's claim that space and time are nothing but the forms of intuition. But Cohen was also concerned with J.F. Herbart's (and in Cohen's own time, Helmholtz's) contention that Kant thought spatial representations were innate. Since Cohen thought both Trendelenburg's and Herbart's objections depended on a misinterpretation of Kant, he thought those objections failed. He responded to them by defending an alternative account of the relation between objectivity and the Kantian a priori (Köhnke 1991, 175–8; Patton 2005).

Consequently, Kant's Theory of Experience is above all an attempt to articulate and defend Cohen's alternative interpretation of Kant's a priori. On that interpretation, Kant's aim in the Critique of Pure Reason is to show how a priori laws of human thought explain the character of our experience of objects. For Cohen, because these a priori laws are necessary, they are objective. So Kant's explanation of objective experience appeals to them, and not to the effects of any alleged mind-independent objects.

Cohen argues that there are three different “levels” or “degrees” of Kant's a priori. He claims that the first of these is inessential for Kant's philosophy, and consists in the apparently permanent “metaphysical” structures we can discover in our own thought by means of introspection. The second level of the a priori consists in the forms of sensibility and the understanding, that is, space, time, and the categories. But the necessity of these forms ultimately derives from the necessity of the third level of the a priori, because the forms of sensibility and understanding are “scientific abstractions” (Cohen 1987 [1871b], 83–84) from that third level. The third level is thus the most important of the three levels. Cohen argues that a priori laws in this most important, third sense consist in the “formal conditions of the possibility of experience.” Or, as he also sometimes puts it, the a priori in this third sense consists in laws that are “constitutive of” of the possibility of experience. For Cohen, these necessary, a priori laws define what an object of experience is for us. (Klaus Christian Köhnke identifies this point in Cohen as the source of the central Marburg School doctrine that a priori laws “generate” objects of possible experience [Köhnke 1991, 178–84].)

Cohen has a striking view of what a priori laws of the third level actually consist in, and of the possible experience they are constitutive of. Although he would emphasize this striking view more in later writings it is nevertheless explicit in the first edition of his Kant's Theory of Experience. He did not think the third level of the a priori consists in cognitive structures in the subject's mind, structures we could discover by doing physiology (as, for example Helmholtz and Lange thought) or by introspection (as, for example, J.F. Fries and, in Cohen's own time, Jürgen Bona Meyer thought) (de Schmidt 1976: Ch. 2.3). Rather, he insisted that these a priori laws were the principles of mathematics and the fundamental laws of pure natural science, that is, mechanics. Further, these principles and laws are constitutive of the possibility of experience in a very specific and, Cohen insists, Kantian sense of “experience”: for Cohen, experience consists in the theories furnished by the mathematically precise science of nature, considered as if laid out “in printed books” (Cohen 1877, 27). That is, on Cohen's interpretation, Kant's a priori has nothing at all to do with the cognitive activity of the knower. Rather, it consists in the laws of mathematically precise natural science considered independently of any particular knower.

Cohen's interpretation of Kant is thus robustly anti-psychologistic: he thinks any consideration of how the human mind operates to produce representations is completely irrelevant to a philosophical theory of knowledge. In fact, some commentators have suggested that Cohen offered the first genuinely anti-psychologistic interpretation of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason (Hatfield 1990, 110; Anderson 2005, 298). At the same time, Cohen's anti-psychologism is not always easy to locate in his writings. On almost every page of Kant's Theory of Experience (and later, The Logic of Pure Knowledge) Cohen helps himself to the language of transcendental idealism and transcendental psychology, giving the impression of an active, conscious mind, with faculties of sensibility and understanding that produce the subject's experience of objects. But, Cohen insists, this language is actually anti-psychologistic: understood properly, the Kantian's talk of cognitive faculties really refers to the methods of mathematically precise natural science. Thus the “faculty” of sensibility is really just the methods by which the mathematician constructs spatial magnitudes, and the “faculty” of understanding is really just the methods by which the physicist constructs representations of physical objects (Cohen 1885, 586ff.) Kantian theory of knowledge thus turns out to be the philosophical investigation of the methods of natural science.

3. The Transcendental Method

Cohen's distinctive conception of experience and the a priori laws that constitute its possibility is a consequence of his view of Kant's philosophical method. Cohen would call this method the ‘transcendental method,’ and he would come to consider it the defining characteristic of his Kantianism. Cohen (and his students) would articulate the transcendental method clearly only in later writings. But even as early as the first edition of Kant's Theory of Experience, we can see the transcendental method emerging from his interpretation of Kant's Analytic of Principles and the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics.

According to Cohen, for Kant mathematical natural science is the starting-point of philosophical investigation. It is the explanandum that Kantian philosophy seeks to explain. It is then up to philosophy to identify and articulate the a priori laws in that experience that explain its objectivity. If it is less than obvious that this is Kant's method in the Critique of Pure Reason, Cohen insists, it is at least clear in the Prolegomena. There, Kant is explicit that he begins by assuming that mathematical natural science provides us with genuine objective knowledge, and that it contains synthetic a priori principles; Kant is likewise explicit that his task is to identify the necessary conditions of those principles' possibility, and that doing so will explain the objectivity of mathematical natural science. (Kant is also explicit that this method, which in the Prolegomena he calls the ‘analytic method,’ is not the method he uses in the Critique of Pure Reason, nor would it be suitable for the full project of the Critique. Cohen seems cheerfully undaunted by this textual anomaly.)

