Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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The Philosophy of Childhood

First published Fri Sep 13, 2002; substantive revision Tue Nov 9, 2010

The philosophy of childhood has recently come to be recognized as an area of inquiry analogous to the philosophy of science, the philosophy of history, the philosophy of religion, and the many other “philosophy of” subjects that are already considered legitimate areas of philosophical study. Just as the philosophy of art, say, concerns itself with philosophically interesting questions about art and about what people say and think about art, so the philosophy of childhood takes up philosophically interesting questions about childhood, about conceptions people have of childhood and attitudes they have toward children; about theories of what childhood is, as well as theories of cognitive and moral development; about theories of children's rights, notions concerning the status and significance of child art and child poetry; about claims concerning the history of childhood, as well as comparative studies of childhood in different cultures; and finally about theories concerning the proper place of children in society. Almost all these theories, ideas, studies, and attitudes invite philosophical scrutiny, reflection, and analysis.

As an academic subject, the philosophy of childhood has sometimes been included within the philosophy of education (e.g., Siegel, 2009). Recently, however, philosophers have begun to offer college and university courses specifically in the philosophy of childhood. And philosophical literature on childhood is increasing in both quantity and quality.

1. What is a Child?

Almost single-handedly, Philippe Ariès, in his influential book, Centuries of Childhood (Ariès, 1962), has made the reading public aware that conceptions of childhood have varied across the centuries. The very notion of a child, we now realize, is both historically and culturally conditioned. But exactly how the conception of childhood has changed historically and how conceptions differ across cultures is a matter of scholarly controversy and philosophical interest (see Kennedy, 2006). Thus Ariès argued, partly on the evidence of depictions of infants in medieval art (including the baby Jesus), that the medievals thought of children as simply “little adults.” Shulamith Shahar (1990), by contrast, finds evidence that some medieval thinkers understood childhood to be divided into fairly well-defined stages. And, whereas Piaget claims that his subjects, Swiss children in the first half of the 20th Century, were animistic in their thinking (Piaget, 1929), Margaret Mead (1967) presents evidence that Pacific island children were not.

One reason for being somewhat skeptical about any claim of radical discontinuity—at least in Western conceptions of childhood—arises from the fact that, even today, the dominant view of children embodies what we might call a broadly “Aristotelian conception” of childhood. According to Aristotle, there are four sorts of causality, one of which is Final causality and another is Formal Causality. Aristotle thinks of the Final Cause of a living organism as the function that organism normally performs when it reaches maturity. He thinks of the Formal Cause of the organism as the form or structure it normally has in maturity, where that form or structure is thought to enable the organism to perform its functions well. According to this conception, a human child is an immature specimen of the organism type, human, which, by nature, has the potentiality to develop into a mature specimen with the structure, form, and function of a normal or standard adult.

Many adults today have this broadly Aristotelian conception of childhood without having actually read any of Aristotle. It informs their understanding of their own relationship toward the children around them. Thus they consider the fundamental responsibility they bear toward their children to be the obligation to provide the kind of supportive environment those children need to develop into normal adults, where normal adults are supposed to have the biological and psychological structures in place needed to perform the functions we assume that normal, standard adults can perform.

Two modifications of this Aristotelian conception have been particularly influential in the last century and a half. One is the19th century idea that ontogeny recapitulates phylogeny (Gould, 1977), that is, that the development of an individual recapitulates the history and evolutionary development of the race, or species (Spock, 1968, 229). This idea is prominent in Freud (1950) and in the early writings of Jean Piaget (see, e.g. Piaget, 1933). Piaget, however, sought in his later writings to explain the phenomenon of recapitulation by appeal to general principles of structural change in cognitive development (see, e.g., Piaget, 1968, 27).