Taking Kant's method in the Prolegomena as his guide, Cohen claims that the transcendental method is this. He thinks philosophy takes the theories of mathematical natural science as its starting point. It begins, as he puts it, with the “fact of mathematical natural science” (Cohen 1883, 119–120). Although Cohen does not emphasize it in the first edition of Kant's Theory of Experience, he thinks (and it is consistent with his views) that this “fact of science” changes as science progresses. On the transcendental method, the philosopher takes the best physical theories of the day as her starting point, and thus the “fact science” will be different for philosophers in different periods of the history of science.

Further, Cohen identifies the a priori of his third level, the laws of mathematical natural science, with the synthetic a priori principles Kant thinks mathematical natural science contains. Cohen says of these of synthetic a priori principles that they are “that which is present” in experience (Cohen 1987 [1871b], 206). Then philosophy seeks to explain the possibility of experience by identifying and articulating the a priori laws “present” in it. As Cohen would later put it, experience, conceived as the evolving doctrines of mathematical natural science, is “given as a task” [aufgegeben] to philosophy: while experience is given with synthetic a priori principles already contained in it, it is the task of philosophy to identify and articulate those principles, and in so doing to explain how they make objective experience possible.

Cohen's student and colleague at Marburg, Paul Natorp, would emphasize a major advantage of the transcendental method for Cohen (Natorp 1912, 196–7). This method allowed him to avoid what he took to be the two major errors of other post-Kantian philosophy. First, because Cohen sought to explain the possibility of experience by appeal to a priori laws in it, he avoided the physiologically-oriented psychologism of Helmholtz and Lange, among others. But second, the transcendental method anchors Kantian philosophy to mathematical natural science as its starting point. This anchor would prevent philosophy from taking off on the speculative, metaphysical flights of fancy that, in the minds of many Kantian philosophers in the 1860s and 1870s, decisively undermined the Idealist Naturphilosophie of the first half of the nineteenth century. For Cohen and his students, the transcendental method thus made possible a philosophy that was properly scientific, without absorbing it completely into physiology and psychology.

4. Critical Idealism

Cohen's 1883 The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method and its History and the second, 1885 edition of Kant's Theory of Experience reveal the considerable extent to which he modified and deepened his epistemology and philosophy of science over the course of the 1870s and early 1880s. In one move that marks his increasing clarity about his own views, he abandons the term “theory of knowledge” [Erkenntnistheorie] as irredeemably psychologistic, since it was too closely associated with psychologically-oriented projects such as Helmholtz's. Instead, he proposes to call the project of his theoretical philosophy “critique of knowledge” [Erkenntniskritik].

Beyond merely terminological changes, in The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method and the second edition of Kant's Theory of Experience, Cohen offers a better developed and more clearly articulated account of the substance of his epistemological view. He calls the view “critical idealism,” and he argues that it is, above all, a methodological commitment to the transcendental method. As his students, Natorp and Ernst Cassirer, would emphasize, Cohen's Kantianism ultimately consists in his commitment to the transcendental method, rather than any of Kant's particular arguments or doctrines (Cassirer 2005 [1912], 115; Natorp 1912, 194–5). As Cohen himself puts it, “[p]hilosophy is not ‘doctrine,’ but critique” (Cohen 1885, 577), and it is above all the transcendental method that distinguishes Cohen's critical idealism from pre-critical philosophy.

Cohen's increased clarity about critical idealism and the transcendental method emerged in part from work on the history of philosophy he did in the 1870s and early 1880s. He presents his view of that history in both The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method and a long introduction he added to the second edition of Kant's Theory of Experience. As Cohen sees it, Plato and Leibniz play roles in the development of critical idealism that are second only to Kant's. Like Kant, both sought to understand mathematics as paradigms of knowledge in general. Further, as Cohen argued in his 1878 essay “Plato's Doctrine of Ideas and Mathematics,” Plato anticipated Kant in maintaining that the objects of our thought are explained by appeal to “ideas” (which Cohen, employing his characteristic form of philosophical charity, identified with Kantian a priori laws). In contrast with this Platonic-rationalist antecedent to critical idealism, Cohen argues, stands an Aristotelian-empiricist tradition. Members of this uncritical tradition believe, in one way or another, that we must explain the objects of our thought by appeal to objects that exist independently of the mind.

No less than Cohen's historical writing, his increasing willingness to reject certain Kantian doctrines reveals the extent to which his critical idealism was a commitment only to Kant's philosophical method. For example, in one of the many sections he added to the second edition of Kant's Theory of Experience, Cohen argues that the proper way to understand the notion of the thing-in-itself is not (as Kant seems to suggest) as an object that exists independently of the subject's representations, somehow affecting the subject and thereby giving rise to her sensations. Rather, Cohen argues that we must think of the thing-in-itself as the totality of all experience, taken as an object of thought (Cohen 1885, 503ff). Since it is the totality of all experience, rather than merely the experience we happen to have at our particular point in the history of science, the thing-in-itself is the ideal that science and critical philosophy aim at.

5. Continuity, Generation, and Origin

However, perhaps the most significant way that the Principle of the Infinitesimal Method clarifies Cohen's critical idealism is by presenting a detailed illustration of what the critique of knowledge done according to the transcendental method looks like. At the same time, in this work Cohen also returns to something he had left obscure in the first, 1871 edition of Kant's Theory of Experience: namely, the origin of the a priori laws that explain the possibility of objective experience.

The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method is concerned with philosophy of mathematics, and specifically with the mathematical concepts of infinity, the infinitesimal and, above all for Cohen, continuity. Cohen recognizes that these notions are facts of science: they are concepts required by Newtonian and eighteenth-century rational mechanics, and thus philosophy must accept them as starting points. But still, some philosophers have taken some or all of them to be problematic. For example, Berkeley argued that we could have no way to represent something that was infinitesimally small. Cohen argues that we can see past these philosophical problems only when we understand the role the concept of continuity plays in generating the a priori laws of our knowledge (Richardson, 2006, 220–1). Thus the right philosophical account of continuity will provide two things. First, it will provide grounds for dismissing philosophical objections to the mathematical concepts of infinity, the infinitesimal, and continuity. But perhaps more importantly, it promises to explain the origin of the the a priori laws that Cohen thinks are constitutive of experience's possibility.

The key to understanding the concept of continuity, Cohen insists, is found in the brief section of the Critique of Pure Reason that Kant called the Anticipations of Perception. (This will, perhaps, come as a surprise to historians of analysis in the nineteenth century. It certainly suprised Gottleb Frege [Frege 1984 (1885)].) In the Anticipations, Kant introduces the concept of magnitudes that can vary continuously in degrees from zero to a positive value, and he calls them intensive magnitudes. Kant further argues that there is an important connection between these continuously varying magnitudes, sensation, and reality. While Cohen thinks Kant's concern with sensation is misguided, he thinks the connection between intensive magnitudes and reality is exactly right. He argues that when the concept of continuity is applied to intuition, it continuously generates [erzeugt] an a priori system of what Kant called extensive magnitudes—paradigmatically, space and time. This is important, since Cohen (following Kant) thinks we can identify unique objects (and their lawlike physical relations) only if we can represent them in determinate spatial and temporal locations. For Cohen, these are the conditions of objecthood our representations must satisfy if they are to count as objective. So an a priori system of spatial and temporal magnitudes makes objective representation possible for us. In precisely this sense, Cohen maintains, that system of magnitudes (partially) defines what a real object is for us.

Cohen thus argues that the concept of continuity plays a role in generating the a priori laws that are formal conditions of the possibility of experience of objects. Further, since the concept of continuity plays this role in making experience possible, Cohen argues that he can dismiss philosophical objections to it, as well as to concepts defined in terms of it, such as the concept of the infinitesimal.

However, Cohen would not remain satisfied with this account of the origin of the a priori laws that constitute experience's possibility. His final major work in epistemology was the 1902 Logic of Pure Knowledge, the first part of his projected System of Philosophy. It is concerned precisely with with articulating a revised and much expanded account of the origin of the a priori. There, Cohen offers a lengthy and difficult investigation of the judgmental structure of thought. Especially in his discussions of logic and mathematics, he attempts to link that structure to his earlier accounts of the role that the concept of continuity plays in generating knowledge. He argues that continuity is a law of thought that makes possible and carries out the generation of those judgmental structures that give unity to thought (Cohen 1902, 91–2). In so doing, he thinks, the concept of continuity generates a unified object of knowledge.

But while Cohen maintains his earlier concern with continuity in the Logic of Pure Knowledge, he also departs from his earlier views in important respects. Cohen now argues that the origin of knowledge and the a priori laws that make it possible is in pure thought. For Cohen, pure thought is pure because its origin is entirely within itself: that is, it does not depend for its content on an independent faculty of sensibility. Cohen's insistence that pure thought is the origin of knowledge is thus a decisive rejection of a central feature of Kant's critical philosophy, and one that Cohen himself had apparently earlier accepted. It is a rejection of the view that knowledge has its source not only in the faculty of understanding but also in a faculty of sensibility that is independent of the understanding. Kant thought critical philosophy needed an investigation of sensibility as well as an investigation of the understanding, that is, a transcendental aesthetic as well as a transcendental logic. But for Cohen only the logic remains. Critical philosophy is the logic of pure knowledge (Cohen 1902, 12–13).

Cohen's rejection of an independent faculty of sensibility helps explain why he chose to publish the Logic of Pure Knowledge and his 1907 Commentary on Immanuel Kant's Critique of Pure Reason separately, rather than articulating his own views as commentary on Kant, as he had done in his earlier works. It has also lead some commentators to suggest, because Hegel too rejected Kant's distinction between independent faculties of sensibility and understanding, that Cohen's mature theory of knowledge was really more Hegelian than Kantian (Ebbinghaus 1967). At the very least, it illustrates dramatically the extent to which his Kantianism consists in a commitment to the transcendental method, rather than to the substance of even Kant's most central doctrines.