The other modification is the idea that development takes places in age-related stages of clearly identifiable structural change. This idea can be traced back to ancient thinkers, for example the Stoics (Turner and Matthews, 1998, 49). Stage theory is to be found in various medieval writers (Shahar, 1990, 21–31) and, in the modern period, most prominently in Jean-Jacques Rousseau's highly influential work, Emile (1979). But it is Piaget who first developed a highly sophisticated version of stage theory and made it the dominant paradigm for conceiving childhood in the latter part of the 20th Century (see, e.g., Piaget, 1971).

Matthews (2008, 2009), argues that a Piagetian-type stage theory of development tends to support a “deficit conception” of childhood, according to which the nature of the child is understood primarily as a configuration of deficits—missing capacities that normal adults have but children lack. This conception, he argues, ignores or undervalues the fact that children are, for example, better able to learn a second language, or paint an aesthetically worthwhile picture, or conceive a philosophically interesting question, than those same children will likely be able to do as adults. Moreover, it restricts the range and value of relationships adults think they can have with their children.

How childhood is conceived is crucial for almost all the philosophically interesting questions about children. It is also crucial for questions about what should be the legal status of children in society, as well as for the study of children in psychology, anthropology, sociology, and many other fields.

2. Theories of Cognitive Development

Any well-worked out epistemology will provide at least the materials for a theory of cognitive development in childhood. Thus according to René Descartes a clear and distinct knowledge of the world can be constructed from resources innate to the human mind (Descartes, PW, 131). John Locke, by contrast, maintains that the human mind begins as a “white paper, void of all characters, without any ideas” (Locke, EHC, 121). On this view all the “materials of reason and knowledge” come from experience. Locke's denial of the doctrine of innate ideas was, no doubt, directed specifically at Descartes and the Cartesians. But it also implies a rejection of the Platonic doctrine that learning is a recollection of previously known Forms. Few theorists of cognitive development today find either the extreme empiricism of Locke or the strong innatism of Plato or Descartes completely acceptable.

Behaviorism has offered recent theorists of cognitive development a way to be strongly empiricist without appealing to Locke's inner theater of the mind. The behaviorist program was, however, dealt a major setback when Noam Chomsky, in his review (1959) of Skinner's Verbal Behavior (1957), argued successfully that no purely behaviorist account of language-learning is possible. Chomsky's alternative, a theory of Universal Grammar, which owes some of its inspiration to Plato and Descartes, has made the idea of innate language structures, and perhaps other cognitive structures as well, seem a viable alternative to a more purely empiricist conception of cognitive development.

It is, however, the work of Jean Piaget that has been most influential on the way psychologists, educators, and even philosophers have come to think about the cognitive development of children. Piaget's early work, The Child's Conception of the World (1929), makes especially clear how philosophically challenging the work of a developmental psychologist can be. In that work alone Piaget discusses the nature of thinking, the “location” of dreams, what it is to be alive, and the philosophy of language. In other works he discusses space, time, and causality. Although his project is always to lay out identifiable stages in which children come to understand what, say, causality or thinking or whatever is, the intelligibility of his account presupposes that there are satisfactory responses to the philosophical quandaries that topics like causality, thinking, and life raise.

Take the concept of life. According to Piaget this concept is acquired in four stages (Piaget, 1929, Chapter 6)

These distinctions are suggestive, but they invite much more discussion than Piaget elicits from his child subjects. What is required for movement to be spontaneous? Is a bear alive during hibernation? We may suppose the Venus flytrap moves spontaneously. But does it really? What about other plants? And then there is the question of what Piaget can mean by calling the thinking of young children “animistic,” if, at their stage of cognitive development, their idea of life is simply “assimilated to activity in general.”

Donaldson (1978) offers a psychological critique of Piaget on cognitive development. A philosophical critique of Piaget's work on cognitive development is to be found in Chapters 3 and 4 of Matthews (1994). Interesting post-Piagetian work in cognitive development includes Cary (1985), Wellman (1990), Flavel (1995), Subbotsky (1996), and Gelman (2003).