6. Ethics, Jurisprudence, and the Laws of Human Action

Cohen thought the transcendental method must be used in ethics, no less than in epistemology and philosophy of science. He thus sought to extend its application beyond a treatment of the laws of nature to the laws of human action. He ultimately argued the that result of this application was a Kantian ethical justification for democratic socialism.

Cohen's first attempt to apply the transcendental method to ethics was his Kant's Foundations of Ethics, which first appeared in 1877. In it, he is motivated by a dissatisfaction that Kant could not provide a transcendental deduction of the moral law the way he had for the categories in the first Critique (Cohen 1877, 179). In the first Critique, Kant had argued that the categories are justified, because they are necessary conditions for the possibility of experience. But in the Critique of Practical Reason, he argued that the moral law cannot be justified as a necessary condition of experience, because we can experience ourselves only as beings whose actions have natural causes, and cannot experience ourselves as free moral agents. Thus, Kant insisted, the moral law must be the sole “fact of reason”—a fact that has no, but needs no, justification beyond the force with which it impresses itself on us (Kant 1999 [1788], 5:31, 5:47–8). Cohen thinks this was an inadequate justification of the moral law. He attempts to show that an improved justification results from transcendental reflection on the idea of a pure will, that is, the idea of a will that is not conditioned by any antecedent causes and is therefore free. With Kant, he argues that such a will is possible only on the condition that the moral law applies to it. But unlike Kant, he does not assert the actuality of a pure, free will. Rather, he argues that freedom of the will is itself a regulative ideal, an end at which we aim our actions (Cohen 1877, 199–201ff.).

However, Cohen did not remain satisfied with this account of the foundations of the moral law, nor with his early view of how the transcendental method applies in the domain of ethics. In his 1904 Ethics of Pure Will, the second part of his System of Philosophy, he offers a significantly revised account of both. Here, Cohen's account is shaped by two commitments. First, he asserts that the subject matter of ethics is humanity, that is, human moral agency (Cohen 1902, 3). He thinks the aim of ethics is to construct a normative theory of the human moral agent and its will. Second, unlike in his earlier Kant's Foundations of Ethics, Cohen now takes seriously the requirement that the transcendental method begins with a fact of science. For Cohen, just as epistemology and philosophy of science must begin by accepting the theories of pure natural science as given, ethics according to the transcendental method must begin with a science of humanity.

Cohen canvasses three possibilities for such a science of humanity. Ethics might start with a Fichtean “science” of the subject. But Cohen rejects this possibility as a lapse back into pre-critical speculation (Cohen 1902, 13ff.). Alternatively, ethics might start with naturalistic human sciences such as psychology. But, Cohen objects, making these sciences the starting point for ethical reflection would violate Kant's insistence that ethics distinguishes between normative and non-normative considerations, between what Cohen calls Being and the Ought (Cohen 1902, 9ff.).

Thus Cohen argues that ethics begins with the science of jurisprudence, that is, the science that investigates law and human beings considered precisely as agents whose actions are bound by law's normative constraints (Cohen 1902, 66ff.). Cohen does not have in mind a jurisprudence that is concerned only with positive law. Rather, the transcendental method in ethics begins with pure jurisprudence, which investigates the very concept of law and its essential features such as universality. Pure jurisprudence is thus the science of universal laws of human action. (Pure jurisprudence in this sense was one topic of German legal theory around the turn of the twentieth century. Rudolf Stammler's 1902 The Theory of Justice is representative.) For Cohen, this evolving body of pure legal doctrine constitutes a fact of science. Ethics according to the transcendental method accepts it as given. Then, by reflecting on this evolving body of legal doctrine, ethics seeks to construct a theory of the human being as a moral agent (Schwarzschild 1975).

Pure jurisprudence guides ethics in constructing a theory of humanity by overcoming a problem that, Cohen thinks, any theory of humanity faces. He claims the concept of humanity has a tension contained in it: a human being is at once an individual and a member of various pluralities, such as religious communities or economic collectives (Cohen 1902, 3ff). Further, the wills of pluralities of individuals do not necessarily cohere: individuals do not necessarily will things that are consistent with what other individuals will, or with what the community as a whole wills. But, Cohen suggests, without an account of what an individual may will consistently with the wills of others, we have no coherent account of the moral agent as both an individual and a member of a plurality. Thus any theory of humanity requires an account of how to reconcile individuals' wills within a plurality. As Cohen puts it, individuals' wills must be unified into a totality. Or, in somewhat less opaque language, we must understand how the universal laws of an ideal state can reconcile the wills of individuals and pluralities (Wiedebach 1997, Pt. 3). Finally, according to Cohen, if we want to think systematically about what those universal laws are, we must start by reflecting on the evolving body of legal doctrine provided by pure jurisprudence—the science of universal laws.

Cohen's emphasis on the universal character of ethical laws is clearly Kantian in spirit, and he certainly intends the universal laws of an ideal state to be the laws people must give to themselves in Kant's realm of ends. But still, it is not obvious how exactly to characterize the relation of Cohen's ethics to Kant's. On one plausible reading of Kant, a general theory of the moral will was the basis for his theory of law in the Doctrine of Right. But on Cohen's view of how to apply the transcendental method to ethics, ethics begins with a theory of law from pure jurisprudence and then, by reflecting on pure law, it seeks to construct a general theory of the moral agent and its will. Thus Cohen's account of the foundations of ethics might differ fundamentally from Kant's—indeed, it might turn Kant's account on its head.

7. The Kantian Foundations of Democratic Socialism, Aesthetics

However, while a doctrine of pure, universal laws makes possible a coherent theory of the concept of humanity, Cohen thinks the laws of any actual state will fall short of pure law's ideal form. He maintains that states, in the course of their development through history, tend to amend their laws so as to better approximate the ideal laws. Cohen does not argue from some antecedent philosophical theory of human nature that history is somehow compelled to exhibit this progress (Cohen 1902, 37). Rather, he simply accepts it as a datum of history: philosophy can no more deny this progress than it can deny progress in the history of physics and mathematics. At the same time, Cohen's optimism was tempered by an awareness of injustice in the non-ideal world: moral progress must be unending, precisely because no actual state will ever realize the ideal completely (Schwarzschild 1979, 139–40). There is, in Cohen's terms, an unbridgeable gap between Being and the Ought.

As Cohen saw it, political progress was, and ought to be, moving towards democratic socialism. The laws of an undemocratic state cannot genuinely reconcile the wills of individuals and pluralities of individuals, even if the state has the power to control their behavior. So, Cohen argued in his 1904 essay “The General, Equal, and Direct Right Vote,” any state whose laws make the wills of individuals and pluralities cohere must be one with universal suffrage (van der Linden 1988, 215). He thus opposed Wilhelmine Germany's system of tiered suffrage, under which lower-class men from some regions voted only in national elections and women did not vote at all.

Moreover, Cohen argued that, as states amend their laws to better approximate ideal laws, legal frameworks should emerge to govern the economic activity of democratically-constituted pluralities of people. In other words, he thought that an ideal state would allow democratic workers' collectives to own the means of production. In his Ethics of Pure Will as well as his 1896 “Postscript” to F.A. Lange's History of Materialism, Cohen argues that this socialism follows straightforwardly from a proper understanding of Kant's categorical imperative (Cohen 1902, 320). For Cohen, not treating people merely as a means entails not exploiting their labor (Holzhey 2005, 26). Along with Lange, Cohen thus advocated a socialism with Kantian, rather than Marxist, foundations. (The 1890 repeal of Bismark's Anti-Socialist Laws would have offered him some evidence that Germany was moving towards that democratic socialist ideal.) Cohen's Kantian socialism was an important influence on socialist political leaders such as Eduard Bernstein, a social democratic member of the Reichstag (Gay 1970).

Politics was not the only sphere in which Cohen thought philosophy must engage with culture. In the third part of his System of Philosophy, the Aesthetics of Pure Feeling (1912), he argued that critical philosophy could not leave art without a philosophical foundation (Cohen 1982 [1912], 1.4). In his aesthetics, Cohen sought to avoid Schelling and Hegel's idealism as well as, for example, Helmholtz's physiological approach to philosophy, exemplified in aesthetics by his investigations of music. However, in Cohen's theory of knowledge and ethics, he had avoided these approaches by adhering to the transcendental method—that is, by starting with a “fact” of (natural or juridical) science and then articulating the a priori, universal laws that constitute that science's object. But for Cohen, there is no “science of art,” so a philosophical aesthetics must begin with only the “fact” that art is central to culture (Poma 1997, Ch. 7). He develops an account of “pure feeling”—that is, feeling that is produced independently of, for example, thinking or willing, and that he characterizes as “lawfulness” (Gesetzlichkeit) (Cohen 1982 [1912], 1.68ff; cf. de Launay 2005). According to Cohen, this lawfulness of pure feeling is what produces the object of aesthetic judgment.

Apart from systematic philosophical considerations, Cohen's aesthetics is of interest for the light it promises to shed on his philosophy of religion. Cohen came to believe that concepts central to philosophy of religion should be articulated by interpereting historical scriptural texts, including prayers and biblical poetry and prose (Kepnes 2007, Ch. 2) (see §9 below). Thus recent commentators have used Cohen's account of lyric poetry in the Aesthetics of Pure Feeling to help make sense of his account of an individual's love for God (Poma 2000), as well as his conception of compassion (Wiedebach 2002).