Recent psychological research on concept formation has suggested that children do not generally form concepts by learning necessary and sufficient conditions for their application, but rather by coming to use prototypical examples as reference guides. Thus a robin (rather, of course, than a penguin) might be the child's prototype for ‘bird’. The child, like the adult, might then be credited with having the concept, bird, without the child's ever being able to specify, successfully, necessary and sufficient conditions for something to count as a bird. This finding seems to have implications for the proper role and importance of conceptual analysis in philosophy. It is also a case in which we should let what we come to know about cognitive development in children help shape our epistemology, rather than counting on our antecedently formulated epistemology to shape our conception of cognitive development in children (see Rosch and Lloyd, 1978, and Gelman, 2003).

Some developmental psychologists have recently moved away from the idea that children are to be understood primarily as human beings who lack the capacities adults of their species normally have. This change is striking in, for example, the work of Alison Gopnik, who writes: “Children aren't just defective adults, primitive grownups gradually attaining our perfection and complexity. Instead, children and adults are different forms of homo sapiens. They have very different, though equally complex and powerful, minds, brains, and forms of consciousness, designed to serve different evolutionary functions” (Gopnik, 2009, 9). Part of this new respect for the capacities of children rests on neuroscience and an increased appreciation for the complexity of the brains of infants and young children. Thus Gopnik writes: “Babies' brains are actually more highly connected than adult brains; more neural pathways are available to babies than adults.” (11)

3. Theories of Moral Development

Many philosophers in the history of ethics have devoted serious attention to the issue of moral development. Thus Plato, for example, offers a model curriculum in his dialogue, Republic, aimed at developing virtue in rulers. Aristotle's account of the logical structure of the virtues in his Nicomachean Ethics provides a scaffolding for understanding how moral development takes place. And the Stoics (Turner and Matthews, 1998, 45–64) devoted special attention to dynamics of moral development.

Among modern philosophers, it is again Rousseau (1979) who devotes the most attention to issues of development. He offers a sequence of five age-related stages through which a person must pass to reach moral maturity: (i) infancy (birth to age 2); (ii) the age of sensation (3 to 12); (iii) the age of ideas (13 to puberty); (iv) the age of sentiment (puberty to age 20); and (v) the age of marriage and social responsibility (age 21 on). Although he allows that an adult may effectively modify the behavior of children by explaining that bad actions are those that will bring punishment (90), he insists that genuinely moral reasoning will not be appreciated until the age of ideas, at 13 and older. In keeping with his stage theory of moral development he explicitly rejects Locke's maxim, ‘Reason with children,’ (Locke, 1971) on the ground that attempting to reason with a child younger than thirteen years of age is developmentally inappropriate.

However, the cognitive theory of moral development formulated by Piaget in The Moral Judgment of the Child (1965) and the somewhat later theory of Lawrence Kohlberg (1981, 1984) are the ones that have had most influence on psychologists, educators, and even philosophers. Thus, for example, what John Rawls has to say about children in his classic work, A Theory of Justice (1971) rests heavily on the work of Piaget and Kohlberg.

Kohlberg presents a theory according to which morality develops in approximately six stages, though according to his research, few adults actually reach the fifth or sixth stages. In this respect Kohlberg's theory departs from classic stage theory, as in Piaget, since the sequence of stages does not culminate in the capacity shared by normal adults. However, Kohlberg maintained that no one skips a stage or regresses to an earlier stage. Although Kohlberg sometimes considered the possibility of a seventh or eighth stage, these are his basic six:

Kohlberg developed a test, which has been widely used, to determine the stage of any individual at any given time. The test requires responses to ethical dilemmas and is to be scored by consulting an elaborate manual.

One of the most influential critiques of the Kohlberg theory is to be found in Carol Gilligan's In a Different Voice (1982). Gilligan argues that Kohlberg's rule-oriented conception of morality has an orientation toward justice, which she associates with stereotypically male thinking, whereas women and girls are perhaps more likely to approach moral dilemmas with a “care” orientation. One important issue in moral theory that the Kohlberg-Gilligan debate raises is that of the role and importance of moral feelings in the moral life (see the entry on feminist ethics).