8. Philosophy of Religion

Cohen retired from Marburg in 1912, and taught until his death at the Academy of Jewish Sciences, a rabbinical seminary in Berlin. During this period, he worked above all else on religious philosophy, writing The Concept of Religion in the System of Philosophy (1915) and his monumental Religion of Reason Out of the Sources of Judaism, which appeared in 1919, after his death. The Religion's signficance is difficult to overtstate: it has been called “the single most consequential work of Judaic thought in the period of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries” (Dietrich 2000). In it, Cohen aims to synthesize Kantian philosophy of religion and Jewish thinking on religion and morality. He articulates a definition of a “religion of reason”—that is, a religion that complements, but remains distinct from, his System of Philosophy. But also, he argues that fundamental concepts of Judaism, as they are revealed in historical Jewish texts, were the original historical sources of this religion of reason.

Cohen initially faces a problem in defining the relation of religion to systematic philosophy (Holzhey 2000). In both the Concept of Religion and the Religion of Reason, he identifies the two central concepts of religion as humanity and God (Cohen 1972 [1919], 11ff.) But he had already offered philosophical accounts of those concepts in his ethics. For Cohen, ethics is the theory precisely of humanity. But also, in his Ethics of Pure Will, Cohen defined God as the conjunction of two ideas: the concept of ideal ethical laws unifying all humanity into a harmonious realm of ends, and the faith that, at the end of history, this ideal would be realized. Thus Cohen's ethics seem to offer complete, systematic accounts of both of religion's central concepts. Consequently, Cohen appears to face a dilemma: religion has a distinctive role to play in philosophy just in case his philosophical ethics offered only incomplete accounts of humanity and God. But this is unacceptable to Cohen.

Cohen must thus offer an account of the distinctiveness of religion in relation to systematic philosophy, and do so in a way that does not entail the incompleteness of his ethics. The crux of his account of religion's distinctiveness seems to be the vaguely Tolstoyan assumption that insofar as individuals are moral, they are alike, but that every individual is immoral in his or her own way. In the Religion, Cohen claims that systematic philosophical ethics is concerned with individuals only insofar as they are members of pluralities or humanity as a whole—that is, only insofar as they are bound by ethical laws. But this is not the only way to conceive of individuals. We can also recognize an individual's particular moral failings, and we can recognize the particular ways an individual suffers because of those failings (Zank 2000). When we recognize an individual this way, Cohen says (appropriating Feuerbach's vocabulary) we recognize the individual as a “Thou,” rather than merely as a “He,” a generic representative of humanity. On Cohen's account, it thus turns out that systematic philosophical ethics does not address certain pervasive features of our lived moral experience: our varied, multiple, and particular moral failings, as well the suffering they bring us (Bonaunet 2005, 49ff.). This is not, he thinks, a criticism of ethics for being incomplete. It is only the recognition of what ethics is, and is not, concerned with.

Religion, however, is concerned precisely with the individual's particular moral failings (Zank 1996 and 2000). While we can recognize another individual as a “Thou,” and so assess her particular moral failings, Cohen thinks the most important person to recognize as a “Thou” is ourselves. As he puts it, we discover the “I” only by means of the “Thou.” That is, we recognize our moral selves by recognizing our own particular moral failings. As he puts it, “[i]n myself, I have to study sin, and through sin I must learn to know myself” (Cohen 1972 [1919], 22). Without first discovering our own particular moral failings, we could not strive for moral improvement. But for Cohen, this process of moral improvement is inherently religious. Prayer gives us the strength to overcome our hypocrisy and self-deceit. And only when we do that can we confess, that is, acknowledge our own moral failings. This in turn makes it possible for us to atone, that is, to strive to realize our ethical ideals in ways that respond appropriately to our particular failings (Horwitz 2000; Zank 2000). Thus, for Cohen, knowledge of our own moral selves is the “deepest ground” of religion: “[t]he discovery of humanity through sin is the source from which every religious development flows” (Cohen 1972 [1919], 20).

By striving for moral improvement, the individual relates herself to her ethical ideals. But since for Cohen our concept of ideal ethical laws just is our idea of God (or at least a component of our idea of God), an individual's striving for moral improvement relates her to God. In Cohen's terms, striving for moral improvement establishes a “correlation” between the individual and God. This correlation is a profoundly personal relationship: since the individual confesses and atones for her own particular sins, she relates herself to God in a way that is similarly particular to her. In relating herself to God, Cohen thinks, the individual thereby constitutes herself as a unique moral and religious self, and God becomes her “guide on the long road from sin to virtue” (Cohen 1919, 20).

Thus Cohen maintains that there is a distinctive role in philosophy for a religion of reason: its distinctive concern is precisely with the particularities of individual humans' lived moral experience, and their attempts to overcome their various and different moral failings as they strive to realize ideal ethical laws. Cohen's readers have had varied reactions to this account. His friend Franz Rosenzweig argued that Cohen's concern in the Religion for the concrete individual, expressed in the idea of the individual's “correlation” with God, constituted a decisive break from the Ethics of Pure Will's concern with universal laws of human action (Rosenzweig 1924). Alternatively, others have argued that Cohen's account of the concrete individual in the Religion completes the theory of moral selfhood begun in the Ethics of Pure Will (Schwarzschild 1975), or that the religious idea of God, since it is the idea not only of universal ethical ideals, but of humanity's progress towards those ideals, provides a connection between the descriptive and normative aspects of Cohen's philosophy (Poma 1988). More recently, Michael Zank has emphasized that Cohen did not intend his philosophy of religion as part of the System of Philosophy, but nor can the philosophy of religion be in any sense a “break” from the Ethics of Pure Will in his System, since he started working on both projects at roughly the same time around the turn of the century. Cohen's systematic philosophy and his philosophy of religion thus stand as complements to each other: whereas one conceives the human as an ideal agent constituted by universal ethical laws, the other treats the human as a concrete individual, constituted by the particularities of his own moral failings and attempts to atone for them (Zank 1996 and 2000).