Another line of approach to moral development is to be found in the work of Martin Hoffman (1982). Hoffman describes the development of empathetic feelings and responses in four stages. Hoffman's approach allows one to appreciate the possibility of genuine moral feelings, and so of genuine moral agency, in a very small child. By contrast, Kohlberg's moral-dilemma tests will assign pre-schoolers and even early elementary-school children to a pre-moral level.

A philosophically astute and balanced assessment of the Kohlberg-Gilligan debate, with appropriate attention to the work of Martin Hoffman, can be found in Pritchard (1991). See also Likona (1976), Kagan and Lamb (1987), Matthews (1996, Chapter 5), and Pritchard (1996).

4. Children's Rights

For a full discussion of this issue see the entry on the rights of children.

5. Childhood Agency

A minimum requirement for genuine agency would seem to be the capacity to perform actions that are either morally good or morally bad. Paul Bloom has recently presented evidence that even human infants satisfy this requirement (Bloom, 2010). But perhaps more is required for genuine agency, maybe the ability to assess alternative courses of actions on moral grounds. Or maybe it is enough to be able to act from empathy or from a fundamental sense of fairness, or despite one's recognition that a predictable outcome will be unfair. Clearly, what one says about childhood agency should track what one says about moral development.

The exercise of childhood agency will obviously be constrained by social and political factors, including various dependency relations, some of them imposed by family structures. Whether there are special ethical rules and considerations that pertain to family in particular, and, if so, what these rules or considerations are, is the subject of an emerging field we can call ‘family ethics’ (Blustein, 1982, Houlgate, 1999).

The idea that, in child-custody cases, the preferences of a child should be given consideration, and not just the “best interest” of the child, is beginning to gain acceptance in the U.S. and in Europe. “Gregory K,” who at age 12 was able to speak rationally and persuasively to support his petition for new adoptive parents, made a good case for recognizing childhood agency in a family court. (See “Gregory Kingsley” in the Other Internet Resources.)

Perhaps the most dramatic and, at the same time, most wrenching, cases in which adults have come to let children play a significant role in deciding their own future are those that involve treatment decisions for children with terminal illnesses. (Kopelman and Moskop, 1989) The pioneering work of Myra Bluebond-Langner shows how young children can come to terms with their own imminent death and even conspire, mercifully, to help their parents and caregivers avoid having to discuss this awful truth with them (Bluebond-Langner, 1980).

6. The Goods of Childhood

“Refrigerator art,” that is, the paintings and drawings of young children that parents display on the family's refrigerator, is emblematic of adult ambivalence toward the productions of childhood. Typically, parents are pleased with, and proud of, the art their children produce. But equally typically, parents do not consider the art work of their children to be good without qualification. Yet, as Jonathan Fineberg has pointed out (Fineberg, 1994, 2006), several of the most celebrated artists of the 20th century collected child art and were inspired by it. One thing this new appreciation of child art suggests is that children are more likely as children to produce art, the aesthetic value of which a famous artist or an art historian can appreciate, than they will be able to later as adults.

According to what we have called the “Aristotelian conception”, childhood is an essentially prospective state. On such a view, the value of what a child produces cannot be expected to be good in itself, but only good for helping the child to develop into a good adult. Perhaps child art, or at least some child art, is a counterexample to this expectation. Of course, one could argue that adults who, as children, were encouraged to produce art, as well as make music and excel at games, are much more likely to be flourishing adults than those who are not encouraged to give such “outlets” to their energy and creativity. But the example of child art should at least make one suspicious of Michael Slote's claim that “just as dreams are discounted except as they affect (the waking portions of) our lives, what happens in childhood principally affects our view of total lives through the effects that childhood success or failure are supposed to have on mature individuals” (Slote, 1983, 14).