9. Monotheism and Prophetic Messianism

Cohen's second aim in the Religion is to show that Judaism has what he calls a special “methodological” significance for philosophy of religion, because it is the original historical source of a religion of reason (Cohen 1972 [1919], 8). Judaism has this special status because it was, Cohen contends, the original monotheistic religion, and only monotheistic religions can be religions of reason. The polytheism of the ancient world posited different gods for different peoples in different places. But, Cohen argues, since reason is a “universal human power” that belongs to all humanity (Cohen 1972 [1919], 7–8), a religion of reason cannot recognize different gods for different people, but must recognize a single, unique God for all humanity. Since the idea of such a God first emerged in history with Judaism, it is the original source of a religion of reason. Consequently, the investigation of a religion of reason must recover that religion's source by interpreting the historical scriptures and liturgical practices of Judaism (Kepnes 2007, Ch. 2).

According to Cohen, monotheism, and so too Judaism, was the historical source of the idea that all humanity could be unified by a single set of ethical laws. As Cohen sees it, God is the set of ideal ethical laws. To assert that there is only one God for all of humanity is thus to assert a universal ethical ideal, one on which individuals see all people as “fellow humans”, and not as “others” who can be excluded from the moral community (Cohen 1972 [1919], 14ff). Later religious scholars such as Wendell Dietrich would call this doctrine “ethical monotheism” (Cf. Dietrich 1986 and Theodore and Hadley 2001). Cohen thinks that because monotheism has an ethical dimension, it culminates in—its highest form is—a view he calls prophetic messianism. For Cohen, messianism just is “the dominion of the good on earth.” It is the view that the Messiah's coming consists in nothing but the ultimate end of injustice (Cohen 1972 [1919], 21). Prophetic messianism is thus an expression of faith that humanity is making progress towards realizing ideal ethical laws.

Cohen's conception of the essentially ethical nature of Judaism had important consequences for his view of Judaism's relation to other religions, as well as his views of Zionism and the Jews' place in Wilhelmine Germany. Because Cohen thought the ethical nature of Judaism was expressed by its monotheism, he believed that at least some forms of Christianity had the same ethical nature. While for Cohen Judaism was the original religion of reason, liberal Protestantism expresses universal ethical ideals and is a religion of reason as well. (He thought Catholicism failed to express properly universal ideals. He seems not have considered Islam.) At the same time, because for Cohen Judaism ultimately aims at an ethical ideal that includes all humanity, he rejected the nationalism he saw in non-liberal forms of Judaism and was a vocal critic of Zionism. In a public exchange with Martin Buber, Cohen argued that Jews had an obligation to remain in their countries of birth, so that their religious communities could serve as exemplars for the rest of humanity of communities unified by ethical laws. He died in 1919, before the increasing virulence of antisemitism in Germany could make him reconsider this argument.

10. Cohen's Influence

The range of Cohen's influence is wide. Few figures are as important for Jewish ethics and philosophy of religion in the twentieth century, and in the last four decades religious scholars have devoted considerable attention to understanding Cohen's significance as a religious thinker and public intellectual. More recently, historians of philosophy in the analytic tradition have begun to appreciate the importance of Cohen's Neo-Kantianism as a source not only of infliential interpretations of Kant, but of the topics and methods characteristic of philosophy of science in the twentieth century.

In Jewish religious thought, Cohen's influence is highly visible, and substantive doctrines he developed in the Ethics of Pure Will and the Religion of Reason Out of the Sources of Judaism are still topics of debate. Martin Buber's 1923 I and Thou was explicitly indebted to, and a response to, Cohen's Religion. Inspired by Cohen (see §8 above), Buber elaborated an account of a relationship between the “I” and the “Thou.” Like Cohen, for Buber this relation is the central part of how an individual establishes a profoundly personal relationship with God. Also like Cohen, Buber thinks establishing that relationship with God is essential to strengthening the ethical bonds in one's community. But unlike Cohen, Buber thought the I-Thou relationship was essentially beyond language's ability to express—a view strikingly at odds with Cohen's rationalist philosophical tendencies.

More recently, religious ethicists have been interested in Cohen's view that monotheism expresses a universalist morality, and that it expressed for the first time in history the idea that all humanity must be subject to the same ethical laws. The religious scholar Wendell Dietrich (Dietrich 1986) identifies this view as “ethical monotheism,” and sees Cohen as the first in a trajectory of religious philosophers who argue that the concept of a unique God is necessary for—or whose essential content is revealed to us as (Gibbs 2001)—ethical laws and the freedom to live according to them.

Cohen's influence on Anglo-American analytic philosophy is less visible. Perhaps the only area of Anglo-American philosophy where a substantive doctrine of Cohen's is still respected is Kant interpretation. Before Cohen's Kant's Theory of Experience, interpretations of Kant were overwhelmingly—some have claimed exclusively—psychologistic in one way or another (see §2 above). Some of those interpretations attributed to Kant a form of idealistic transcendental psychology, what Hegel called “subjective idealism.” Others attributed to Kant some form of empirical psychologism. But Cohen denies that Kant is interested in how the mind—either the transcendental mind or the empirical mind—operates to synthesize the knower's representations. For Cohen, Kant is interested in knowledge considered as if laid out “in printed books” (Cohen 1877, 27).

Cohen is thus at the head of a tradition of anti-psychologistic interpretations of Kant that includes Kant scholars such as Peter Strawson and, more recently, Henry Allison. It would overstate Cohen's influence to suggest that he directly inspired, say, Strawson's interpretation of Kant. But the anti-psychologistic philosophical environment in which Strawson produced his Kant interpretation owed a great deal to Cohen's influence. (Cf. Edel 1993 for a discussion of Cohen's anti-psychologism in relation to the tradition of analytic philosophy to which Stawson belongs.) Further, as English-language Kant interpretation became more sophisticated over the second half of the twentieth century and engaged more seriously with existing German literature, historians of philosophy like Allison found themselves at home in a much longer German tradition of anti-psychologistic Kant interpretation going back directly to Cohen. That anti-psychologistic tradition dominated Anglo-American Kant interpretation for the latter decades of the twentieth century and is still the majority view today.

However, it would be a mistake to limit a survey of Cohen's influence on contemporary analytic philosophy to the doctrines of his that are still alive today. Arguably his most profound influence has not been to give us particular philosophical doctrines, but to contribute to the basic shape, the basic orientation of an entire major subdiscipline of philosophy. Nowhere is this more evident than in history and philosophy of science (cf. Patton 2005).

Recent history of philosophy of science has become increasingly aware of Neo-Kantianism's influence on philosophy of science in the twentieth century. It is thus worth taking seriously Cohen's role in shaping twentieth-century philosophy of science. His commitment to the transcendental method lead him to a view of epistemology, and theoretical philosophy more generally, as essentially a philosophically critical account of the historical development of concepts in the mathematically-precise natural sciences. This view of a historically-oriented philosophy of science is nowhere more clear in Cohen's work than in his Principle of the Infinitesimal Method. There are two significant points about the view he expresses there. First, for Cohen, the theory of knowledge begins by accepting a body of existing science, and then gives a philosophical reconstruction of important concepts and developments in that science's history. Second, Cohen thinks the principal topic of the theory of knowledge is mathematically-precise natural science—paradigmatically mathematics and physics (Richardson 2006). Cohen's disciple, Ernst Cassirer, would carry out this program in, among other writings, three books on the history and philosophy of physics.

But philosophers far beyond the Marburg School were influenced by Cohen's insistence that the philosophical reconstruction of scientific theories is the principal method of the theory of knowledge, and that its principal topic is mathematically-precise natural science. Logical positivist philosophy of science took up aspects of Cohen's project, including its central concern with mathematics and physics. Like Cohen, positivists also thought philosophy should accept existing bodies of science as a starting point, and should seek to reconstruct that science's theories and methods, even though they thought modern logic was the proper tool for carrying out their reconstructions. Recent scholarship on logical positivism, and especially on Rudolf Carnap, has emphasized its intellectual debts to Marburg School Neo-Kantianism. (Cf. Friedman 1999 and 2000; Richardson 1998 and especially 2006.) Conversely, a French tradition of philosophy of science emphasized a different aspect of Cohen's project. The Neo-Kantian Emile Meyerson, and his intellectual heirs, Alexandre Koyré and ultimately Thomas Kuhn, emphasized a more deeply historical reconstruction of scientific theories and methods. Finally, more recent philosophy of science has seen a turn back to views even more explicitly inspired by Marburg School doctrines: most prominently, Michael Friedman has defended the view that in reconstructing scientific theories, philosophy should seek to articulate the “constitutively a priori” principles in those theories—that is, principles that are constitutive of the possibility of experience in precisely Cohen's sense (Friedman 2001). More generally, although twentieth-century history and philosophy of science did not always take seriously Cohen's substantive doctrines, it was nevertheless affected profoundly by his vision of philosophy as the reconstruction of historical developments in mathematically-precise natural science.


Selected Works by Cohen

For a complete bibliography of Cohen's works, see Holzhey 1986, 1.355–383.

Selected Secondary Literature

General Commentary

Kant Interpretation, Epistemology, and Philosophy of Science

Ethics, Political Theory, and Aesthetics


Other Works Cited

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Buber, Martin | Cassirer, Ernst | Helmholtz, Hermann von | Kant, Immanuel | Kant, Immanuel: moral philosophy | Kant, Immanuel: views on space and time | Lange, Friedrich Albert | monotheism | Natorp, Paul | psychologism | Rosenzweig, Franz