7. Philosophical Thinking in Children

Matthews (1980) presents evidence that young children often make comments, ask questions, and even engage in reasoning that professional philosophers can recognize as philosophical. Here are some of his examples:

TIM (about six years), while busily engaged in licking a pot, asked, “papa, how can we be sure that everything is not a dream?” Somewhat abashed, Tim's father said that he didn't know and asked how Tim thought that we could tell? After a few more licks of the pot, Tim answered, “Well, I don't think everything is a dream, ‘cause in a dream people wouldn't go around asking if it was a dream.” (23)

URSULA [three years, four months], “I have a pain in my tummy.” Mother, “You lie down and go to sleep and your pain will go away.” Ursula, “Where will it go?” (17)

SOME QUESTION of fact arose between James and his father, and James said, “I know it is!” His father replied, “But perhaps you might be wrong!” Denis [four years, seven months] then joined in, saying, “But if he knows, he can't be wrong! Thinking's sometimes wrong, but knowing's always right!” (27)

IAN (six years) found to his chagrin that the three children of his parents' friends monopolized the television; they kept him from watching his favorite program. “Mother,” he asked in frustration, “why is it better for three people to be selfish than for one?” (28)

A LITTLE GIRL of nine asked: “Daddy, is there really a God?” The father answered that it wasn't very certain, to which the child retorted: “There must be really, because he has a name!” (30)

MICHAEL (seven): “I don't like to [think] about the universe without an end. It gives me a funny feeling in my stomach. If the universe goes on forever, there is no place for God to live, who made it.” (34)

These and other anecdotes provide substantial evidence that at least some children quite naturally engage in thinking that is genuinely philosophical. But are children capable of philosophical dialogue? Are they capable of developing a philosophical position in response to challenges? Examples like this one suggest that the answer is ‘Yes’.

“Do you think there could be any such thing as the beginning of time?” I asked the dozen third and fourth graders in my philosophy discussion group in Newton, Massachusetts. (We had been trying to write a story about time travel.)

“No,” several of the kids replied.

Then Nick spoke up. “The universe is everything and everywhere,” he announced and then paused. “But then if there was a big bang or something, what was the big bang in?”

Not only did Nick have a genuine puzzle about how the universe could have begun, he also had a metaphysical principle that required beginnings for everything, the universe included. Everything there is, he said, has a beginning. As he realized, that principle reintroduces the problem about the universe. “How did the universe start?” he kept asking.

“The universe,” said Sam, “is what everything appeared on. It's not really anything. It's what other things started on.”

“So there always has to be a universe?” I asked.

“Yeah,” agreed Sam, “there always has to be a universe.”

“So if there was always a universe,” I went on, “there was no first time, either.”

“There was a first time for certain things,” explained Sam, “but not for the universe. There was a first time for the earth, there was a first time for the stars, there was a first time for the sun. But there was no first time for the universe.”

“Can you convince Nick that the universe has to always be there?” I asked Sam.

Sam replied with a rhetorical question. “What would the universe have appeared on?” he asked simply.

“That's what I don't understand,” admitted Nick. (Matthews, 1994, 10–11)

What implications does the conclusion have for the philosophy of childhood? There seem to be important implications for each of the topics discussed above. Consider first what we have been calling the “Aristotelian conception of childhood.” Philosophical thinking in children can hardly be seen as primitive or early-stage efforts to develop a capacity that adults normally and standardly have in a mature form. In fact adults have no standard or normal capacity to do philosophy. Moreover, they are much less likely to think philosophical thoughts than are children. In this respect, child philosophy is somewhat like child art. Children often have a freshness, an openness, and a creativity in philosophical thinking, as in painting and drawing, that is missing in most adults.

If children can think philosophically interesting thoughts and engage in philosophically interesting reasoning without special adult or societal encouragement, should they be encouraged to think such thoughts and should their ability to do philosophy well be developed? This issue is addressed, for example, in Lipman (1993), and in Matthews (1984 and 1994), and, more generally, in the entry, Philosophy for Children. How Matthew Lipman, the founder of the Institute for the Advancement of Philosophy for Children, came to make the advancement of philosophical thinking in children his life's work is recounted in Lipman (2008).

8. Children's Literature

Although developmental psychology has largely ignored philosophical thinking in children, writers of children's poems and stories have not. Perhaps the chief reason developmental psychologists have paid little attention to the philosophical thinking of children is that it does not fit their model of development. Developmentalists, following Piaget, have tended to look for concepts, skills, and capacities that are present in children in only a primitive or immature form but develop in stages until one is standardly able, in adolescence or adulthood, to use the concept or skill or capacity in a fully mature way. But philosophy is not like that. Doing philosophy is not a skill or capacity that is present in children in only a primitive or immature form, but naturally develops until one is standardly able, in adolescence or adulthood, to exercise it in a fully mature way.

Some writers of children's stories and poems, however, are able to explore philosophical issues in a way that both children and their parents and teachers can enjoy and appreciate. Thus when Frank Baum, in the Wonderful Wizard of Oz, has the Tin Man tell the story of his survival through piece-by-piece replacement, he echoes the traditional story of the Ship of Theseus, whose boards were replaced one at a time.

In Ozma of Oz, one of Baum's sequels to the Wonderful Wizard, the heroine, Dorothy, upon encountering a copper man constructed to think and speak, but not live, recalls the Tin Man from the earlier episode: “Once … I knew a man made out of tin, who was a woodman named Nick Chopper. But he was alive as we are, ‘cause he was born a real man, and got his tin body a little at a time—first a leg and then a finger and then an ear—for the reason that he had so many accidents with his axe, and cut himself up in a very careless manner” (Baum 1907, 42).

Clearly Baum sees an argument from continuity for the persistence of Nick Chopper that differentiates him from Tiktok, who was constructed to perform cognitive and linguistic functions without living.

For other examples of genuinely philosophical children's stories and poems see Matthews (1980, ch. 5), Matthews (19880, and Matthews (1994, ch. 9).

The subject of children's literature belongs to the philosophy of childhood, not just because some children's poems and stories are philosophical, but also because the genre has sometimes been thought to be artistically inauthentic (Rose, 1984). The worry has been that just because adults who write children's poems and stories are not writing for their own peer group, but rather for a relatively naive and vulnerable readership, what they write is necessarily exploitative and inauthentic.

Without discussing the fascinating topic of literary and artistic authenticity in general it may be enough to point out in this context that at least one way, though certainly not the only way, for a writer of children's literature to write authentically is for that writer to address genuinely philosophical issues. This is perhaps most obvious when E. B. White in “Charlotte's Web” and Natalie Babbitt in “Tuck Everlasting” have their characters discuss death and the meaning of life. But it should also be clear in even such a simple story as Arnold Lebel's “Cookies” (in his collection, “Frog and Toad Together”), where the topic is weakness of will. It isn't the case, of course, that writers who have their characters explore philosophical issues should be seen as covertly writing philosophical theses. It is rather that, among the things that might be as interesting and significant to the writer as to the child reader or auditor is a philosophical issue that the story displays.

Children's literature is often rated as appropriate for children in some particular age bracket. Such ratings raise interesting issues concerning intellectual, social, and moral development. Thus, for example, Ellen Winner (1988) presents strong evidence that children younger than six can understand and use metaphors, but they cannot understand or use irony. Her findings have important implications for deciding whether a given story is appropriate for children of some particular age range. Matthews (2005), however, contends that Winner has failed to take into account what he calls “philosophical story irony,” which children younger than six can certainly appreciate. His conclusion, in turn, has implications for whether there can be genuinely philosophical thinking in young children.

9. Other Issues

The topics discussed above hardly exhaust the philosophy of childhood. Thus we have said nothing about, for example, the figure of the child in literature (but see e.g., Coveny, 1980) or in film. Nor have we discussed the burgeoning philosophical literature on personhood as it bears on questions about the morality of abortion and the moral status of impaired human infants. These and many other topics concerning children may be familiar to philosophers as they get discussed in other contexts. Discussing them under the rubric, ‘philosophy of childhood,’ as well in the other contexts, may help us see connections between them and other philosophical issues concerning children.


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